2011.08.31

François Recanati

Truth-Conditional Pragmatics

François Recanati, Truth-Conditional Pragmatics, Oxford University Press, 2010, 324pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199226986.

Reviewed by Kent Bach, San Francisco State University


If you're unfamiliar with the title phrase of François Recanati's latest book, you'll naturally think he's proposing an alternative to truth-conditional semantics. And you'll be right. But not in the way you'd expect. And not in the way he intends. I'll explain what I mean in due course.

I will first try to explain what truth-conditional pragmatics (TCP) is and what it is not, then illustrate Recanati's ways of applying it, and finally offer a general assessment. The Introduction, Chapter 1 ("Compositionality, Flexibility, and Context-Dependence"), and Chapter 4 ("Pragmatics and Logical Form") present general features of TCP and give the motivation behind it. The remaining chapters, mostly slightly revised versions of previously published papers, apply TCP to specific linguistic phenomena. Having them all together helps one appreciate the general ideas behind the specific applications.

What is Truth-Conditional Pragmatics?

Recanati has long held and forcefully defended the now widely held view that in general the things we mean, even when we are not implicating anything completely separate from what we say, extends beyond the semantics of the sentences we utter. This happens whenever the uttered sentence fails to express a specific, nuanced, or rich enough proposition to be the thing the speaker means. It might even fall short of expressing a proposition altogether. We as speakers often don't make ourselves fully explicit and yet manage to make ourselves understood, and as hearers we are able to read things into others' utterances that they leave implicit. Focusing on sentence-sized utterances, Recanati is concerned with things speakers mean that are more closely connected to the semantic contents of the sentences they utter than are Grice's conversational implicatures.[1] Here are some simple examples.

1.     I haven't been to a doctor [to check my eye infection].

2.     Harry grabbed a hammer and smashed his car [with the hammer].

3.     I intend to finish [writing] Between the Lines this year.

4.     Barry is ineffective [as a leader].

5.     That rubber duck quacks when you squeeze it.

6.     I could eat a million of those cookies.

In the first four examples, the bracketed material is not part of the sentence being uttered. Rather, it indicates the implicit part of what we're supposing the speaker means. And whereas sentences (1) and (2) express propositions, albeit attenuated ones in relation to what the speaker means, (3) and (4) seem not to, since they appear to lack needed constituents.[2] As for (5) and (6), likely utterances of them would involve extended uses of the italicized words. In all these cases and countless others like them, as hearers we can generally ascertain what a speaker means in uttering them, at least in a suitable context, even though the speaker is not being fully explicit or completely literal. Indeed, as Recanati stresses, this "intuitive truth-conditional content" of such an utterance generally strikes us as being just as direct as if the speaker had been fully explicit and completely literal.[3]Phenomenologically, it's as if what we hear is an embellished version of the uttered sentence rather than just the sentence itself. The "pragmatic process" whereby we figure out what others mean is, subjectively speaking, often as direct and immediate as when what is meant is made fully explicit.

As Recanati develops and defends it, TCP is an attempt to come to grips with the fact that frequently the intuitive truth-conditional content of an utterance transcends the strictly semantic content of the uttered sentence. But exactly what does TCP claim, and what does it deny? This question is important to me because in the course of reading this book I learned, despite many longstanding disagreements with Recanati on many issues in this area, hence much to my surprise, that I'm an "advocate of truth-conditional pragmatics (p. 169), a "TCP theorist" (p. 135). It turns out (as I will explain) that TCP is not nearly so radical a doctrine as Recanati makes it out to be. Indeed, he himself makes clear that he is not endorsing anything so extreme as what he calls "Radical Contextualism" (pp. 17-22), which is the view, roughly, that virtually all expressions are context-sensitive, but TCP is radical enough, he insists, to conflict fundamentally with what he regards as the orthodoxies of "truth-conditional semantics" and Gricean pragmatics.[4]

