2011.09.24

Yuri Balashov

Persistence and Spacetime

Yuri Balashov, Persistence and Spacetime, Oxford University Press, 2010, 233pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199579921.

 

Reviewed by Antony Eagle, Exeter College, University of Oxford


No philosophical discussion of the philosophy of time would be recognised as satisfactory without some discussion of relativity theory. Until recently, the same could not be said of discussions about persistence of objects over time, where acknowledgement of the potential complications introduced by relativistic physics was frequently absent and apparently unmissed. But philosophers have started to look more closely at the special issues around framing and defending theses about persistence in relativistic settings (see for example Cody Gilmore, and Ian Gibson and Oliver Pooley[1]). Yuri Balashov was one of the earliest and most consistent contributors to this growing literature. He has now brought together much of his previous work on relativistic persistence, significantly expanded and modulated in response to criticisms, in this welcome book.

The interest to connoisseurs will lie in Balashov's positive views, developed mostly in chapters 5-8, and it is these I'll mostly discuss below. But perhaps the most valuable part of the book for the general philosophical community lies in the clear and fair-minded framework for discussing persistence and relativity that Balashov introduces in the first part of the book, including a gentle self-contained introduction to relativity in chapter 3. He introduces spacetime formulations of all major doctrines on persistence, endurance, perdurance, and exdurance (stage theory) in 'generic' versions (chapter 2), as well as versions tailored for classical (chapter 4) and relativistic spacetimes (chapter 5). The way that Balashov sets up the competing theses and frames the debate is a very helpful addition to the literature and will provide a useful starting point for further work in this area.

A couple of things are worth noting about Balashov's treatment of these issues. He takes the dispute over persistence to be at root twin disputes over location -- which regions of spacetime are the proper places in which objects can be found. Balashov follows Gilmore and Hudson, among others, in taking the relation of 'exact location' as a primitive.[2] The exact location of an object is informally glossed by Balashov as 'a region into which the object exactly fits and which has exactly the same size, shape, and dimensionality as the object itself' (p. 16), though this is not offered as a definition.

One might wonder a little at taking this relation as a primitive that also has -- as a matter of conceptual necessity? -- the features Balashov ascribes to it. For example, if location is a fundamental relation, then it may be argued that it should be subject to recombination, in which cases there won't be any brute necessities linking the shapes or sizes of objects to the shapes or sizes of their locations; Saucedo makes an argument of this sort.[3] And if it's not fundamental, then exact location is rather more constrained than some of its defenders -- e.g., Parsons -- have taken it to be.[4]

For Balashov, in fact, a more general locational relation is essential for making the distinctions he wishes to draw. He introduces the notion of quasi-location (p. 27), where o is exactly q-located at R iff 'one of o's (non-modal) counterparts is (exactly) located at R'. (Balashov assumes that an object is its own non-modal counterpart.) This notion is needed because, of course, perdurance and exdurance agree on which objects exist and where they are located, so no purely ontological/locational definition will be able to discriminate those two theses. The notion of q-location will allow Balashov to present endurance, perdurance and exdurance as rivals because they disagree over the locations and q-locations of various objects; but this project of unifying the grounds of disagreement obscures the ontological agreement between perdurance and exdurance. This has consequences in chapter 7, when Balashov argues that perdurance and exdurance disagree over existence because of the differing patterns of q-location each posits, a claim that is improbable on its face given their shared ontology. (I'll return to this argument below.)

