W. Jay Wood


W. Jay Wood, God, Acumen, 2011, 250pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773538405.

Reviewed by Keith Yandell, University of Wisconsin-Madison

As the title leads one to expect, in writing God, Jay Wood aimed at presenting a wide range of topics in the philosophy of religion. He succeeds admirably. The presentation is clear and accessible, the quotations apt and helpful, and the discussion covers a wide range of topics in a fair, articulate manner. God covers the traditional 'proofs' of God's existence, cumulative case arguments, religious experience, whether reasonable theistic belief requires evidence, the problem of evil, and the nature that theists ascribe to God. There is a healthy recognition that 'proofs', in the sense of valid arguments from true premises that are accepted by almost all competent assessors, are rare in philosophy (and generally) and the (not unrelated) fact that "cerebral, dispassionate reasons" are not the only things relevant to what beliefs one accepts.

There is a nice review of traditional and contemporary perspectives. Wood begins with the most intuitive of the 'proofs', the argument from design. Nature, orderly itself, provides hosts of examples of order on a smaller scale, and order suggests design. Considerations favoring each side of the designer/undirected process dispute are covered. The contemporary irreducible complexity thesis and the argument from reason are discussed, with the complex fine-tuning argument (the most complex of the three) receiving especially nice treatment. Briefer treatment of the cosmological argument focuses on the claims that there cannot be an actual infinity and that if there are existentially dependent things then something must exist independently. The ontological argument in Anselm's version, the objections from Gaunilo and Kant, and the modal form of the argument from Plantinga receive clear discussion. Moral arguments for theism are analyzed in connection with the objectivity of morality, evolutionary ethics, and the question of whether morality fits well in a purely naturalistic universe.

A chapter on religious experience recognizes its considerable varieties, considers whether at least some religious experiences are properly viewed as perceptual, whether such experiences can somehow be checked for accuracy, and whether there are non-religious explanations of their occurrence that undercut any evidential value that the experiences might have (not every such explanation is evidence-cancelling). There is also the question of whether various religious experiences, differing from one another in virtue of suggesting quite different perspectives on what the world is like so that it is hard to see how they can all be reliable, simply cancel one another out so far as evidence goes. The chapter ends with an interesting discussion of the logic of 'cumulative case' arguments.

Next, the issue is whether a belief can be reasonable if it lacks evidential support. Here the topics are limited to Pascal's pragmatic argument and Plantinga's Reformed Epistemology in which knowledge is viewed as true belief that is properly caused and undefeated. The contrasting view holds that possession of evidence in favor of a belief is necessary for a person to know what is believed. Plantinga's view does not neglect evidence; it comes at the end of the story when one asks whether one's belief has 'defeaters', whereas evidentialism puts evidence first. Evidentialism and a general discussion of natural theology receive attention in the Introduction.

A chapter on the problem of evil tracks the logical problem of evil (is a theist inconsistent in believing that both God and evil exist?) and the evidential problem of evil (is the existence of evil evidence against God's existence?). The problem of horrendous evil (evils whose occurrence in someone's life raises the question as to whether her life could rationally be viewed as worth having) and the hiddenness of God (the fact that God is not universally believed in on the basis of plain evidence open to all) receive attention. The final chapter deals with the classical concept of God (developed with some core concepts of Greek philosophy), the paradox of the stone (can God create a stone so heavy God cannot lift it?), whether God can be free, whether divine omniscience is compatible with human libertarian freedom, and whether God is timeless or everlasting. There is a discussion of middle knowledge (God's knowledge of how uncreated persons would act as free agents) and of 'hard versus soft' facts.

Some details of two topics, the ontological argument and the problem of evil, provide an opportunity to concretely illustrate the level of the book. Wood approaches both topics through the notion of 'broad logical necessity'.  

Using the logic of Russell and Whitehead's Principia Mathematica, the proposition 'God exists' comes out as "There is an x such that Gx', and its denial is 'There is no x such that Gx'. The latter is not formally contradictory, and so the former is not a logically necessary truth. Hence the ontological argument, which endeavors to show that it is logically impossible that God not exist, cannot even be stated in this symbolic framework. This became a standard, and supposedly decisive, criticism.

