2011.08.12

Arthur Schopenhauer

The World as Will and Representation, Volume 1

Arthur Schopenhauer, The World as Will and Representation, Volume1, Judith Norman, Alistair Welchman, and Christopher Janaway (eds., trs.), Cambridge University Press, 2010, 633pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521871846.

Reviewed by Sandra Shapshay, Indiana University


English-speaking scholars and students of nineteenth-century German philosophy are living in fortunate times. The increased attention to Kant's philosophy in the twentieth century that precipitated the Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant has blossomed into significant philosophical interest in post-Kantian German Idealism and Romanticism in the Anglo-American philosophical world. Under the direction of general editor Christopher Janaway, Cambridge University Press is now in the process of publishing the first-ever English-language edition of the collected works of Arthur Schopenhauer, that great academic outsider, pessimist, educator of Nietzsche and first serious courter of Oriental thought in Western philosophy.

The projected six volume edition consists at present of Janaway's excellent translation and edition of The Two Fundamental Problems of Ethics (2009) and now -- the focus of this review -- Schopenhauer's magnum opus, The World as Will and Representation, Volume I, translated and edited by Judith Norman, Alistair Welchman, and Janaway. Unlike its Kant counterpart, this English edition of the works of Schopenhauer does not project -- at least at this point -- to include unpublished writings, Nachlass and correspondence. Notwithstanding, due to the high-quality and philosophical sophistication of the translations thus far, as well as the uniformity afforded by this series, the Cambridge Edition of the Works of Schopenhauer is rightly sure to become the standard English edition for Schopenhauer scholars for the foreseeable future.

This translation of The World as Will and Representation, Volume I, is accompanied by a significant scholarly apparatus including, most usefully, endnotes detailing passages that were added or altered by Schopenhauer in the various editions of his works as well as footnotes giving the original German vocabulary for philosophically important terms. Also helpful for readers less familiar with Schopenhauer, the editor-translators have provided a glossary of proper names referred to in the text, a detailed chronology of Schopenhauer's life and writings, a bibliography of his German works, a list of alternative English translations and a short guide to major secondary literature in English.

In addition, the editors' introduction offers a lucid, illuminating synopsis of all of the major views to be encountered in the work. While the editors do not address, to a great extent, contemporary interpretive controversies -- some of which deal with fundamental issues in Schopenhauer's philosophy such as how strong a claim he makes in indentifying the thing in itself with will -- such a discussion is arguably beyond the scope of an introduction to the text, one that constitutes Schopenhauer's fullest statement of his entire philosophy, including his epistemology, metaphysics, philosophy of nature, aesthetics and philosophy of art, philosophy of mind and action, philosophy of religion, ethics, and his views on the significance and value of human existence. The introduction serves very well to orient and prepare readers for the task of grappling with this wide-ranging work. Most crucially in this regard, the editors provide a concise but complete summary of Schopenhauer's doctoral dissertation On the Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (accepted by the University of Jena in 1813, published in 1814 and revised in 1847), a familiarity with which Schopenhauer explicitly (and rightly) claims is prerequisite for understanding his main work (p. 7).

Tantalizingly, the Introduction begins and ends with Schopenhauer's claim that his fourfold-structured, organic work aims to expound a "single thought", but one which may not be conveyed except by the entire work. While the editors, wisely, do not hazard a simple paraphrase of this thought, they suggest a heuristic for grasping it: "At the core of the single thought, then, is this: one and the same world has two aspects, and we can learn about it by considering it as representation, then as will, then as representation in an altered fashion, then as will in an altered fashion" (xiv). In other words, a reader should pay close attention to the structure of the work as a whole and to the oscillation it presents between, on the one hand, reflection on the world of representation via ordinary experiences and scientific inquiry (the subject of Book I) and on ordinary experiences of willing or volition (Book II), and, on the other hand, extraordinary experiences of the world around us -- aesthetic experiences, especially of works of art (Book III) and extraordinary ways of willing -- e.g. compassionately -- or ceasing to will at all, as in saintly resignation from the world (Book IV). By attending to this oscillation one gains an appreciation for Schopenhauer's "single thought" which is conveyed via multiple perspectives in the text.