To get clear on what TCP claims, first consider what it denies. One thing it denies is the fundamental presupposition of truth-conditional semantics. This is the common dogma I call "Propositionalism," that every (declarative) sentence has a truth-conditional, at least relative to a context of utterance. A good many sentences are propositionally or, if you prefer, semantically incomplete, in the sense that they fail to express propositions.[5] They lack at least one constituent needed to be true or false, hence to constitute complete contents of thought or statements (assuming these contents must be fully propositional).[6]

TCP also denies that "pragmatic effects" on the intuitive truth-conditional content of an utterance of a sentence are limited to disambiguating and to assigning values to context-sensitive expressions.[7] That is, what Recanati calls "pragmatic processes" bearing on intuitive truth-conditional content do not have to be linguistically mandated, triggered and made obligatory by constituents of the sentence itself, as in the process of "saturation," exemplified by the "contextual provision" of a value to an indexical or a demonstrative. As he sometimes puts it, other pragmatic processes, which fall under the rubric of "modulation" (transformation of standing meanings), do not have to be "post-propositional." Recanati rejects the old "essentially modular picture according to which semantics and pragmatics do not mix" (p. 2). Modulation compromises modularity.

So one positive component of TCP is the claim that "the intuitive truth-conditions of an utterance are affected by free pragmatic processes" (p. 12). Since for Recanati the job of "semantics is to account for the intuitive truth-conditions of utterances" (p. 127), truth-conditional pragmatics is in part a semantic thesis. This is so, Recanati allows, despite the fact that "we can characterize a notion of literal content such that literal content is, by definition, independent of pragmatic considerations (unless such considerations are imposed by the linguistic material itself)" (p. 127).

TCP's second main claim concerns the pragmatic process whereby hearers ascertain the intuitive truth-conditional contents of utterances. Parts of these contents are "pragmatic effects of context," and some of these effects

result from 'top-down' pragmatic processes that take place not because the linguistic material demands it, but because the utterance's content is not faithfully or wholly encoded in the uttered sentence, whose meaning requires adjustment or elaboration in order to determine an admissible content for the speaker's utterance (p. 127).

Recanati contends that the top-down pragmatic processes responsible for strong pragmatic effects "interfere with semantic composition and take place locally." This conflicts with semantic minimalism (advocated by Borg 2004 and Cappelen and Lepore 2005), which "maintains that what is said is independent of such processes, which take place only after the truth-conditional content of the utterance has been compositionally determined" (p. 15).

Given this claim, Recanati insists that TCP, as a theory of utterance interpretation, conflicts with Gricean accounts. He characterizes Gricean accounts as claiming that in order to figure out what a speaker means, when this is not identical to what the speaker says, the hearer must first figure out what is said. TCP, on the other hand, claims that "the top-down pragmatic processes responsible for modulation" do not presuppose "the prior identification of what is said" (pp 16-17).

TCP's third main claim is that the second claim does not conflict with compositionality, at least of a "weak" sort (p. 25). While granting that "in a compositional language, the meaning of a complex expression only depends upon the meaning of its immediate constituents and the way they are put together: nothing else counts," Recanati argues that this does not "rule out top down and lateral influences" allowed by TCP. Presumably the contents of complex expressions depend on the contents of simple expressions, "in a strictly bottom up fashion," but, Recanati will argue, "simple expressions [can] have their contents determined, in part, by the complex expressions in which they occur" (pp. 31-32).[8]That is, compositionality is not ruled out by what Recanati calls "semantic flexibility." Modulation may compromise the modularity of semantics, but it does not undermine the compositionality of utterance content.

Here's the basic idea. The meanings of individual expressions can be modulated and then combined, and these possibly modulated meanings "undergo semantic composition with the meanings of the other expressions in the sentence. . . . The composition rules determine the value of a complex expression on the basis of the pragmatically modulated values of the parts" (p. 128).[9] However, in order to figure out how individual expressions are to be modulated, the hearer may have to backtrack. In this way, as Recanati explains, modulation processes can be local despite being "top-down" (p. 16). That is, they operate on individual words or phrases even though they are prompted by contextual considerations rather than by lexical demands.

