2011.08.23

Hans Blumenberg

Paradigms for a Metaphorology AND Care Crosses the River

Hans Blumenberg, Paradigms for a Metaphorology, Robert Savage (tr.), Cornell University Press, 2010, 152pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780801449253.

Hans Blumenberg, Care Crosses the River, Paul Fleming (tr.), Stanford University Press, 2010, 157pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804735803.

Reviewed by David Adams, Ohio State University


The publication in 2010 of two new English translations of books by Hans Blumenberg is cause for celebration. Their nearly simultaneous appearance may be a coincidence -- Paradigms for a Metaphorology was translated by Robert Savage for Cornell and Care Crosses the River was translated by Paul Fleming for Stanford -- but the coincidence could not be more fortunate as the two works complement each other superbly. These relatively brief, stylistically divergent works from opposite ends of Blumenberg's career (1960 and 1986) provide English-language readers with long-overdue access to Blumenberg's reflections on the role of metaphor in philosophical discourse.

Blumenberg is one of Germany's most important postwar philosophers, but his presence in the English language has so far been limited. Born in Lübeck in 1920, his studies were interrupted by the war, during which he was persecuted as a Halbjude ("half Jew") and sheltered by the family of his future wife. Following the war he promptly completed his doctoral and postdoctoral dissertations (1947 and 1950), then taught successively at universities in Hamburg, Giessen, and Bochum, landing finally in Münster from 1970 to 1986. Beginning in 1966 he published a series of weighty volumes, three of which were translated into English by Bob Wallace and published by MIT Press in the 1980s: The Legitimacy of the Modern AgeWork on Myth, and The Genesis of the Copernican Age. Since his death in 1996, a steady stream of posthumous publications has accompanied the intensified interest in his work in Germany; interest from the Anglophone world is increasing as well, evidenced in part by these two new translations.

Independently of the linguistic turn in France, Blumenberg began highlighting the role of metaphor in philosophical discourse in the 1950s. More than a decade before the appearance of Jacques Derrida's "La mythologie blanche", for example, Blumenberg published "Light as a Metaphor for Truth" (1957),[1] which includes his earliest reference to nonconceptuality (Unbegrifflichkeit), his paradoxical concept for perceptions and experiences that do not lend themselves to representation in precise, univocal concepts and thus invite expression in metaphor, myth, and symbol. Paradigms for a Metaphorology, coming three years later, argues for a broadening of the field of Begriffsgeschichte (the history of concepts) to include the history of metaphors.[2] Metaphors are not merely ornamentation, Blumenberg argues, but are

foundational elements [Grundbestände] of philosophical language, 'translations' that resist being converted back into authenticity and logicality. If it could be shown that such translations, which would have to be called 'absolute metaphors', exist, then one of the essential tasks of conceptual history (in the thus expanded sense) would be to ascertain and analyze their conceptually irredeemable expressive function. (Paradigms, 3)

The first half of Paradigms for a Metaphorology demonstrates this expressive function in several metaphors, such as the powerful truth, the naked truth, terra incognita, the incomplete universe, and the book of nature. The second half begins to demarcate the realm of metaphor with paradigms for a "typology of metaphor histories." The paradigms focus on "transitional phenomena" that illustrate the historical transformations between, and distinct functions of, absolute metaphor, myth, symbol, and concept. This tentative typology involves the discussion of additional metaphors that would become the focus of later, longer works by Blumenberg, including Plato's allegory of the cave and Copernicus's cosmology.