To distinguish perduance from endurance, we need some spacetime analogue of the notion of temporal part. To formulate it, Balashov interestingly takes a three-place parthood relation as primitive, 'p is part of o at achronal region R' (§2.4.4).[5] This is interesting, because in relativising parthood to regions, Balashov seems immediately to yield any supposed advantage that perdurantists have over endurantists in accounting for intrinsic change without relativising or indexing. Balashov is himself sceptical about whether this advantage is genuine (§2.3), but as it is by no means clear that perdurantist ontology cannot be completely developed in an austere framework with only a two-place parthood relation, his decision to relativise parthood may be seen as unnecessarily concessive by perdurantists.[6]

The path of an object is the fusion of all of its q-locations. An achronal part of a path -- a slice -- is said to be eligible for an object if the object at that slice is q-located at that slice.[7] Making use of these notions, Balashov distinguishes endurance, perdurance, and exdurance (p. 33):

  • perduring objects are singly q-located at their path and have diachronic parts located at every eligible slice of their path;
  • enduring objects are multiply located at every eligible slice of their path and only q-located at such slices;
  • exduring objects are singly located at an eligible slice of their path but multiply q-located at every eligible slice of their path.

These definitions are, Balashov concedes, 'not watertight' (p. 34). But I worry that his dismissal of the counterexamples as 'exotic cases' that are 'too remote to bear on the agenda of this book' (p. 35) is overly casual, since there seems to be a real danger that these definitions mischaracterise the views they're intended to capture. I'm particularly worried by the definition of endurance, because it seems to exclude certain cases that some endurantists have wanted to endorse. Consider for example van Inwagen's discussion of endurantism, where he makes this 'plausible supposition':

if something occupies the union of a class of regions of spacetime, and if each member of that class is occupied by something, then the thing that occupies the union must be the mereological sum of the things that individually occupy the members of the class.[8]

Van Inwagen thus agrees that, when Descartes occupies a set of slices of a given region R, each slice 'is occupied by, and only by, Descartes. From this and our "plausible supposition" it follows that it is Descartes that occupies R'. If we may gloss van Inwagen's 'occupies' by our 'is exactly located at', which seems natural, then he is claiming that Descartes is exactly located at his path as well as at each eligible slice. For the path is entirely filled by Descartes, and no part of Descartes is located outside of the path; it seems entirely defensible to think on that basis that Descartes is located at the path as well as at the eligible slices. The potential objection, that Descartes doesn't have the same temporal size at each of his locations, and so they cannot all be his locations, misfires: Descartes 'didn't have a temporal extent at all; the concept of a temporal extent does not apply to Descartes or to any other object that persists or endures or exhibits identity across time'.[9]

Van Inwagen's conception of endurantism here is, as far as I can tell, a common one. It takes enduring objects to be like spatially extended simples -- objects which are exactly located at an extended region, but which lack parts.[10] I don't wish necessarily to endorse this conception of endurance, or the parallel between enduring objects and extended simples. I do think that Balashov, in defining endurance in such a way as to explicitly preclude an enduring object from being located at its path, is mischaracterising what some endurantists intend to affirm.

*******

With the generic notions of persistence defined with respect to achronal regions, it is straightforward for Balashov to define the relevant notions in relativistic spacetimes (§5.1). Two issues present themselves, however, both concerning which regions of an object's path are eligible:

1.     Are any non-flat achronal slices of an object's path eligible?

2.     Are all flat slices of an object's path eligible?

Balashov answers 'no' to both questions. I will discuss first at some length his answer to the first question in §5.2, turning briefly later to his answer to the second question in §§5.5-5.6.

In §5.2 Balashov argues that only flat regions -- those that represent hypersurfaces of simultaneity in some frame -- are eligible to be (q-)locations of objects. As Gibson and Pooley have noted, this is a controversial assumption in the context of relativistic physics: flat hypersurfaces are well-adapted to inertial frames, and these frames provide a tractable approach to describing the content of Minkowski spacetime, but that spacetime and its contents exist in a frame-independent manner, making flat surfaces geometrically useful but physically insignificant.[11] Balashov responds by appealing to a general methodological principle he calls MOOR: Minimizing Overall Ontological Revision (p. 100). Balashov uses MOOR to defend a key role for flat hypersurfaces by arguing that flat surfaces 'are indispensible to extending the important notions of moment of time and momentary location of an object or its part (in a given reference frame) to the special relativistic framework' (p. 101).