The case for publishing this edition as a whole and this volume in particular is compelling. Up to this point, most of the translations of Schopenhauer's writings were made by E.F.J. Payne in the 1950s and 1960s. While Payne did a remarkable job of rendering Schopenhauer's clear, elegant and witty writing into fluid -- even stirring -- English prose, he was not a philosopher, rather, he was a military officer! Lacking philosophical training, Payne paid insufficient attention to the nuances of Schopenhauer's terminology. For example, the Payne translation of The World as Will and Representation renders both 'Erkenntniß' and 'Wissen' as 'knowledge'. But, as Norman, Welchman and Janaway correctly indicate, these terms ought to be kept distinct. Schopenhauer understands Wissen as a subset of Erkenntniß: Non-human animals as well as human beings are capable of Erkenntniß, an intuitive kind of knowledge synthesized by the understanding (Verstand), whereas only rational creatures can have Wissen, for they alone have the ability to form and manipulate concepts. Schopenhauer thus reserves 'Wissen' for conceptual knowledge (tied up with language), and the translators mark this important distinction by consistently translating the term as 'knowledge,' while translating the term for this pre-conceptual type of knowledge, 'Erkenntniß,' as 'cognition.' One of the significant advances of the Norman et al. translation, therefore, is to bring out this all-important philosophical distinction, one which is obscured linguistically in the Payne translation.

A couple of tricky translation decisions arise from the very title of the work, "Die Welt als Wille und Vorstellung." First, there is the crucial term 'Vorstellung'. In 2008, Richard E. Aquila also came out with a fine translation of the first volume of Schopenhauer's magnum opus, which he translated as The World as Will and Presentation. An older translation by R.B. Haldane and J. Kemp (1883) rendered the title as "The World as Will and Idea." Norman et al. agree that a good case can be made for translating 'Vorstellung' as 'presentation,' given that Schopenhauer uses the term to denote whatever comes before consciousness at all without inviting the connotation that the mental item "stands in for" or "re-presents" a copy of some item in the extra-mental world (p. xlviii). But the Cambridge edition translators have opted to use 'representation' for 'Vorstellung' largely because this aligns with the most common rendering of the term in Kant's philosophy and because both 'presentation' and 'representation' are terms of art. Indeed, I agree with the Cambridge edition translators that if the reader can keep these connotative differences in mind, then she will not be misled into interpreting Schopenhauer as more of a representative idealist than he really is. All in all, I think they made the right choice here, for it is important to bring out the continuity between Kant and Schopenhauer's philosophical terminology.

The case against using 'Idea' to translate 'Vorstellung' is even clearer in my view, for, as the translators also note, Schopenhauer utilizes 'Idee' in a very particular sense in his philosophy, as akin to a Platonic idea. To translate 'Vorstellung' as 'idea' would muddy the important distinction between more ordinary mental items, Vorstellungen, and the objects of aesthetic experience of nature and art, Ideen.

A second issue arising from the title itself is how best to translate 'Wille.' Schopenhauer notoriously uses 'Wille' in a variety of senses without specifying clearly which sense he means. For example, he uses 'Wille' in his central claim that the world as a whole in itself is "will"; he also claims that Wille is the essential character of the individual; and avers that the individual's Wille can be seen through his empirical actions. Some Schopenhauer commentators use a capitalized 'Will' to keep distinct the transcendent or transcendental uses of the term from its use to denote the phenomenal appearances of the thing in itself. But since German lacks this orthographic distinction, the translators have, I believe sagely, translated 'Wille' as 'will' throughout, leaving it up to the reader to determine from the context exactly which sense Schopenhauer intended, as would a reader in German.

As in any project of this sort, there are difficult decisions to be made. First, and most fundamentally, is the choice of German edition on which to base the translation. The editors have chosen to base theirs on Arthur Hübscher's (1988), which they call "definitive." Some, following Ludger Lütkehaus, would disagree. In 1988, Lütkehaus published a rival edition of Schopenhauer's works which he claimed to be the first and only unchanged (unveränderte) edition and which alone respected "Schopenhauer's final editorial wishes" ("Schopenhauers letzter editorischer Wille"). Lütkehaus was careful not even to modify punctuation or incongruences, aiming to be absolutely faithful with respect to sentence, word, spelling and punctuation. The Hübscher edition is less scrupulous in this regard, but, in any case, for The World as Will and Representation, Volume I, the differences between these editions are slight. In the later Parerga and Paralipomena, the case would be more controversial as the Hübscher edition includes the insertion of texts Schopenhauer had prepared for the second edition but which he never published in his lifetime. In summary, Norman, Welchman and Janaway's choice is understandable and not terribly controversial today: they use what has become the most commonly referenced edition in contemporary scholarship, e.g., the one used by the Schopenhauer-Jahrbuch, the journal of the Schopenhauer-Gesellschaft.