In Blumenberg's initial definition, cited above, what makes these metaphors "absolute" is their resistance to conceptualization; they spring into the lacunae of conceptual representation (cf. Paradigms, 122). But he soon identifies another sense in which the metaphors of philosophy are absolute or fundamental:

The relevance of absolute metaphors, their historical truth . . . is pragmatic in a very broad sense. By providing a point of orientation, the content of absolute metaphors determines a particular attitude or conduct [Verhalten]; they give structure to a world, representing the nonexperienceable, nonapprehensible totality of the real. (Paradigms, 14)

This notion of a pragmatic representation of the totality of the real would become a central component of Blumenberg's defense of modernity in The Legitimacy of the Modern Age. The closing passage of Paradigms for a Metaphorology makes clear the implications of the emphasis on "totality" by juxtaposing absolute metaphor and absolute will:

absolute metaphor leaps into a void, inscribing itself on the tabula rasa of theoretical unsatisfiability; here it has occupied the position of the defunct absolute will. Metaphysics has often revealed itself to us to be metaphorics taken at its word; the demise of metaphysics calls metaphorics back to its place. (Paradigms, 132)

This dramatic expansion of the meaning of "absolute" points to a productive tension running through the book. On the one hand, Blumenberg strives to call metaphor "back to its place" in philosophical discourse, and thus he declares metaphorology a "subbranch of conceptual history," "an auxiliary discipline to philosophy" (Paradigms, 77), and a "positivist program" that must itself forgo the use of metaphor (Paradigms, 14). His talk of a typology of metaphors to demarcate the place of metaphor in intellectual history (not to mention his yoking of the suffix -ology to "metaphor" in naming this new subdiscipline) is in keeping with this ambition for conceptual rigor. On the other hand, the book contains ample evidence that the plenitude of meaning provided by absolute metaphors will not be so easy to discipline and contain. Such metaphor often operates "in a subterranean stratum of thought," he explains (Paradigms, 7), and he devotes a chapter to organic and mechanical metaphors that operate in the "background" to secure the "semantic unity" of the "terminological propositions" visible in the foreground (Paradigms, 62). Indeed, Blumenberg suggests already in the introduction that perhaps "the realm of the imagination . . . [is] a catalytic sphere from which the universe of concepts continually renews itself, without thereby converting and exhausting this founding reserve" (Paradigms, 4). This underlying tension helps explain how the meaning of "absolute" can evolve so quickly from indicating merely that metaphor cannot be dissolved into concepts to describing one way humankind has tried to fill the hole left by the defunct absolute will.

Robert Savage's "Translator's Afterword" skillfully balances a sense of the way "metaphorology" was doomed from the beginning with an appreciation of the rich beginnings this work provided for Blumenberg and his readers in the ensuing decades. Savage provides a detailed sense of context, explaining the text's position in Blumenberg's oeuvre and relation to key figures in the history of philosophy. He also deftly balances the needs of different audiences, providing both a useful introduction for those new to Blumenberg and interesting readings for veteran Blumenbergians.[3]

Other components of this volume are as praiseworthy as the afterword; indeed, Paradigms for a Metaphorology is a model of scholarly translation. Savage's handling of citations and sources is scrupulous and thorough; when Blumenberg quotes sources in Greek, Latin, French, or German (for example), Savage provides English translations while preserving the originals in footnotes. And he provides judicious explanatory notes that work in conjunction with the afterword and Blumenberg's own notes to guide readers through Blumenberg's own reading and career. Finally, and most importantly, his English rendering is consistently accurate while also being, in the context of translations of German philosophy, remarkably readable. As the passages I have cited illustrate, the diction remains close to the German while the syntax is more thoroughly Anglicized. In short, readers approaching Blumenberg's reflections on metaphor through the English language could not ask for a more reliable and helpful guide than this volume.