This involves an appeal to MOOR because, Balashov thinks, the ordinary ontology of momentary locations is able to be retained, and since this can be done in special relativity, we have no good reason for not doing so -- for Balashov, one assumes, to abandon flat surfaces would be gratuitous ontological revision.

It's not at all clear that this application of MOOR is appropriate. For flat hypersurfaces are extremely unlike moments of time: every event occurs on many distinct flat hypersurfaces which intersect. So there is reason to think that, while we've kept something which we could call a (frame dependent) 'moment of time', we haven't kept anything that behaves in the way moments of time do. It seems more of a revision to ordinary ontology to claim that such radically different entities nevertheless can play the familiar role.[12]

It is also debatable whether flat surfaces really are more like classical moments of time than other achronal surfaces. Balashov's example of Unicolor (p. 95) relies on the idea that an object can have an essential property -- in this case, of being essentially uniformly coloured -- and that can determine which regions are eligible locations for it. But we can use this kind of example to motivate the eligibility of non-flat regions too. Suppose we have an object, Condenser, that smoothly changes its density over time. Density may, for the purposes of this example, be treated as a natural distributional property.[13] The crucial point is that such distributional properties can be instantiated at non-flat regions just as well as at flat regions -- nothing in the geometry of flat regions tells us anything about whether or not non-geometrical but natural properties can be instantiated at them. We can then imagine a carving up of Condenser's path into a set of non-flat regions, such that in each region Condenser has constant density and such that collectively those regions trace out a history of increasing density. The naturalness of density means that it is a property suitable for determining the eligibility of regions to be locations of the object; just as in the case of Unicolor, other ways of carving up the path of Condenser will divide it into regions which instantiate distributional properties which are less natural and more gerrymandered than constant density. And just as the gerrymandered non-uniform colour of Unicolor at various cross-cutting regions marked those regions as ineligible, so in the case of Condenser the gerrymandered non-uniformed density at the various flat regions in its path marks those flat regions as ineligible to be locations of Condenser and marks only the curved regions we began with as genuinely eligible locations.

Balashov's restriction of eligibility to flat surfaces prevents us from saying intuitive and ordinary things about the locations of Condenser; this doesn't seem at all like the minimal ontological revision in this case. If we are able to appeal to the pattern of change of properties of objects like Condenser to determine the eligible regions, then we should be able to do so however that change maps on to achronal regions of spacetime, flat or otherwise. That seems to me to be the minimal ontological revision because it encourages us to focus on those regions of relativistic spacetime that are functionally like classical moments of time, that provide appropriate indices for tracing change over time. Balashov's alternative asks us to focus on those regions which are geometrically like classical moments of time, but such regions are only incidentally connected with the interesting features concerning momentary location that Balashov himself wishes to focus on.

Turning briefly to Balashov's answer to the second question above, concerning whether all flat slices are eligible: his claim, drawing on some arguments from Gilmore,[14] is that not every slice through an object is eligible (some 'corner slices' are too small for an object to fit into them), but that at least some crisscrossing slices are eligible, at least when their contents are appropriately causally related to one another (in line with a necessary condition for eligibility he calls MURIC**, p. 123). This discussion is worryingly incomplete. For the necessary condition MURIC** is formulated for only enduring and exduring objects. We are given no conditions at all on what makes a slice eligible for a diachronic part of a perduring object. Perhaps it is some analogue of MURIC** involving causal relations between distinct parts, but Balashov does not tell us. He acknowledges that there 'is an issue in the neighbourhood' (p. 111), but there is no discussion of this issue before Balashov concludes that 'no special arguments' are needed 'to defend the possibility of perdurance in the special relativistic setting' (p. 129). On the contrary: since the definition of perdurance of o requires that anything located at an eligible slice of o's path be part of o, we crucially need conditions on which slices are eligible to yield reasonable conditions on whether an object really does perdure. The account Balashov offers is incomplete in this respect. The most natural way for perdurantists to complete it is something like the principle that any slice through an object's path is eligible. Balashov undermines this 'Every Slice' principle in §5.5, but offers nothing in its place for perdurantism.

