2011.08.08

Helen Beebee and Nigel Sabbarton-Leary (eds.)

The Semantics and Metaphysics of Natural Kinds

Helen Beebee and Nigel Sabbarton-Leary (eds.), The Semantics and Metaphysics of Natural Kinds, Routledge, 2010, 241pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415873666.

Reviewed by Michael McGlone, University at Buffalo, SUNY


This is a collection of cutting-edge essays on natural kinds and natural kind terms. It at once makes progress on and serves as an advanced introduction to the important topics it addresses. It contains plenty of interest to both the expert and the non-expert on natural kinds. Supplemented by relevant background material, it would serve excellently as the main text for a semester-long graduate or advanced undergraduate seminar on its topics.

The collection includes a state-of-the-art introduction by its editors followed by essays by Corine Besson, Genoveva Martí and José Martínez-Fernández, Åsa Wikforss, Harold Noonan, Joseph LaPorte, Alexander Bird, Robin Findlay Hendry, Helen Beebe and Nigel Sabbarton-Leary, Emma Tobin, Jessica Wilson, and Richard Boyd.

In her entry "Rigidity, Natural Kind Terms, and Metasemantics", Besson argues that there is a variety of rigidity -- what she calls obstinate rigidity de jure -- that classifies all names and natural kind terms as "rigid" and classifies all singular definite descriptions and descriptive general terms as "non-rigid". This is interesting because more widely discussed varieties of rigidity classify certain definite descriptions (e.g., 'the actual inventor of bifocals' and 'the even prime') and (plausibly) certain descriptive general terms (e.g., 'yellow quadrupedal feline with blackish stripes') as "rigid". An obstinately rigid designator is an expression that designates a certain thing with respect to every possible world regardless of whether that thing exists in any given world. A de jure obstinately rigid designator is an expression that is obstinately rigid by stipulation. According to Besson's account, a de jure obstinately rigid designator is obstinately rigid by stipulation in the sense that its status as an obstinately rigid designator is explained by the way in which its was (or could be) introduced. More specifically, such an expression is obstinately rigid by stipulation in the sense that its status as an obstinately rigid designator is explained by its having been introduced and semantically individuated by assigning it a referent. Thus, unpacking a bit, Besson's central theses are therefore (i) that all names and natural kind terms are obstinately rigid because introduced in this manner whereas (ii) definite descriptions and descriptive general terms even when obstinately rigid are never obstinately-rigid-because-introduced-in-this-manner. There is much of substance that one might argue with when it comes to the underlying assumptions of the paper -- e.g., Besson explicitly assumes without argument that names and natural kind terms are directly referential. However, the paper as a whole is quite plausible, interesting, and informative.

In "General Terms as Designators", Martí and Martínez-Fernández defend an account of what it is for a general term to be a rigid designator.According to it, general terms designate universals and for such a term to designate rigidly is for it to designate a certain universal with respect to every possible world. Martí and Martínez-Fernández consider and plausibly respond to a number of interesting objections. Here I will consider just one such objection and their response: their account makes it impossible to determine whether any predicative occurrences of general terms designate non-rigidly. The most plausible examples of non-rigid predicative occurrences are occurrences like that of (1a) in (1b).

1a. the color of the sky

1b. Mary's dress is the color of the sky.

According to the view that such occurrences of general terms are non-rigid -- henceforth the accidental hypothesis -- the relevant occurrence of (1a) non-rigidly designates with respect to each possible world that color, whichever it may be, that happens to color the sky in that world. According to an alternative hypothesis -- henceforth the rigid hypothesis -- the relevant occurrence of (1a) rigidly designates the property of being the same color as the sky. Either way (1b) is true with respect to a possible world just in case that world is one in which Mary's dress and the sky are same colored. This, it is suggested, makes it impossible to determine whether the relevant occurrence of (1a) designates rigidly. Similar points, it has been suggested, apply to all cases in which a predicative occurrence of a general term plausibly designates accidentally. Because of this, the objection continues, the present characterization of general term rigidity renders it utterly impossible to determine whether there are any non-rigid predicative occurrences of general terms. This, it is maintained, is an objectionable consequence of the view in question.

In response to this worry, Martí and Martínez-Fernández argue that their account does not render it impossible to determine whether any predicative occurrences of general terms are non-rigid. This, they submit, is because certain sentences, all of whose general terms function predicatively, have different possible-worlds truth conditions depending on whether the accidental or the rigid hypothesis is correct. Consider a possible world in which Loch Ness and the sky are both some color other than blue -- say, red -- and consider sentence (2).

2. Loch Ness is the actual color of the sky.

Martí and Martínez-Fernández argue as follows that (2) is false with respect to such a world if the accidental hypothesis is correct and true with respect to such a world if the rigid hypothesis is correct:

Argument 1

P1. If the accidental hypothesis is correct, then a predicative occurrence of 'the color of the sky' designates the color blue.