Care Crosses the River demonstrates Blumenberg's altered handling of absolute metaphors nearly three decades after his proposed metaphorology. The histories practiced here are no longer narratives spanning centuries of shifting horizons of meaning, but anecdotes from eddies in the history of philosophy. By the 1980s, Blumenberg's notion that the imaginative work performed by metaphor serves as an enriching, catalyzing realm for philosophical discourse began to shape more profoundly the form and style of some of his own writing. Rather than sketching a typology of metaphor histories -- or offering a prospect of a theory of nonconceptuality, as in the 1970s[4] -- he begins to write short literary essays to explore various lacunae in the history of philosophy. The replacement of systematic aims with literary ambition creates greater harmony between the mode and object of reflection. These brief pieces -- blending elements of anecdote, parable, aphorism, and essays (experiments) in thought -- often deploy and alter absolute metaphors as well as commenting on others' uses and misuses and missed opportunities for the use of metaphor. He published these mini-essays in literary magazines and newspapers, primarily Akzente and Neue Zürcher ZeitungCare Crosses the River is a collection of 65 such literary pieces (about 10 of them previously published in periodicals) thematically arranged in six sections.

As strikingly different as these mini-essays are in their form and sometimes their style from Blumenberg's earlier work on metaphor, this volume also calls attention to a remarkable consistency in his thematic interests and intellectual orientation. The first two sections, "Maritime Emergencies" and "What is Perhaps Lost," discuss and deploy variations on the sea journey and shipwreck metaphor. In the third section, "Fundamental Differences," Blumenberg plays on the German word Grund, which means both "ground" and "reason." This is one of the sections inviting interesting comparisons to Paradigms for a Metaphorology, where he used Grund as a concept without noting its metaphorical function in phrases like "fundamental elements [Grundbestände]" (see above) or "the ground of our existence [Daseinsgrund]" (Paradigms, 14). The newly self-conscious reflections on Grund in the third section lead smoothly to the fourth section, "Something Like a World Order." The first essay in this section opens with a paragraph that implicitly acknowledges the persistence of absolute metaphors:

The idea of a world order, even when it cannot be proven in an ostensible-phenomenal fashion, seems to dwell ineradicably in human consciousness. It has manifested itself in sublime and banal forms. The philosophically attuned soul shies away from all-too-easy formulas -- but they are what everything else is based on (Care, 93).

The fifth section, "Missed Encounters," tells of meetings between historical figures -- painters, musicians, writers, and philosophers -- even when evidence from some of these meetings remains fragmentary. Blumenberg's focus here is often on misunderstandings or missed opportunities, such as Guilo Clove's surprise at El Greco being disturbed by daylight, Karl Friedrich Zelter and Beethoven both napping through the time of their arranged meeting, or Proust and Joyce making small talk about truffles. His stories of failed encounters might be seen as commentary on the futility of face-to-face communication or rational discourse in a world of hidden truths and divergent world orders, on the frustration caused for the historically minded by lacunae in historical meaning, and on his own increasing reclusiveness (among other possible interpretations).

The sixth section, "Dasein's Care," includes nine pieces influenced by and responding to Heidegger, as the title implies. The first essay in this final section takes up Hyginus' fable of Cura, which Heidegger used in Being and Time. The allegorical Care crosses a river and finds some clay to fashion the human form, and at Care's request Jupiter lends spirit to this clay. Blumenberg's gloss focuses on details explained neither in the fable itself nor in Heidegger's reading: why does Care cross a river and what serves as her model when she gives the clay human form? He connects these two details by suggesting that the river crossing allows Care to see her own reflection and this triggers her narcissistic creation of the human form in her own image. He then suggests that a suppressed Gnosticism lies at the core of the fable since "mirrorings belong to the Gnostic founding myth" (Care, 140). Thus his inventive supplement to the fable enables him to begin wresting it away from Heidegger and Heidegger's concept of "care."

Perhaps inevitably, and by design, some of these brief essays resonate more than others. They range from light anecdote to grave deliberation and at moments they succeed in fusing both extremes. The story of Care crossing a river strikes me as one of these felicitous moments (my brief summary leaves out too much to do it justice). Often this essay, only two-and-a-half pages long, seems to hover on the periphery of what matters: Hyginus is not a commonly cited fabulist, this fable is not a customary point of entry into Heidegger's analysis of Dasein, and Blumenberg focuses on details that initially appear marginal to the story. At the same time, however, Blumenberg's exegesis provokes thought about textual and historical cruxes: the relation between the image of Care and the spirit reclaimed by Jupiter (not to mention the clay from Tellus, the earth), the importance of Gnosticism in Christianity and in the emergence of the modern age (analyzed by Blumenberg elsewhere), and the origins of Heideggerian thought.