Moreover, the 'corner slice' argument offered in §5.5 is not compelling. To set up the problem, we are given antecedently the path of an object and asked to consider a slice through that path in which very little of the object falls -- perhaps just a corner of it. This is supposed to be a counterexample to the Every Slice principle, because 'an object that is, for most of its career, composed of four atoms cannot "fit into" a region shaped like one atom' (p. 113). The idea is that the corner slice is not an exact location, because the object is not the same size and shape at that location as at other regions which really are exact locations. Read literally, this cannot be right -- it seems to involve essentialism about size and shape, so that enduring objects can't change their size and shape at different locations. Since Balashov has earlier admitted that relativising intrinsic properties to regions is a perfectly acceptable response to the problem of temporary intrinsics, the endurantist 'Every Slicer' should simply admit that, at some of its locations, the object is a lot smaller than at others. And there is a perfectly coherent story to tell about why that should be so -- for the path of an object, foliated in accordance with the reference frame of the corner slice, yields a history of successive loss of parts until finally the object has only one part and then goes out of existence. This story is supported by the fact that throughout this way of telling the history, we are genuinely considering the antecedently given path of the object -- it seems deeply unrelativistic to say that this frame of reference is somehow an inappropriate one in which to present the history of the object. My own suggestion would be that all views of relativistic persistence should say that any foliation of the path of an object gives an acceptable presentation of the history of that object. No restriction on eligibility satisfactorily respects this, because every such restriction involves taking some frames to be 'better' representations of the 'true' history of an object than others, and this is relativistically unacceptable.[15]

*******

Up through the end of chapter 5, Balashov has given a balanced account of how each of the competing theories of persistence can be accommodated relativistically. In chapters 6 to 8, he argues that perdurance, on balance, fits better with relativity. He develops two arguments to this end: one about coexistence and the other about the distribution of momentary shapes over spacetime. Ancestors of these arguments have been given by Balashov in a number of places and have received a fair amount of critical attention. Here they are expanded and revised in response to criticism and occur in their strongest form.[16] Unfortunately, even now neither is wholly convincing, as I'll discuss below.

Balashov begins chapter 7 by rehashing an earlier argument about odd consequences for coexistence that endurantists face, interleaved with critical discussion from Gilmore.[17] Acknowledging that Gilmore's replies make that earlier argument untenable (though he is not nearly as concessive in §7.2 to Gilmore as he should be, in my view -- see below), Balashov proposes two further arguments 'of the same broad variety' (p. 173), aimed at putting pressure on endurantists and exdurantists because of what they say about coexistence. I'll discuss only the first of these arguments in any detail. That argument goes something like this:

Contextuality Argument

  1. Endurantists and exdurantists maintain that objects are exactly located at achronal regions of spacetime (p. 169).
  2. For en-/exduring x's to jointly coexist is for there to be a flat hypersurface of simultaneity, in some frame, that all the x's are exactly located on (from 1, and 'CASHn', §§6.4, 7.4).
  3. A collection of n en-/exduring objects may co-exist pairwise without the entire collection coexisting. (From 2, and the existence of multiple hyperplanes through a point; Balashov calls this claim 'contextuality of coexistence', p. 183, though it has nothing to do with context dependence.)
  4. If coexistence is contextual, then coexistence fails to obey 'a reasonable "calculus". . . it stumbles upon a simple rule that is, intuitively, part and parcel of the concept of coexistence' (p. 184).
  5. So en-/exdurantist coexistence fails to obey a reasonable calculus. (3,4)

Many features of this argument are puzzling. One puzzle is why Balashov thinks this is not a problem for perdurantists, though he claims on multiple occasions that it is not. In particular, since exdurantism and perdurantism agree on the fundamental ontology, the pattern of troubling coexistence Balashov claims to have identified for exduring objects should hold for their diachronic parts. Balashov in fact concedes this (p. 185), though he claims that it is not a problem for perdurantism. His thought seems to be that, because perduring objects aren't exactly located at achronal regions, the troubling coexistence relations 'are of secondary importance', rather than being 'basic facts', and are thus 'metaphysically inconsequential' -- a mere matter of perspective (pp. 184-6).