Applying Truth-Conditional Pragmatics

Chapter 2, "Adjectives: A Case Study," addresses apparent challenges that certain types of adjectives pose to compositionality. For example, fake money is not money, a toy soldier is not a soldier, and a plastic Jesus is not Jesus. The adjectives here appear not to be "intersective," in that the result of combining the adjective with the noun does not yield a subset of the extension of the noun (see Partee 1998, 2010). Although this suggests a breach of compositionality, Recanati argues that this impression is illusory. Once we realize that the senses of the modified nouns ("money," "soldier," and "Jesus") are modulated and do not have their normal extensions, we can see that the adjective ("fake," "toy," and "plastic") restricts this extension in a perfectly intersective, hence compositional, way.

Recanati addresses other questions about adjectives. Perhaps the most important one is whether uses of gradable adjectives, such as "tall," "old," and "smart," involve saturation (of a covert variable or hidden indexical) or modulation (of the sense of the adjective). Recanati argues against saturation accounts that introduce a free variable for a comparison class or standard of comparison in favor of a modulation approach.[10] Also, he briefly notes the puzzle of noun-noun compounds, illustrated by "pep pill," "headache pill," "vitamin pill," and "sugar pill," which involve different relations between the references of the second noun and the first. In these examples, the most natural relations are, respectively, causing, relieving, containing, and comprising. Recanati calls this shiftiness "constructional" as opposed to "lexical" context-sensitivity (p. 37n). Whether or not accounting for the variability of the relation requires positing a covert variable raises its own question of saturation vs. modulation.[11]

"Weather Reports" (Chapter 3) asks whether sentences like "It is raining," which are typically used to claim that it is raining in some particular location, contain a covert location variable. That would be the saturation approach. The alternative is free enrichment (a form of modulation), on which the location the speaker has in mind is merely an "unarticulated constituent" (Perry 1986) of the proposition he is trying to convey. Recanati defends the latter option, in part by rebutting the controversial "binding argument" for a covert variable.[12] He imagines a scenario involving a worldwide drought. We can imagine a weatherman, alerted by a distant rain detector, using "It is raining" to express a proposition truth-conditionally equivalent to (though distinct from) the proposition that it is raining somewhere. However, it is not so easy to contrive plausible analogous scenarios for other weather and other sorts of environmental reports, such as those made using sentences like these:

  • It is cloudy.
  • It is winter.
  • It is still.
  • It is dark.
  • It is midnight.
  • It is eerie.

With these it is much harder to get Recanati's weak, quasi-existential reading. However, this does not mean that sentences used to make environmental reports of these kinds carry an argument slot for a location. Maybe the sentences are just semantically incomplete and can be made complete only by inserting an explicit locative phrase.

"Embedded Implicatures" (Chapter 5) discusses a phenomenon long thought, thanks to L. J. Cohen (1971), to cast doubt on Grice's account of conversational implicature and, more generally, on the clarity of the distinction between semantics and pragmatics. It seems to illustrate what Recanati describes as pragmatics "interfering" with semantics. The worry is that what is implicated is determined prior to what is said, as in these examples:

7.     If Lucy has three drinks, she'll want to have more.

8.     It is better to get married and have a baby than to have a baby and get married.

9.     Martha wants George to have some of the cookies.

A speaker is likely to use 'three' in (7) to mean 'exactly three', 'and' in (8) to mean 'and then', and 'some' in (9) to mean 'some but not all'.[13] Moreover, the hearer has to figure that out before determining the full force of the utterance. As Recanati puts it, "the strengthening seems to occur locally . . . rather than globally" (p. 145). Embedded implicatures are so-called because they seem to "fall within the scope of operators" (p. 145). Recanati compares a number of approaches to this phenomenon, including some that treat it as semantic or something akin to semantic, but unsurprisingly opts for a pragmatic approach on which he construes the implicit material as calculated locally but not as literally embedded.[14] Implicatures can't literally be embedded if they are things speakers mean rather than a kind of linguistic content.