P2. If a predicative occurrence of 'the color of the sky' designates the color blue, then the occurrence of 'the actual color of the sky' in (2) rigidly designates the color blue.

P3. If the occurrence of 'the actual color of the sky' in (2) rigidly designates the color blue, then (2) is false with respect to any world of the sort described above.

C1. So, if the accidental hypothesis is correct, then (2) is false with respect to any world of the sort described above.

Argument 2

P1. If the rigid hypothesis is correct, then a predicative occurrence of 'the color of the sky' designates the property of being the color of the sky.

P2. If a predicative occurrence of 'the color of the sky' designates the property of being the color of the sky, then the occurrence of 'the actual color of the sky' in (2) rigidly designates the property of being the color of the sky.

P3. If the occurrence of 'the actual color of the sky' in (2) rigidly designates the property of being the color of the sky, then (2) is true with respect to any world of the sort described above.

C2. So, if the rigid hypothesis is correct, then (2) is true with respect to any world of the sort described above.

I see no significant problem with argument 1. Argument 2 strikes me as plausible. However, it contains an awkwardness that renders it less than fully convincing. The awkwardness is that the argument assumes that its second premise is true while it would seem that a proponent of the rigidity hypothesis must regard that premise as false, on pain of identifying the first-order property of being the color of the sky with the first-order property of being the actual color of the sky. Further discussion of the elements underlying this awkwardness would be welcome. Is there a viable version of the rigidity hypothesis that denies the second premise? If so, what does the existence of such a view tell us about whether Martí and Martínez-Fernández's account of general term rigidity renders it possible to determine whether any predicative occurrences of general terms fail to designate rigidly?

Wikforss, in "Are Natural Kind Terms Special?", attacks the view that natural kind terms constitute either a semantically or a meta-semantically special class of general terms. In attacking the view that such terms constitute a semantically special class of general terms, she attacks more specifically the views that they are special because rigid and the view that they are special because non-descriptive.

Wikforss's discussion of whether natural kind terms are special-because-rigid focuses primarily on a particular conception of rigidity for general terms, the conception which Martí and Martínez-Fernández defend. Wikforss's main criticism of the claim that natural kind terms are special because rigid according to this conception is that if natural kind terms are rigid on this conception, then so are simple non-natural kind terms such as 'table', 'attorney', and 'bachelor'. This strikes me as a cogent criticism of the view that such terms are semantically special because rigid on this conception. (Martí and Martínez-Fernández would agree.)

In attacking the view that natural kind terms are semantically special because non-descriptive, Wikforss considers three difficulties in particular. First, there is the worry that there are natural kind terms, such as ' H2O ', that many would want to characterize as descriptive. Second, there is the worry that the alleged non-descriptionality of natural kind terms would make scientific investigation required to tell whether a purported natural kind term is really a non-descriptive natural kind term or a descriptive non-natural kind term. Finally, there is the worry that the alleged non-descriptionality of natural kind terms is unmotivated by traditional Kripke-style arguments. Wikforss takes these considerations to suggest that the correct account of the meanings of all kind terms (natural and not) is in terms of an old-fashioned cluster-of-descriptions theory.

In attacking the view that natural terms are meta-semantically special, Wikforss attacks more specifically the view that they are special because they have their reference fixed via descriptions of the form 'The "such and such" kind of which these samples are instances', where the "such and such" kind of which these samples are instances is a kind membership which is entirely essentially a matter of "underlying" properties. Her main criticism of this view draws on interesting work by John Dupré and Paul Needham, who have argued independently that meaningful biological and chemical natural kind terms respectively are often not uniquely associated with any underlying property of the required sort.[i] Wikforss's discussion of whether natural kind terms are meta-semantically special is intriguing, informative and informed. It also leaves this reader wondering whether a more nuanced version of the view that natural kind terms are meta-semantically special might survive her attack.

In "The Commonalities between Proper Names and Natural Kind Terms: A Fregean Perspective", Noonan defends a Fregean descriptivist perspective on names and natural kind terms from Kripke's arguments against such views, and he provides a Fregean account of the Kripkean alleged phenomena of the necessary a posteriori and the contingent a priori. He argues that there are in fact no necessary a posteriori or contingent a priori truths. Although I am inclined to disagree with its central tenets, his essay is exceptionally strong -- easily one of the most sophisticated, most plausible, and best worked out defenses one can find of a thoroughly Fregean account of names and natural kind terms.

