Alexis G. Burgess and John P. Burgess


Alexis G. Burgess and John P. Burgess, Truth, Princeton University Press, 2011, 158pp., $22.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691144016.

Reviewed by Michael P. Lynch, University of Connecticut

Those of us who work on truth for a living find ourselves in curious times. Business is booming: in the last few years alone, about a dozen books have been published on truth; conferences are being funded, papers are being written, dissertations defended. And yet the currently dominant view about the nature of truth, at least amongst those who specialize in the subject, is that it doesn't have one. The idea seems to be that truth is not something we need a philosophically interesting theory about.[1] And that, as noted, is curious: if there is nothing much to say about the matter, why are we continuing to talk about it? Indeed, why are we talking about it more than ever? It is rather as if those paid to think about the nature of poetry or art or architecture spent a lot of time talking about the fact that there is not much to say about it. Casual observers would be excused for thinking they were being played.

One of the many virtues of this new book by John and Alexis Burgess is that it implicitly suggests an answer to these questions and thus helps to make clear why truth continues to bedazzle philosophers. The traditional project -- typified by Russell, James, and Blanshard -- of specifying the single essence of truth is only one philosophical problem the concept engenders. There is also the question of how truth relates to objectivity (the realism question); how and why truth is valuable (the value question); and how to deal with the liar and related semantic paradoxes (the logic question). As Burgess and Burgess make clear, if the nature question can be answered trivially (as so many now seem to think), that doesn't mean that answering the other questions will be a walk in the park.

Truth is a clearly written introduction to most of these topics (the authors skip the value question, for example, but devote significant attention to the logic question). It is remarkably succinct (coming in at 158 pages including the index, suggested readings and references). Yet it covers a great amount of ground with accessible discussions of a variety of topics. There are chapters on Tarski, deflationism, indeterminacy, realism, antirealism (including a discussion of Dummett and more recent pluralist views of truth), Kripke, and a final chapter devoted to the possibility that the semantic paradoxes are insoluble. Along the way, the reader is introduced to topics like model theory, truthmaker theories, and holism. Consequently, the book could serve as a text for an upper-level undergraduate or graduate course either on truth or as a background text for courses in the philosophy of language. Not to mention that it sparkles with critical gems that will interest specialists as well.

It is also a book that unapologetically reflects its times. To some degree, this is just a reflection of the aims of the series of which this book is a part: to introduce certain key concepts from the standpoint of twentieth- and twenty-first-century analytic philosophy. But I suspect it also reflects the views of the authors. Rather than starting with the correspondence or coherence theories, as a similar book written three or even two decades ago might have done, Burgess and Burgess begin the substantive discussion, as noted, with a discussion of Tarksi. This makes a lot of sense given how discussions of truth have unfolded in the latter half of the twentieth century and the first part of this century. Tarski not only supplied the first real attempt to give a formally rigorous theory of truth in light of the liar paradox, he was also the first to trumpet that most treasured truism about truth, the idea that, (as the authors summarize it): "saying something and saying it is true are equivalent" (p. 8). This is one way of understanding the upshot of the so-called equivalence principle: it is true that p if and only if p.

The centrality of the equivalence principle is presumably what motivates making the very next chapter center on deflationism, the view noted above according to which (roughly) truth has no nature. As Burgess and Burgess make clear, deflationism itself is hard to define. The label is increasingly like "realism" or "naturalism"; it denotes a family of views. Nonetheless, Burgess and Burgess correctly note that there are characteristics shared by most theories that wear the label. First, there is the equivalence principle: "applying the truth predicate to something is equivalent to just saying it" (p. 33). Second, "the equivalence principle is a sufficient account" of the meaning of the truth predicate (p. 33). Third, an account of the meaning of the truth predicate is a sufficient account of the nature of truth. Call this aspect of deflationism truth exhaustion: all the essential facts about truth are exhausted by (an account of) the concept and/or meaning of the truth predicate. As the authors note (p. 2) this is a particularly important point, since there is a "fundamental division today among writers on truth" over whether truth exhaustion is itself true.

I heartily agree with this characterization of core deflationary commitments. But I would add a fourth point. According to the deflationist, truth plays no significant explanatory role. That is, truth can figure in no explanations of other matters of interest save in its role as useful expressive device. That this is crucial to deflationism would seem to follow from the intuitive thought that it is sufficient for P to be a real and distinct property if P is part of a significant and informative explanation of some phenomenon Q. Thus, if an appeal to truth were a part of a real and significant explanation of other phenomena, it would seem to be a real and distinct property, contra deflationism.[2]

* * * * *

Taken from the standpoint of someone teaching a course on contemporary theories of truth, emphasizing deflationism prior to more traditional correspondence or coherence views is fine and helpful. It reflects the currently dominant narrative of the field. But it is also a narrative that I find troubling. The emerging story, implicitly supported by the structure of this book, is that deflationism is the default view. We can be talked out of it, but we don't need to be talked into it; its appeal is presumed to be obvious.