"Indexicality and Context-Shift" (Chapter 6) considers non-standard uses of indexicals, such as using "I" to refer to someone other than oneself or "now" to refer to some time other than the present. This can happen, for example, in a fictional or historical narrative or with a pre-programmed answering machine message ("I am not here now"). This phenomenon, which has been getting considerable attention lately (see Cohen, forthcoming, for the latest approach and for in-depth discussion of others), might seem to pose a problem for standard accounts of indexicals (e.g., Kaplan 1989), according to which the context of use is decisive. The speaker or writer can't change the context but, Recanati suggests, he can pretend that the context is different and implicitly include the listener or reader in that pretense. Not only can the pretend time and place be different from the actual location of the utterance, but also the pretend speaker need not be the actual one. As Recanati explains,

The objective features of the context of utterance are indeed 'given' and, to that extent, they cannot be shifted. But what the speaker can do is pretend that the context is different from what it is. . . . it will be part of what the speaker means that the sentence is uttered in a context different from the actual context (p. 193).

So context-shift is a pragmatic matter that "interferes with semantic composition," thus fitting nicely into the framework of TCP.

The same can be said, if Recanati is right, for certain quotational phenomena. "Open Quotation" and "Open Quotation Revisited" (Chapters 7 and 8) address the contributions that various sorts of quoted linguistic material make to the contents of sentences in which they occur.[15] Philosophers have generally limited their attention to "closed" quotation, where either linguistic expressions are referred to or speakers' utterances are directly and fully quoted. It is commonly thought that in these cases the entire quotation, but not the material within the quotes, is a constituent of the entire sentence (opinions differ on the nature of that constituent), and that the semantic contents of the quoted expressions are irrelevant to the semantics of the sentence in which the quotation occurs. Recanati, like Cappelen and Lepore (2007), is concerned with other sorts of quotation, notably "mixed" quotation, where an utterance is partly quoted directly but otherwise only paraphrased, and scare-quoting, in which attention is called to a particular expression for one reason or another. In these cases the meanings of the quoted expressions do play a semantic role along with that of the quotation marks themselves.

Recanati is intent on giving a unified account of the varieties of quotation -- we should not think of them as distinct, unrelated phenomena, and we should not suppose that quotation marks are multiply ambiguous. In his view, all cases of quotation involve displaying or demonstrating the quoted material, but only in the case of closed quotation is the material referred to, making no contribution to the semantics of the sentence. Otherwise, the speaker (or writer, to be more accurate) is merely calling attention to the quoted material, which in these cases does contribute to the semantics of the sentence. It is a pragmatic matter just what is being done with that material. Each involves some sort of context-shift or free enrichment, and is thus amenable to the approach offered by TCP.

Assessing Truth-Conditional Pragmatics

TCP is a way of reckoning with the fact that we as hearers generally manage to understand what others mean even when it extends beyond the semantic contents of the sentences they utter, and even if they are not being indirect and implicating something completely separate from what they say. TCP, at least as Recanati has developed it so far, does not deal with the speaker's side of this transaction. Addressing that would require explaining how we as speakers are so adept at coming up with sentences the utterance of which makes evident to our listeners what we mean. It is partly a claim about the semantics of sentences we utter -- that their semantic contents generally fall short of what we mean even when we are being direct, even if not fully explicit and literal. However, TCP mainly concerns the psychological process whereby hearers figure out what speakers mean whenever, as is very common, that is distinct from but closely related to the uttered sentence's semantic content (the proposition or propositional radical the sentence semantically expresses).

Perhaps the most interesting feature of TCP is its claim that even though what the speaker means is closely related to that content, the hearer need not (and generally does not) have to represent that content. Rather, the hearer normally figures out what the speaker means in the course of, in parallel with, hearing the sentence, rather than only after hearing it (of course, at times one may have to backtrack after hearing it). In that case, obviously the hearer does not have to figure out the semantic content of the sentence. Although Recanati does not put it this way, in effect he is claiming that we as hearers do not presume that the speaker is being literally and fully explicit.[16] If we as hearers do not presume (defeasibly, of course) that what speakers mean accords with the semantic contents of the sentences they utter, then of course we won't wait until we've processed the entire sentence before starting to figure out what the speaker means in uttering it.