I confess I find this response not wholly satisfactory. The fundamental, basic facts for all accounts of persistence are facts about location and q-location. The (q-)location facts, together with facts about the distribution of location-relativised qualities of objects and facts about the structure of spacetime, fix all the facts, including whatever facts there may be about coexistence. There is no room for an additional 'basic fact' about coexistence. So en-/exdurantists have no reason to think that the failure of coexistence to obey a reasonable calculus is of anything more than secondary importance either; there is no asymmetry between perdurantism and the other views on this issue. The mere fact that coexistence at a location is a relation that an en-/exduring object is the 'proper subject' of (in Haslanger's useful phrase), as opposed to standing in that relation 'vicariously' in virtue of parts standing in it, goes no distance towards showing that the relation is basic or has any interesting ontological consequences.

This fact, ironically, is emphasised by Balashov's presentation, which makes use of 'temporal-like worlds' -- a domain of objects located on a hyperplane of simultaneity, all of which coexist (p. 179). Any ontological consequences that coexistence has are derived from the way in which Balashov treats such hyperplanes as genuinely world-like -- as giving something that really is apt to yield a domain of quantification (in more than just a context-sensitive way involving quantifier domain restriction, like the exists around here quantifier expressed by many ordinary utterances of 'exists'). But such temporal-like worlds are an artefact of a physically derivative way of carving up spacetime, even for endurantists and exdurantists, and couldn't possibly have the problematic ontological consequences Balashov claims for them. Balashov seems to argue that for endurantists and exdurantists temporal-like worlds are 'the ground of all the important features exhibited in the temporal "multi-universe"' (p. 184). But there is absolutely no reason given why an endurantist who 'take[s] relativity seriously' (p. 184) should think that it should be grounded in any interesting sense in the nature of frame-dependent temporal-like worlds.

As will be clear from the discussion above, the basic arguments in chapter 7 repeatedly invoke the idea, introduced in §7.2, that certain 'temporally laden' ascriptions of co-existence are legitimately made of en-/exduring objects, but not of perduring objects. Indeed, it seems that en-/exdurantists are being punished for doing a better job of making minimal ontological revisions to the notion of coexistence. For coexistence is for them a relation between whole persisting objects, not their proper parts; that is surely part of the ordinary notion of coexistence. Endurantists and exdurantists fail to preserve all of the properties this ordinary relation is taken to have, but on that score they still do better than perdurantists, who can't even say that ordinary continuants stand in the relation at all in an unmediated way. Balashov notes earlier that this 'underscores the extent to which the ontology of perdurantism is revisionary' (p. 172), but fails to draw the further consequence that avoiding revisionary consequences by being even more revisionary is not a defensible response.

The same kind of double standard is exhibited in the other argument Balashov gives, about 'chronological incoherence' (§7.8), where he argues that perdurantists avoid his objections because 'there is no strict sense in which perduring objects can be said to age' (p. 188). Again, perdurantism apparently can't even preserve ordinary claims about the way that objects age over time; the fact that endurantists and exdurantists say some (allegedly) puzzling things about ageing over time is surely far less a violation of Balashov's own MOORian principles than not being able to say anything at all, and yet Balashov doesn't take this to be an even more powerful consideration against the perdurantist.