Things improved with the rediscovery of modal logic, the logic of possibility, contingency, and necessity. This involves 'broad logical necessity', the sort of necessity possessed by 'If P is a necessary truth, then it is necessarily true that necessarily P is true' -- more generally, 'Every proposition has its modality with necessity'. The favored way of stating the ontological argument these days uses the notion of a possible world. Where propositions are bearers of truth value and typically expressed by assertions, a possible world is a maximal proposition. P is a maximal proposition if and only if, for any proposition Q, either P entails Q or P entails not-Q. Alternatively, a possible world is a maximal state of affairs, where A is a maximal state of affairs if and only if, for every state of affairs B, A either includes, or else excludes, B. To claim that God exists necessarily is then to say that 'God exists' is true 'in' every possible world -- that God exists obtains no matter to which possible world the actual world corresponds. The argument can be put simply: 'God exists in every possible world', being about all possible worlds, has this feature: if 'God exists' is true, it is necessarily true and if it is false, it is necessarily false. There is no apparent contradiction in the claim, so it is proper to take it not to be a necessary falsehood, which makes it proper to accept it as a necessary truth.

The problem is that there is also no apparent contradiction in 'God exists in some possible worlds, but not in all'. It too is about all possible worlds, contains no apparent contradiction, hence is properly taken not to be a necessary falsehood, and so is properly taken as a necessary truth. Even after the ontological argument is carefully stated, we have no good reason to accept its conclusion rather than 'God exists in some possible worlds, but not in all'. Perhaps it is not unreasonable to accept the claim 'God exists in all possible worlds', but only given that it is also not unreasonable to accept 'God exists in some possible worlds, but not in all'.

Wood’s story can be supplemented as follows: modally speaking, there are four epistemic possibilities regarding theism and atheism. Where "N" expresses broad logical necessity, and "C" contingency, we have: 1. N (God exists); 2. N not (God exists); 3. C (God exists); 4. C not (God exists) -- necessitarian theism, necessitarian atheism, non-necessitarian theism, and non-necessitarian atheism. They are related as follows: if 1 is true, then each of the others is necessarily false; if 2 is true, then each of the others is necessarily false; if 3 is true, then 1 and 2 are necessarily false and 4 is contingent and false; if 4 is true, then 1 and 2 are necessarily false and 3 is contingent and false. The ontological argument does not show that 3 is necessarily false and so fails.

Another topic that Wood handles nicely is the problem of evil, stated in possible worlds terms as follows. God can create any possible world. It is logically possible that a world contain libertarianly free agents who always do what is right for the right reason. Creating this world, if God creates at all, would be the proper thing for an omnipotent loving God to do. But our world is not like that, and if theism is true, God created it. So God did not create our world. Thus God the Creator does not exist.

One reply to the objection is that it is also logically possible that in no world that God could create would there be free agents who always did the right thing for the right reason. The reason for this is the nature of free agency -- what a free agent does once created is up to her. Were she created unable to act wrongly, she would not be free. What God can do here is constrained by what choices agents, if created, would make. Suppose every libertarianly free instantiation of a possible person in any world W in which it dwelled would fail to always act rightly for the right reason in W. Then God could not create a world that contained only morally perfect free agents. Thus perhaps not every logically possible world can be created by God after all. So far as we know, this is true. If we refer to the only sample class of which we have knowledge -- namely, us -- we receive no encouragement for thinking otherwise. So the Free Will Defense can successfully appeal to the claim that it is not a necessary truth that, if world W is logically possible, then God can create W.

Once again, Wood’s story can be supplemented. Consider a possible person P and a possible instantiation P* of P. Suppose that, for any world W, if W's instantiation includes P*, P* will act wrongly. Then P* has transworld depravity. What makes P* an instantiation of P is that P* has every property that its being an instantiation of P entails that it has. If P* has transworld depravity, so does the essence of P. Then it is hard to see how it is possible that P* freely acts wrongly. Perhaps P* can choose when and how she goes wrong; perhaps not. But that she goes wrong is not something she can escape. After all, a property Q is part of the essence of P if and only if every instantiation of P has Q. The response will be that there is a possible world in which P's instantiation freely impeccably walks the moral line. But, due to P*'s transworld depravity, God can't create that world. P*s essence does not include every property that P* has in every world that God can create. It includes every property that P* has in every logically possible world, whether God can create it or not. Further, why suppose that to create a transworldly depraved person is not morally justified or does not bring about the existence of something of great worth? So the Defense still stands.

God does not include either of the supplemental stories (each of which of course can itself be supplemented). This is not a defect. The point is to illustrate the level of this introductory book. It is also to note that, having grasped its content, one will be in a position to understand the sort of supplemental stories offered above. This book is highly recommended.