But who said we did? Grice did not. He never claimed that the hearer's inference proceeds from first identifying what the speaker says to then considering whether there is any ostensible breach of the maxims and, if so and assuming the speaker is being cooperative and is aiming to communicate something, to seek a plausible candidate for what that could be. Many people share the impression that Grice did hold some such view, but as Jennifer Saul (2002) has convincingly argued, Grice never intended his theory of conversation as a psychological model of, or as a hypothesis about the sequence of events involved in, the process of interpreting an utterance.[17] And yet Recanati describes TCP as a major departure from a Gricean account. To be sure, Grice limited what Recanati describes as the contribution of context to sentence content to disambiguation and reference-fixing, but he certainly did not suppose that hearers wait until they hear the whole sentence before considering how to take the operative meaning or intended reference of particular expressions.

Recanati often pits TCP, according to which pragmatic processes "interfere with the process of semantic composition that outputs the truth-conditions," against the traditional view, whether put in Gricean or minimalist terms, that "pragmatics takes as input the output of semantics" (pp. 1-2). But pragmatics here is the psychological process of figuring out what the speaker means. As such, this process takes as input the speaker's production of a sequence of words, presumably constituting a sentence whose constituents fit together in certain determinate and determinable ways. The hearer has to figure out, among other things, how the speaker is using any ambiguous words or phrases, as well as any references the speaker is making, and he doesn't have to wait until the utterance of the sentence is complete. But the "process of semantic composition," which pragmatics is supposed to interfere with, is not a psychological process. It is part of grammar.

Recanati's distinction between "bottom-up" and "top-down" processes figures in here. According to the traditional view of semantics as he understands it, there are no top-down processes involved in semantic interpretation; these processes occur only after the process of semantic interpretation is completed. However, to attribute this claim (or presupposition) to the traditional view of semantics is to identify the psychological process of ascertaining the semantic content of a sentence with the semantic deliverances of a grammar. The fact, which we can gladly grant, that hearers do not have to engage in this process does not show that sentence grammar does not generate semantic interpretations. Traditional views of semantics do not presuppose that hearers must do this in order to understand utterances. In saying this, however, I am not challenging the psychological claims that Recanati makes on behalf of TCP. They are quite plausible, though of course they need to be substantiated empirically.

A second area of concern is with TCP's focus on the "intuitive truth-conditional contents" of utterances. If the speaker's goal is to "understand what the speaker means by his or her utterance" (p. 1), what happens if two people being addressed by a speaker interpret an utterance in different but equally plausible ways? Does the utterance then have two intuitive truth-conditional contents, one for each person? What if the speaker intended the utterance to be taken in some third way? If there is such a thing as the truth-conditional content of the utterance, surely that is it. It is just not the one that is intuitively plausible to either of the people being addressed. So TCP is an account of intuitive content, not actual content, delivered by an account of the psychological process of utterance interpretation.

After all, hearers do not determine the contents of utterances in the sense of making it the case that utterances have the contents that they do. They merely determine, in the sense ofascertaining, that utterances have certain contents (and they do not always get these contents right). But the process of ascertaining utterance contents is what TCP addresses. By the same token, context does not make it the case that utterances have the contents that they do. It provides information for the hearer to consider in the course of trying to ascertain the content, but it does not endow the utterance with that content.[18] Yet Recanati frequently describes modulation as context-dependent, as when he says that

in the course of deriving the semantic value of a complex expression, one optionally modulates the semantic values of the parts, and it is the context which determines which pragmatic function, if any, comes into play and yields the modulated value that undergoes semantic composition (p. 128).

I would say that it is on the basis of contextual information that the hearer determines, in the sense of ascertaining, such functions.

This last point ties in with my third and final worry about TCP. It concerns the strength of TCP's compositionality claim and the informativeness of its appeal to "pragmatic functions." If the context determines the functions that operate on the parts, as in the previous quote, and "the composition rules [that] determine the value of a complex expression on the basis of the pragmatically modulated values of the parts" (p. 128), how is this modulation constrained? Recanati's compositional formula for pragmatic modulation (see note 9) schematizes pragmatic functions on the parts of a complex expression, but his gloss on this formula does not suggest anything in the way of a procedure for determining what these functions are in any particular case. All we are told is that its interpretation depends somehow on the modulated interpretations of its component expressions, that is, on some transformation of each of the literal interpretations of the component expressions. It is not clear how that could not be the case, in some way or another.