The form of the essay itself provokes thought: the inventive filling of lacunae, the explaining of unexplained details by claiming that Hyginus has excised the Gnostic heart of the myth, is not historically verifiable, but it makes sense. Blumenberg once praised the irritating lacunae in fables for making the reader productively pensive,[5] and his response to Hyginus demonstrates his own pensiveness while passing it on, altered but undiminished, to the reader. The brevity of these essays and the lack of an explicit unifying thesis suggest that they can be read individually or out of order, and they can -- but they also benefit from a cumulative effect when read in sequence. Some of the reader's pensiveness comes from perceiving connections among the sections on sea, ground, world orders, missed opportunities, and care.

Paul Fleming's translation is reliable in presenting the content of Care Crosses the River. In adding literary ambition to philosophical reflection, the volume presents a different, sometimes trickier challenge for the translator than any other  Blumenberg volume translated into English to date. Fleming's task is especially unenviable -- and he is at his best -- when Blumenberg plays, through multiple essays, with the full semantic range of certain German words that have no clear equivalents in English. One example is Grund; another is "Verfehlungen," a section title "which could readily be translated as 'Transgressions,' 'Breaches,' 'Errors,' or even 'Lapses,'" Fleming writes before explaining his decision to title the section "Missed Encounters" (Care, 117n); and a third is Sorge ("care"). In each of these cases Fleming devotes a footnote to describing the challenge and his strategy for meeting it. Then when the English translation cannot reproduce connections evident in German -- when Sorge, for example, must be translated as "care" in one place and "worry" in another, or when one compound word combines two of these examples, as in "fundamental concerns of Being [Seinsgrundsorgen]" (143) -- Fleming provides the German word in square brackets. This approach allows the reader to follow Blumenberg's wordplay, to gain an intuition through the English language of the semantic range of the German words.

In certain other respects this translation is disappointing, most notably in its lack of an introduction and in the paucity of its bibliographic and explanatory notes. Given how different this Blumenberg volume is from any other available in English, it calls out for an introductory essay.[6] Explanatory notes could help provide contextual information, but they too are largely missing. Then there is the problem of bibliographic citations. Blumenberg dispensed with a critical apparatus in this volume, quoting sources without citing them and in some cases without naming them. Fleming wisely departs from this practice, but barely; a majority of Blumenberg's sources remain unidentified. An example of the sort of difficulty this presents for readers comes on the second page of the book, where we read:

Notorious nonswimmers that philosophers have always been, one clung to a plank from the shattered ship, let oneself be washed ashore, and then continued teaching at the nearest academy as if nothing had happened. And that was the point: one was a philosopher to the degree that one was immune to such interruptions. Of course, one had to be sure that the inland was inhabited, proof of which were geometrical figures left in the sand at the appropriate moment and not washed away, as if this had been the main thing done on beaches since the beginning of time. (Care, 4)

The same passage in German:

Man klammerte sich ans Gebälk des zerschellten Schiffs—notorische Nichtschwimmer, wie die Philosophen seit je waren—, ließ sich ans Ufer auswerfen und setzte im nächstgelegenen Gymnasium seine Lehre fort, als sei nichts gewesen. Darauf kam es an: man war Philosoph im Maße der Immunität gegen solche Unterbrechungen. Man mußte allerdings versichert sein, daß Menschen das Landesinnere bewohnten, und dazu gab es die geometrischen Figuren im Sand des Strandes, die zur rechten Zeit und unverweht da hinterlassen worden waren, als ob an Stränden seit je vor allem solches getrieben worden wäre. (8)