Balashov is definitely right about this: there had better be a place for a notion of existence that goes hand in hand with co-existence (p. 164). If Balashov is right that perdurantists can admit 'no reasonable sense' in which coexistence 'can be characterised in terms of changing temporally laden qualifications (stillalreadyno longer, etc.)' (p. 170), then so much the worse for perdurantism. Thankfully there is a very natural way in which perdurantists, and everyone else, can accommodate a tensed conception of existence that is linked to coexistence: a contextually restricted domain of quantification, restricted to those things with which an utterance shares a simultaneity slice. When I say, 'Descartes no longer exists', I express the proposition: there is nothing in the domain of entities which share any simultaneity slice with the event of utterance that is identical with (a stage of) Descartes.

The important point about this proposal is that, because the semantic work is done by the event of utterance, not the nature of the utterer, there will be no prospect of generating any asymmetry between different kinds of utterer and the kinds of temporally laden claims they can truly make. It does seem plausible that coexistence in Balashov's sense does give rise to a natural domain for quantifiers to be restricted to, and so in many circumstances an utterance of 'Napoleon exists' will be true if Napoleon is included in that restricted domain; similarly for 'Putin exists'. Unless the perdurantist wants to offer some highly non-standard semantics for 'exists', on which this kind of very natural quantifier domain restriction doesn't occur, the perdurantist too is going to have to admit that there are many circumstances in which 'Both Napoleon and Putin exist' is truly uttered by me and no circumstances in which 'Both Napoleon and Putin exist' is truly uttered by Putin. This semantic fact certainly makes it legitimate to qualify the expression of existence and coexistence claims by 'already', 'still', and the like, even for the perdurantist -- and will, in the only way I can make sense of, 'entitle [the utterer] to temporally laden determinations, as regards the existence@ of other objects' (p. 170).

*******

In chapter 8, Balashov formulates an argument for perdurance based on the alleged inability of endurantists to explain the distribution of momentary shapes over spacetime. Once again, the content of this argument isn't entirely clear, but my best reconstruction goes something like this:[18]

Shape Argument

  1. The phenomenon of relativistic length contraction (§3.6) entails that a single object will appear to have different shapes in different frames of reference.
  2. The perdurantist can systematically explain differences between these shapes: they are just the shapes of the objects occupying the intersection of the perduring object with the relevant slices: 'what stands behind, and thus explains, the whole variety of 3D shapes is a single 4D entity' (p. 202).
  3. The endurantist cannot systematically explain the differences between these shapes: 'the endurantist must regard it as a mystery . . . why are all the perspective-indexed 3D shapes and arrangements so nicely related in four dimensions?' (pp. 203-6).
  4. So perdurantism can explain the specifically relativistic phenomenon of length contraction better than the endurantist (1, 2, 3).
  5. Ceteris paribus, the more explanatory theory is more likely to be true.
  6. Perdurantism is more likely to be true (4,5 -- inference to the best explanation).

I will focus my discussion on premise 3. The endurantist, like any other theorist of relativistic persistence, grounds facts about the path of an object in facts about the trajectories of the constituent particles of the object. Balashov explicitly admits that appeals by the endurantist to such 'facts about the occupation of spacetime points by fundamental particles' are legitimate (p. 213). But such facts support the association of a 4D path with an enduring object, just as much as with a perduring object. And just as the perdurantist can explain the shapes of a perduring object at given regions by appealing to the shapes of the intersection of that region with the path of the object, so too can the endurantist.