Moreover, it is not clear when the sense of an expression is modulated rather than merely supplemented. Here's an example of what I mean. In connection with so-called embedded implicatures we noted the difference between, for example, a speaker meaning "exactly three" in using "three" and the word "three" meaning "exactly three" as the speaker is using it. The former does not imply the latter. Similarly, if a speaker uses "It is raining" to convey that it is raining on the plain in Spain, the sentence "It is raining" does not mean "It is raining on the plain in Spain" as the speaker is using it. The property of being on the plain in Spain does not correspond to anything in the sentence "It is raining," even as the speaker is using it. It is an unarticulated constituent of the content of the utterance. Now Recanati suggests that

Just as the senses of constituent expressions in the sentence may be modulated, the sense of the complete sentence itself may be modulated. In particular, it is possible to 'freely enrich' not only the sense of a constituent, but also the sense of the global sentence: such free enrichment at the topmost level would correspond to the provision of unarticulated constituents (p. 22).

However, it is hard to see how conceding this isn't tantamount to giving up even a weak form of compositionality, as the example of "It is raining" illustrates. Redescribing the provision of unarticulated constituents as a kind of modulation does not strengthen the case for compositionality.

So these are my general concerns with the status of truth-conditional pragmatics. They do not affect its plausibility as a view about the psychological process of interpreting utterances, but they do bear on its status as a competitor to theories that regard semantics as autonomous. Thanks to Recanati's openness to diverse approaches, his fairness in critically examining competing views, his carefully nuanced argumentation, and his general thoroughness, to my mind the main rewards offered by the book Truth-Conditional Pragmatics can be derived by delving into its details. That's what I recommend doing.

References

Bach, Kent (1994), "Conversational Impliciture," Mind and Language 9: 124-162.

Bach, Kent (2005), "Context ex Machina," in Z. Szabó (ed.), Semantics vs. Pragmatics, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 15-44.

Bach, Kent and Robert M. Harnish (1979), Linguistic Communication and Speech Acts, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Bezuidenhout, Anne (2002), "Truth-Conditional Pragmatics," Philosophical Perspectives 16: 105-134.

Borg, Emma (2004), Minimal Semantics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Cappelen, Herman, and Ernie Lepore (2005), Insensitive Semantics, Oxford: Blackwell.

Cappelen, Herman and Ernie Lepore (2007), Language Turned Upon Itself, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Carston, Robyn (2002), Thoughts and Utterances: The Pragmatics of Explicit Communication, Oxford: Blackwell.

Carston, Robyn (2009), "The Explicit/Implicit Distinction in Pragmatics and the Limits of Explicit Communication," International Review of Pragmatics 1: 35-62.

Cherchia, Gennaro, Danny Fox, and Benjamin Spector (forthcoming), "The Grammatical View of Scalar Implicatures and the Relationship between Semantics and Pragmatics," in P. Portner, C. Maienborn, and K. von Heusinger (eds.), Handbook of Semantics, Berlin: Mouton-De Gruyter.

Cohen, Jonathan (forthcoming), "Indexicality and the Puzzle of the Answering Machine," Journal of Philosophy.

Cohen, L. Jonathan (1971), "Some Remarks on Grice's Views about the Logical Particles of Natural Language," in Y. Bar-Hillel (ed.), Pragmatics of Natural Language, Dordrecht: Reidel, pp. 50-68.

Geurts, Bart (2010), Quantity Implicatures, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Grice, Paul (1989), Studies in the Way of Words, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Kaplan, David (1989), "Demonstratives," in J. Almog, J. Perry, and H. Wettstein (eds.), Themes From Kaplan, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 481-563.

Katz, Jerrold J., and David Pitt (2000), "Compositional Idioms," Language 76: 409-432.

Kennedy, Christopher (2007), "Vagueness and Grammar: The Semantics of Relative and Absolute Gradable Adjectives," Linguistics and Philosophy 30: 1-45.