A second set of choices concerns salient philosophical terminology. Above, I discussed a few of the choices the translators have made and their rationale for doing so. Other interesting departures from the Payne translation are: 'objecthood' for 'Objektität'; 'objectivation' for 'Objektivation'. Although these are hardly natural terms in English, and less natural than the terms 'objectivity' and 'objectification' used by Payne, they were never natural-sounding in German. Schopenhauer coined these terms in order to try to capture the relationship he posited between the thing in itself and appearances. The odd ring of these English terms, then, to my mind is a positive feature of the translation.

Norman et al. also translate 'Wille zum Leben' as 'will to life' rather than Payne's 'will to live' in a way that reveals more perspicuously a philosophically-salient point about this drive in Schopenhauer's philosophy: it is a drive to life in general -- procreation as well as survival -- rather than merely to the continuation of the individual's own existence. To my mind, the translation of 'Wille zum Leben' as the 'will to life' is therefore decidedly superior. Only a couple of terms in this translation seem to me more strained: for example, 'Menschenliebe' is translated as 'loving kindness,' rather than as 'philanthropy.' While 'loving-kindness' does better capture the fact that 'Menschenliebe' is a character trait and not the substantial outcome of a person's actions toward others, the term loses the 'Mensch'-oriented aspect of the trait preserved in 'philanthropy.' But, frankly, I am quibbling at this point: This is a highly effective translation.

The main choice I do lament, however, is the translation of most of the extracts Schopenhauer quotes from other languages into English right into the body of the text. An astounding polyglot, Schopenhauer peppers The World as Will and Representation throughout with extracts from French, Latin, Greek, Italian, Spanish, and even transliterated Sanskrit! The Payne translation retains this erudite flavor by keeping the original extracts in the body of the text and offering translations in the footnotes. Norman et al. reverse this practice and justify their choice on the basis of greater readability for the majority of contemporary readers who have somewhat limited linguistic knowledge. Indeed, most readers will find it easier not to have the flow of the English prose broken up with sometimes fairly long extracts in foreign languages. However, in addition to diminishing the Cosmopolitan impression of Schopenhauer's original text, sometimes the straight translation of especially Latin and Greek terms obscures the fact that Schopenhauer aims to employ a certain technical, philosophical device. For example, in a very important passage in Book II where Schopenhauer clarifies his identification of the Kantian thing in itself with the term 'will,' he writes:

Man hat jedoch wohl zu bemerken, daß wir hier allerdings nur eine denominatio a potiori gebrauchen, durch welche eben deshalb der Begriff Wille eine größere Ausdehnung erhält, als er bisher hatte. (Hübscher 132)

Clearly, the use of the Latin term here signifies that he is employing a technical device (it is a rather obscure rhetorical-philosophical device akin to a metonymy, where something is named according to its best known or main feature). In the Payne translation the fact that the Latin is retained in the body of the text clearly signals this feature of Schopenhauer's passage:

We have to observe, however, that here of course we use only a denominatio a potiori, by which the concept of will therefore receives a greater extension than it has hitherto had. (Payne, 111)

By contrast, in the Norman, Welchman and Janaway translation, this feature is made less perceptible:

It is nonetheless fair to say that we are only using a denomination from the superior term [footnote: denominatio a potiori] that gives the concept of will a broader scope than it had before. (135)

The difference here is subtle, and certainly the use of an editorial footnote which supplies the Latin term significantly mitigates the problem, but I do worry that in such passages some accuracy has been sacrificed in favor of ease of reading. One error I spotted in the translation may be related to this policy as well. On p. 230 the translators rendered 'Hypostasen' as 'hypotheses' rather than as 'hypostases'.

These minor criticisms notwithstanding, the Cambridge Edition translation of The World as Will and Representation, Volume I, is a remarkable achievement and will be of great value to Schopenhauer scholars and students in the English-speaking world. Effective translation requires rigorous linguistic accuracy and philosophical acuity, but it is also an art, and in their creative and adept handling of the text, Norman, Welchman and Janaway demonstrate considerable virtuosity. For their scholarly labors and skill, English-speaking scholars and students of nineteenth-century German philosophy should be grateful.