LaPorte, in "Theoretical Identity Statements, Their Truth, and Their Discovery", contrasts his own view of theoretical identity statements with what he takes to be the received view of such statements and he defends his view from various criticisms. The received view LaPorte discusses is that typical theoretical identity statements (e.g., 'water is H2O ', 'Mammalia is the clade with stem M') are discovered to be true through scientific investigation. LaPorte grants that such statements are sometimes true, but denies that they are scientifically discovered to be true. According to LaPorte, when such statements end up true, this is because scientists have come to use previously existing terms with precisified meanings not determined by previously established usage. For example, scientists came to use the term 'water' so as to apply it to all and only instances of H2O, even though previous use of 'water' was consistent with a decision to let it apply to other superficially similar substances as well and with a decision to let it not apply to forms of H2O containing ionized hydrogen atoms.

In "Discovering the Essences of Natural Kinds", Bird defends the view that theoretical identity statements are often discovered, not stipulated, to be true from LaPorte's attack. Where LaPorte sees resolved semantic indeterminacy for natural kind terms, Bird sees conceptual change and non-natural kind terms. According to Bird, if 'water' was in fact a preexisting natural kind term and scientists had decided to use 'water' to apply only to unionized forms of H2O, then this would have involved conceptual change and not resolution of a semantic indeterminacy. Bird also argues that LaPorte's apparatus is unable to account for certain examples of theoretical identities involving technically introduced scientific terms. He argues cogently through careful historical analysis of the context in which the term 'actinium' was introduced, for example, that the statement 'actinium is the element with atomic number 89', as it is currently used, was discovered, not stipulated to be true.

Hendry, in "The Elements and Conceptual Change", defends a Putnam-style account of how certain terms from chemistry function. This account explains how continuity of reference through radical changes in theory actually occurred in the case of certain terms for chemical elements. For example, it explains how Antoine Lavoisier was able to use the term 'oxygen' to refer to oxygen even though he lacked the contemporary concept of nuclear charge which today individuates the elements. According to Hendry's account, Lavoisier was able to use 'oxygen' so as to apply to oxygen because (i) the property of having atomic charge 8 in fact played a certain role in explaining certain chemical behaviors Lavoisier sought to explain and because (ii) he used the term 'oxygen' with, more or less, the intention of letting it apply to those components of substances that have the underlying property, whatever that might have been, that played a certain role in explaining the chemical behaviors in question. As Hendry notes, this picture supports the view that the statement 'Oxygen is the element with atomic charge of 8' expresses a discovery and not, as LaPorte would maintain, a stipulation. In this way, Hendry's article bolsters Bird's criticism of LaPorte. One feature of this article that sets it apart from most standard discussions of Putnam-style views is its focus on historical detail in arguing for the claims it does. The article appears to represent a significant contribution to our understanding of these matters.

As a group, the articles by LaPorte, Bird and Hendry are a major highlight of the volume, and there appears to be much for us to learn from them.

Beebee and Sabbarton-Leary, "On the Abuse of the Necessary A Posteriori", argue against Brian Ellis's brand of scientific essentialism (henceforth ESE).[ii] According to ESE, each natural kind has an essence that gives rise to a posteriori metaphysical necessities, and the natural necessities are a posteriori metaphysical necessities to which the essences of the natural kinds give rise. Beebee and Sabbarton-Leary consider the term 'ununbium' and the theoretical identity statement (3).

3. Ununbium is the element with atomic number 112.

They argue that given the conventions governing the use of 'ununbium', (3) is guaranteed to be true by convention and that because of this (3) expresses an a priori, not an a posteriori, necessity. (They argue for parallel conclusions regarding a number of other interesting examples as well.) They also maintain that the fact that (3) does not express an a posteriori necessity can be used to argue against ESE. Their main argument in favor of this claim, I think, can faithfully be reconstructed as follows:

Argument 3

P1. (3) expresses an a priori, not an a posteriori, necessity.

P2. If (3) does not express an a posteriori necessity, then 'ununbium' does not designate a kind that gives rise to a posteriori necessities.

P3. If ESE is correct, then 'ununbium' doesn't designate a natural kind unless it designates one that gives rise to a posteriori necessities.

P4. 'Ununbium' does designate a natural kind.

C3. So, ESE is incorrect.

This argument places some pressure on the proponent of ESE, but it strikes me as less than conclusive. A proponent of ESE, it seems to me, has two plausible lines of response to consider. First, a proponent of ESE might plausibly argue in a Donnellan-inspired manner that the truth expressed by (P1) cannot in fact be known to be true a priori even if the sentence (3) (better, a conditionalized version of (3)) is guaranteed to express a truth by convention.[iii] Adopting this strategy, the proponent of ESE rejects the first premise of the argument. Alternatively, a proponent of ESE might accept the first premise of the argument and reject the second. More specifically, a proponent of ESE might plausibly maintain that 'ununbium' designates a kind whose essence is that of having atomic number 112, that the essence of the kind in question gives rise to an a posteriori necessity to the effect that that kind is the element with atomic number 112, and that (3) does not express this necessity. Beebee and Sabbarton-Leary seem to assume here that if 'ununbium' designates a kind that gives rise to an a posteriori necessity of the relevant sort, then (3) must express that necessity. But they have given us little reason to think that the proponent of ESE must accept this assumption. Regardless of whether this particular argument ultimately succeeds, their article is packed with interesting examples and interesting points.