Balashov complains that the endurantist explanation isn't unifying, and that good explanations should 'enhance understanding of a range of facts by invoking a different type of fact that would unify the former in a relevant way' (p. 212). It seems to me that the endurantist explanation of location-relative shape in terms of the shape of the path of an enduring object is exactly such a unifying explanation -- at least, Balashov has given us no reason why the perdurantist's structurally similar explanation should be any better off in this regard. (I confess some bewilderment about exactly how to apply this criterion of 'unification' to the case at hand.) In particular, since the endurantist (like van Inwagen above) thinks that the occupant of the path of an enduring object is that very object, it is entirely unclear to me what the endurantist would find unacceptable about the explanation of the change of shape Balashov offers as a paradigm of good explanation: RR and many other peculiarly-shaped 3D regions are related because they are carved out from a smooth 4D spacetime region R occupied by a single object (p. 212). The straightforward availability of this explanation to endurantists like van Inwagen seems another good reason for them to reject the too-restrictive account of relativistic endurance Balashov offers in chapter 5. It is not clear to me what further legitimate demand for explanation Balashov could have at this point.[19]

*******

I've been critical of the positive part of Balashov's book. I've identified some difficulties with some of the arguments he offers, arguments which are sometimes frustratingly elusive in their exact details. But these negative assessments shouldn't distract us from the bigger picture. Balashov's book is, in the end, a very useful and engaging contribution to the literature on persistence. The whole book amply repays the effort the reader invests in thinking through the issues it deals with, and, though I've claimed some of the arguments are flawed, they are never less than interesting and thought-provoking. And I am entirely supportive of the general project, looking seriously and rigorously at the intersection of metaphysics and the philosophy of physics. For that reason I believe that anyone who is interested in the debate over persistence -- perdurantist and endurantist alike -- will find this book an important contribution, and that Balashov has done us a great service by so clearly and forcefully putting the case for the potential significance of modern physics for formulating and articulating that debate. I certainly hope the book will be widely read; Balashov's engagement with both physics and metaphysics provides a model for how ontological enquiry ought to proceed.[20]



[1] Cody Gilmore (2008), 'Persistence and Location in Relativistic Spacetime', Philosophy Compass 3: 1224-1254; Ian Gibson and Oliver Pooley (2006), 'Relativistic Persistence', Philosophical Perspectives 20: 157-198.

[2] Gilmore, 'Persistence and Location in Relativistic Spacetime'; Hud Hudson (2006), The Metaphysics of Hyperspace, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[3] Raúl Saucedo (2011), 'Parthood and Location', in Karen Bennett and Dean Zimmerman (eds.), Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, vol. 6: 225-284, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[4] Josh Parsons (2008), 'Hudson on Location', Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 76: 427-435.

[5] An 'achronal' region is one where no point in that region absolutely chronologically precedes any other. Puzzlingly, Balashov maintains that achronal parts are achronal (p. 31), though nothing in his definition ensures this, and his examples -- such as my hand being 'a part of me at a certain momentary location of my hand' (p. 29) -- don't support it.

[6] However, given that Balashov ultimately wishes to defend a perdurantist ontology in relativistic spacetimes, this concessiveness is dialectically unproblematic.

[7] In classical contexts, not every arbitrary part of an object's path is a location of the object -- the scattered region which fuses the location of my left hand ten years ago and the rest of my body now is not one of my locations, even though it is part of my path. So it's not an eligible part of my path. The innovation in the relativistic context, according to Balashov, is that even some achronal slices are not eligible. I return to this below.

[8] Peter van Inwagen (1990), 'Four-Dimensional Objects', Noûs, 24: 245-255, on p. 251.

[9] Van Inwagen, 'Four-Dimensional Objects', p. 252.

[10] An extended simple e is exactly located at some region R, which has at least one proper part RThere is a plausible argument that e is located -- like Descartes in van Inwagen's example -- both at R and at all its parts. 
It is clear that e fills R′, in virtue of filling R. Moreover, it is clear that R′ also contains e. For if it did not, some part of ewould be outside of R′, and since e is simple, e would be outside of R′. But then some part of R -- namely, R′ -- would be not occupied by e, and this is not possible since R is the exact location of e. Contradiction -- so e fills and is contained in R′, and that is plausibly sufficient for R′ to be an exact location of e.

[11] Gibson and Pooley, 'Relativistic Persistence', §2.1.