King, Jeffrey, and Jason Stanley (2005), "Semantics, Pragmatics, and the Role of Semantic Content," in Z. Szabo (ed.), Semantics versus Pragmatics, Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 111-164.

Levinson, Stephen (2000), Presumptive Meanings: The Theory of Generalized Conversational Implicature, Cambridge, Mass: MIT Press.

Partee, Barbara H. (1989), "Binding Implicit Variables in Quantified Contexts", Proceedings of the Chicago Linguistics Society 25: 342-365.

Partee, Barbara H. (1998) "Lexical Semantics and Compositionality," in D. Osherson and H. Lasnik (eds.), An Invitation to Cognitive Science, vol. 1, 2nd ed., Cambridge, MA: MIT Press/Bradford Books, pp. 311-360.

Partee, Barbara H. (2010) "Privative Adjectives: Subsective Plus Coercion," in R. Bäuerle, U. Reyle and T. E. Zimmermann (eds.), Presupposition and Discourse, Bingley, UK: Emerald Group Publishing, pp. 273-285.

Perry, John (1986), "Thought without Representation," Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, supp. vol. 60: 137-151.

Recanati, François (1989), "The Pragmatics of What is Said," Mind and Language 4: 295-329.

Recanati, François (2000), Oratio Obliqua, Oratio Recta: An Essay on Metarepresentation, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press/Bradford Books.

Recanati, François (2004), Literal Meaning, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Saul, Jennifer (2002), "What is Said and Psychological Reality: Grice's Project and Relevance Theorists' Criticisms," Linguistics and Philosophy 25: 347-372.

Schaffer, Jonathan (2011), "Perspective in Taste Predicates and Epistemic Modals," in A. Egan and B. Weatherson (eds.), Epistemic Modality, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 179-226.

Soames, Scott (2009), "The Gap between Meaning and Assertion," in Philosophical Essays, Volume 1, Natural Language: What It Means and How We Use It, Princeton: Princeton University Press, pp. 278-297.

Sperber, Dan, and Deirdre Wilson (1986), Relevance: Communication and Cognition, Oxford: Blackwell.

Stanley, Jason (2000), "Context and Logical Form", Linguistics and Philosophy 23: 391-434.

Szabó, Zoltan (2001), "Adjectives in Context," in R.M. Harnish and I. Kenesei (eds.), Perspectives on Semantics, Pragmatics, and Discourse, Amsterdam: Benjamins, pp. 119-146.

Weiskopf, Daniel (2007), "Compound Nominals, Context, and Compositionality," Synthese 156: 161-204.



[1] So-called relevance theorists call these in-between contents "explicatures" (Sperber and Wilson 1986, Carston 2002), and I call them "implicitures" (Bach 1994). Note than when relevance theorists speak of the explicature or the "explicit content" of an utterance, what they really mean is the direct content, even if partly implicit and not entirely literal, as opposed to any additional content that might be implicated and indirectly inferred. This take is the only way to make coherent sense of, for example, the title and contents of Carston's (2009) excellent paper, "The Explicit/Implicit Distinction in Pragmatics and the Limits of Explicit Communication." For elucidation of the difference between being direct and being literal, see Chapter 4 of Bach and Harnish 1979.

[2] Recanati (1989) has long called propositions that are semantically expressed by sentences like (1) and (2) but are not likely candidates for the (enriched) thing the speaker means "minimal" propositions. I have long called what sentences like (3) and (4) express "propositional radicals" (Bach 1994). Cappelen and Lepore (2005) use the phrase "minimal proposition" to cover both, but only because they think that all (declarative) sentences that might not seem to semantically express propositions actually do. Borg (2004) shares that view but only because she maintains something that Cappelen and Lepore deny, namely that sentences that seem semantically incomplete actually include existential quantification over the ostensibly missing slot.

[3] Like relevance theorists, Recanati denies that implicatures bear on the intuitive truth-conditional content of an utterance or, as they often call it, the "proposition expressed," even though implicatures are, of course, perfectly capable of being true or false in their own right.