What neither Blumenberg nor Fleming tells us is that the philosopher under discussion is the Socratic Aristippus, whose shipwreck on the coast of Rhodes is narrated in the introduction to Book VI of Vitruvius's Ten Books on Architecture. Blumenberg's style in this work seems to enact in prose his dictum that "only by taking detours can we exist" (Care, 95), for the writing is characterized by circumlocutions and omissions, like his failure to name his subject and source here and his extensive use of man ("one," "someone," "a person"), a construction much more common in German than in English. Fleming's inclination to remain close to the German syntax adds confusion in this passage; in the German version the abstract "man" and the particular philosopher exist simultaneously (in "ließ sich," for example), while the progression in English from "philosophers" to "one" to "oneself" (not "himself") prolongs the confusion about who is being discussed. Given that Fleming does not make the mistake of entirely banning the critical apparatus for aesthetic or literary reasons, the decision not to gloss such passages throughout the book remains puzzling.

I have addressed these omissions anticipating that they will sometimes create confusion for Anglophone readers, but I wish to emphasize that such obstacles are not insurmountable and that this volume is a very welcome addition to the works of Blumenberg available in English. Fleming's translation enables readers to follow the threads of Blumenberg's interpretations and to appreciate his playfulness and irony. In short, the volume successfully carries over to the English language this important example of Blumenberg's literary anecdotes.

In these two books, Blumenberg provides various reminders that translation is a kind of metaphor (ÜbersetzungÜbertragung); the etymologies of "translation" and "metaphor" provide the same reminder. These two successful translations imaginatively fill lacunae by creating detours through the English language on the way to Blumenberg's philosophy. Both volumes are essential reading for anyone interested in German philosophy or critical theory.



[1] "Light as a Metaphor for Truth: At the Preliminary Stage of Philosophical Concept Formation," trans. Joel Anderson, in Modernity and the Hegemony of Vision, ed. David Michael Levin (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1993), 30-62.

[2] Blumenberg wrote the work for Archiv für Begriffsgeschichte, a periodical intended to lay the groundwork for the Historisches Wörterbuch der Philosophie. The first volume of the dictionary, A-C, appeared in 1971 and the editors decided at the outset not to include histories of metaphors. However, the eleventh volume, U-V, published in 2001, included an entry on "nonconceptuality," which I wrote largely in tribute to Blumenberg. See Historisches Wörterbuch der Philosophie, ed. Joachim Ritter, Karlfried Gründer, and Gottfried Gabriel, 13 vols. (Basel: Schwabe, 1971-2007), s.v. "Unbegrifflichkeit."

[3] The afterword complements Savage's review essay, "Laughter From the Lifeworld: Hans Blumenberg's Theory of Nonconceptuality," Thesis Eleven 94 (2008): 119-31.

[4] I have provided a more detailed account of the evolution of Blumenberg's philosophy in "Metaphors for Mankind: The Development of Hans Blumenberg's Anthropological Metaphorology," Journal of the History of Ideas 52 (1991): 152-66. In the 1970s, Blumenberg published Shipwreck with Spectator: Paradigm of a Metaphor for Existence (Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, 1997), which concluded with the essay "Prospect for a Theory of Nonconceptuality." Unfortunately, the English translation of this volume is not always serviceable (a problem afflicting neither of the translations under review here, which is part of the reason for celebrating their appearance after a wait of more than two decades since Wallace last translated Blumenberg). Perhaps the posthumous publication of related materials from this period of Blumenberg's career will provide a new opportunity for translating the theory of nonconceptuality into English: see Hans Blumenberg, Theorie der Unbegrifflichkeit, ed. Anselm Haverkamp (Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 2007).

[5] Hans Blumenberg, "Pensiveness," Caliban 6 (1989): 51-55.

[6] For an afterword of sorts -- a sampling of the translator's reading of the text -- see Paul Fleming, "The Perfect Story: Anecdote and Exemplarity in Linnaeus and Blumenberg," Thesis Eleven (2011) 104: 72-86.