[12] Balashov himself gives the example of Unicolor, an object which is essentially uniformly coloured and which smoothly changes colour over its proper time (p. 95). If Unicolor moves on an accelerated path, there is no inertial frame such that all of the moments of time in that frame are eligible regions for Unicolor, because not every intersection of Unicolor with such surfaces will be uniformly coloured (hence the entity in that location is not Unicolor but rather is a more gerrymandered fusion of some of Unicolor's parts). Despite the fact that Unicolor is a very well-behaved object, there is no coherent, pseudo-classical set of moments of time such that Unicolor changes smoothly over time in that set. The natural collection of orthogonal hypersurfaces to Unicolor's path, those surfaces at which Unicolor is indeed uniformly coloured, intersect one another in an essentially arbitrary way. The theoretical role of moments of time isn't just to provide, for each achronal region of an object, some moment of time associated with it. Their role is to provide a useful set of indices to track the changes in objects over time. In the case of an accelerated Unicolor, the relevant set of regions used as indices don't resemble the classical notion of 'moment of time' nearly enough to deserve the name. We'd do better to simply recognise that Unicolor has a certain distribution of colour properties over regions. The eligible regions may, as in the present case, all be flat; but that doesn't mean that collectively they satisfy ordinary criteria for being moments of time.

[13] Josh Parsons (2004), 'Distributional Properties'. In Frank Jackson and Graham Priest (eds.), Lewisian Themes, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 173-80.

[14] Cody Gilmore (2006), 'Where in the Relativistic World are We?', Philosophical Perspectives 20: 199-236.

[15] This proposal, as Balashov pointed out to me, is in tension with some principles governing shapes of ordinary objects. In particular, it's in tension with this principle: 'If o is a K, then o is K-shaped at all frame-relative times at which o exists' (see Thomas Sattig [unpublished], 'Ordinary Objects in the Relativistic World'). This essentialist principle would fill the lacuna in the argument of the book as it currently stands, but is also, as Sattig notes, a matter of considerable controversy in the relativistic setting.

[16] Though there remains significant unclarity about just what the arguments are supposed to be; these chapters would have benefitted greatly from simply laying out these arguments in premise-conclusion form, as Balashov does for a number of arguments he criticises earlier in the book, e.g., in §5.4.

[17] Gilmore, 'Where in the Relativistic World are We?"

[18] I'm indebted here to the clear discussion in §7 of Katherine Hawley (2010), 'Temporal Parts', in Edward N. Zalta (ed.), The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2010 Edition).

[19] It's also possible for endurantists to resist Balashov's argument in another way, at least if they accept some other things Balashov maintains (in particular, the denial of the Every Slice principle). We don't have anything more than a necessary condition for eligibility of a region, that the occupant of the region should be related by immanent causation to the object that is being considered to occupy it. As Balashov says, a region being occupied by o is not the same as being 'filled with achronal material components of o' (p. 95). But the objection in chapter 8 presupposes that the endurantist accepts that length contraction involves the very same object having a different length in a different frame. But I see no reason why the endurantist should have to accept this, on Balashov's view. If being able to give a unified account of 3D shape is so important for the endurantist, they could simply insist that one of the conditions on an appropriate diachronic relationship of immanent causation is that it explain shape in the right kind of way (just as in the discussion of Unicolor, it was maintained that preserving uniformity of colour was a condition on an appropriate diachronic relationship of immanent causation). This line of endurantist response denies 1; it denies that length contraction genuinely involves change of shape in different reference frames, and rather involves the shape of an object in appropriate frames and the shape of gerrymandered fusions of material constituents of an object in other frames. I must say I find this line of response unattractive, but if shape is such an important property to be explained as Balashov maintains, and if the Every Slice principle is false, it might well begin to look plausible to say that those slices which fail to have an occupant whose shape is satisfactorily linked with the shape of the object at genuine locations are not occupied by the object after all.

[20] Thanks to Yuri Balashov for comments on a draft, and to Gary Gutting for being patient.