Emma Tobin's "Crosscutting Natural Kinds and the Hierarchy Thesis" provides an intriguing discussion of the thesis that whenever natural kinds overlap one must subsume the other as a subkind. According to this thesis, since the kinds vertebrate and mammal overlap, one of these kinds must subsume the other as a subkind -- as the kind vertebrate in fact subsumes the kind mammal. Crosscutting categories are categories that overlap when neither subsumes the other as a subcategory. As Tobin emphasizes, there appear to be crosscutting categories in science that one might otherwise have considered to be natural kinds. For example, the biological categories mammal and quadruped overlap, but neither is a subcategory of the other. Similarly, the biochemical categories enzyme and protein overlap, but neither is a subcategory of the other. And one might otherwise have expected that the categories mammal, quadruped, enzyme, and protein would count as natural kinds. Tobin argues that the biochemical categories enzyme and protein may well be examples of genuine realist natural kinds that crosscut one another. In adopting this position, she departs from authors such as Ian Hacking and Ellis who maintain that realist natural kinds cannot crosscut one another.[iv]

In "From Constitutional Necessities to Causal Necessities", Wilson argues that one who accepts certain sorts of metaphysical necessities should also accept that there are metaphysical necessities between causes and effects. Consider the following necessities:

4a. Necessarily, anything that is scarlet is red.

4b. Necessarily, anything having a certain mean molecular kinetic energy has a certain temperature.

4c. Necessarily, anything that is an electron is negatively charged.

Wilson argues more specifically that anyone who accepts any of these apparent necessities should also accept that there are necessary connections between causes and effects. She argues for this on the grounds that the best explanations of (i) the metaphysical grounds of the necessities in (4) and (ii) the justification for belief in any of those necessities appeals to certain claims regarding the modal stability of causal roles. The relevant claims of modal stability, she maintains, require the existence of necessary connections between causes and effects. Wilson also thinks that we should accept the relevant constitutional necessities. And so, she concludes that we should accept that there are causal metaphysical necessities. Wilson argues still further that her discussion of these issues provides non-Humean leverage in adjudicating between Humean and non-Humean positions in the metaphysics of science. (Here a Humean position is, roughly, one according to which there are no necessary connections between wholly distinct entities.) Causes and effects, according to Wilson, are wholly distinct entities. So, she suggests, if we have reason to accept causal necessities, we also have reason to prefer a non-Humean to a Humean stance in the metaphysics of science. This contribution repays careful attention.

Boyd's "Realism, Natural Kinds, and Philosophical Methods" presents his views on the reliability of inductive/explanatory practices and on the definitions of natural kinds. He draws certain lessons from these views regarding the metaphysics of natural kinds and the nature of philosophy. According to Boyd, our best inductive/explanatory practices are accommodated to relevant causal structures in our environment and their being so accommodated explains why those practices are successful. The kind k referred to by a kind term t as used in a discipline M is defined by a family of properties F such that (i) there is a systematic tendency for what is predicated of t within M to be approximately true of things which satisfy the properties in F and (ii) the fact that there is this systematic tendency plays a certain role in explaining how the use of t in M contributes to accommodation of M to relevant causal structures in our environment and to the inductive/explanatory success of M.

According to Boyd, these views regarding inductive/explanatory practices and the definitions of natural kinds lead to the results that defining natural kinds is an a posteriori matter, that natural kinds are social constructions, that correct talk of natural kinds involves reference to or quantification over particular disciplines, and that what counts as a natural kind relative to one discipline may not count as a natural kind relative to another. Boyd ultimately maintains that these views also motivate an anti-reductionist and naturalistic approach to philosophy, according to which philosophy "is a largely (or completely) a posteriori discipline continuous with the empirical sciences" (220). The essay provides a nice introduction to some of Boyd's important views regarding natural kinds and the nature of scientific inquiry and it draws interesting connections between those views and some of their broader consequences.



[i] See Dupre, J., "Natural Kinds and Biological Taxa", Philosophical Review, 91 (1981): 66-90; Needham, P., "What is Water?", Analysis 60 (2000): 13-21.

[ii] Ellis, B. Scientific Essentialism. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001).

[iii] See Donnellan, K. "The Contingent A Priori and Rigid Designators," Midwest Studies in Philosophy 2 (1977): 12-27.

[iv] Hacking, I. "A Tradition of Natural Kinds," Philosophical Studies 61 (1991): 109-26; Ellis, Ibid.