[4] Matters can be confused by the fact that the phrase "truth-conditional pragmatics" has been used, for example by Bezuidenhout (2002), as another label for radical contextualism. The latter not only denies that most sentences have truth-conditional contents, it also questions whether even their constituents generally have determinate contents. To the extent that words have conventional meanings, these are too impoverished, too schematic, to comprise possible uses. So, according to radical contextualism, any use of virtually any term requires some sort of enrichment. TCP does not go that far.

[5] The idea of semantic incompleteness is straightforward if you think in terms of structured propositions rather than truth conditions, as built up out of objects, properties, and relations (see Kaplan 1989). Since these are made up of building blocks assembled in a particular way, it makes sense to suppose that in some cases such an assemblage, put together compositionally from a sentence's constituents according to its syntactic structure, might fail to constitute a proposition (see Bach 1994 and Soames 2009). That is because, although this constitutes the entire semantic content of the sentence, it lacks at least one constituent needed for it to be true or false and to constitute the complete content of a thought or a statement.

[6] To be sure, some sentences that appear to be semantically incomplete arguably contain hidden indexicals or covert variables, whose references or values are somehow provided in context, in which case these sentences would not be semantically incomplete after all. This is a matter we'll touch on later.

[7] Putting the point in terms of King and Stanley's (2005) distinction between "weak" and "strong" pragmatic effects, Recanati rejects their contention that there are only "weak" pragmatic effects on intuitive truth-conditional content and that strong pragmatic effects come into play only at the level of implicatures.

[8] This excludes some idioms but only some (see Katz and Pitt 2000).

[9] This is represented by this formula:

I(α^β) = f(g1(I(α)), g2(I(β)))

Here 'I' stands for the interpretation function and 'α^β' for a complex expression formed from the parts 'α' and 'β'. The 'g's are free higher-order variables ranging over available pragmatic functions (when an expression is used literally, this is the identity function). As Recanati explains, "The formula says that the semantic value of a complex phrase α^β is a function of the pragmatic values of the parts, where the 'pragmatic values' in question are what we get when we subject the literal semantic values of the parts to pragmatic modulation" (p. 128).

[10] For excellent discussions of adjectives, see Szabó 2001 and Kennedy 2007.

[11] Although Recanati does not pursue the topic of constructional context-sensitivity, as exemplified by noun-noun compounds, he seems to endorse Daniel Weiskopf's (2007) approach (p. 37n). Weiskopf argues that context determines the relevant relation between the members of a compound nominal. However, he does not really explain how it manages to accomplish this feat.

[12] The binding argument was due originally to Partee (1989) and revived by Stanley (2000). Schaffer (2011) gives other arguments for covert variables, specifically in simple sentences containing epistemic modals or taste predicates.

[13] As Recanati mentions (p. 146), I view examples like these as implicitures rather than implicatures (Bach 1994). I would be careful to clarify confusing phrases like "using 'three' in (7) to mean 'exactly three'." The speaker means "exactly three" in using 'three,' but this does not imply that the word 'three' means "exactly three" as the speaker is using it.

[14] As Recanati notes at the end of this chapter, which was published as a paper in 2003, much has since been published on so-called embedded implicatures, some authors offering "localist" (or even syntactic) accounts -- most notably Chierchia, Fox, and Spector (forthcoming) -- and some taking neo-Gricean or "globalist" approaches, including Geurts (2010). Geurts critically examines much (and cites much else) of this recent work in his Chapter 7 and defends a neo-Gricean approach in Chapter 8.

[15] Recanati's 2000 book offers a much more extensive treatment of the varieties of quotation and related matters, but the last chapter of the present book affords him a chance to respond to his critics.

[16] This might seem to conflict with what Bach and Harnish called the "Presumption of Literalness" (1979: 12), but we did not claim that operating on this presumption keeps a hearer from considering how a speaker is using a given sentence constituent before he finishes processing the entire sentence.

[17] A good example of this misunderstanding of Grice is Levinson's argument for pragmatic intrusion, or what he calls "Grice's circle" (2000, p. 186). His argument that semantic determinations depend on pragmatic determinations (as well as the other way round) relies on conflating the two senses of "determine" distinguished below.

[18] I expand on this and related points in "Context ex Machina" (Bach 2005).