But is it? One should not confuse the obviousness of the equivalence principle with the obviousness of any philosophical theory. In particular, it is one thing to believe that the principle is where we should start our thinking about truth; it is another thing to believe, as truth exhaustion implies, that it is also where we should end.

After all, lots of philosophically interesting concepts seem apt for very minimal analyses: perhaps our ordinary concept of a mind is just a thing that thinks. But even if this is a correct account of our ordinary concept, it certainly leaves open the possibility that there is more to say about minds.

Similarly, it seems possible to hold that (a) our ordinary concept of truth is simple -- just as deflationists believe, but (b) deny truth exhaustion. One way to do so, which I favor myself, is to go functionalist: say that all there is to grasping that a proposition is true is grasping that it has a property that plays a particular role. To play that role is a matter of satisfying a few simple truisms, including the equivalence principle. Nonetheless, there may still be more to say about the properties that do play that role. If so, then there is a clear sense in which not all the facts about truth (not all the facts about the property or properties that play the truth-role) are exhausted by an account of the concept of truth (or more exactly, of our grasp of that concept).

Burgess and Burgess (see pp. 99ff) see functionalism as opposed to deflationism, and in some respects it certainly is. But it is not opposed to all of deflationism's core tenets. Indeed, if one wished, one could express one of deflationism's core views in functionalist terms by simply saying that we needn't appeal to anything but the equivalence principle in order to describe the truth role. Perhaps it "gives the whole meaning" of the truth predicate as Burgess and Burgess might put it. But that fact (if it is a fact) does not determine whether there is more to say about the property (or properties) that play the truth-role. Indeed, we don't even need to go functionalist at all to resist truth exhaustion: we need only say that there is a difference between the concept of truth (which may be simple) and the property picked out by the uses of that concept (which may be complex). In this way, we might accept some aspects of deflationism over others.[3]

So truth exhaustion, as opposed to the equivalence principle, isn't obviously true. It is a matter of high theory. So why believe it? One argument might be that it is indicated by the failure of the traditional views of truth that do try to say something about the property that goes beyond the concept. Such views are sometimes thought to face devastating objections, and so perhaps exhaustion is all that remains. But that is always a dangerous move in philosophy, where devastating objections await every theory right around the corner. A more promising argument is that every putative fact about truth can be explained by appeal to the equivalence principle and some further non truth-theoretic facts. For example, it looks as if we need to appeal to truth to explain knowledge: To know that p (let's pretend) is to have a true, justified belief that p. But one could just as well say: To know that p is to have a justified belief that p when p. No appeal to a special truth property is required.

This move can seem convincing whenever we are inclined to think that truth, while part of the explanation for some phenomenon Q, is not a significant and informative part of that explanation. But it is not clear why we should think that is always the case. Sometimes it seems as if appealing to the underlying nature of truth might illuminate. Consider an example that Burgess and Burgess discuss (pp. 79ff): whether truth is the norm of belief. It seems intuitive that beliefs are correct, or in good standing, just when their contents are true. You can't deduce this explicitly normative fact from the non-normative equivalence schema alone. It seems to be a separate fact about the role that truth plays in our cognitive life.[4] Moreover, it seems reasonable to think that appealing to the property that plays that role for a particular sort of belief might well help us understand why beliefs of that sort have the features they do. (It might help to understand moral beliefs' connection to action were we to understand that a moral belief's being true has more to do with its relation to an ideally coherent set of attitudes, for example, rather than representing "moral facts".)

Another interesting case is content determination (Burgess and Burgess discuss the related issue of truth-conditional semantics at pp. 84ff). Suppose we think that the content of a belief is determined by the conditions under which it is true, and that those in turn are determined by the representational relations of the belief's component parts. Theories of this sort at least purport to be general, substantive, and informative. Appeals to them can be found across philosophy of mind and cognitive science, where representational theories of content are quite familiar. Yet a deflationist cannot appeal to such theories, since they employ truth (and the notion of representation) in an explanatory role.

Some will claim that all this shows is that our theory of content (or content expression) must appeal to representational properties of mental states. Our theory of truth remains unsullied. Maybe. But I am not sure on what basis we draw such bright and shining lines. Again, it seems equally plausible to think that if such theories of content determination are right, they tell us something about truth and content. Others (think Brandom or Horwich) will just plump for something other than a truth-conditional theory of content and meaning. In any event, there is a larger lesson here. Deflationism rules out -- on a priori grounds -- that truth will ever do explanatory work. It tells us that we must take truth out of our theoretical toolbox. And that is striking -- particularly when, as is arguably the case when it comes to mental content -- it appears to be at least a partly empirical matter which theory we should settle on. At least it seems that cognitive science may have something to say about it.

* * * * *

One of the most interesting chapters of the book is the last. It is here that the authors float some of their own views on truth, in particular on how to respond to the liar paradox. Their favored position is inconsistency -- that is, they think the real lesson of the liar, and the one we have to come to accept (if not to love) is that our intuitive notion of truth is simply inconsistent. There is, strictly speaking, no "solution" to the paradox (even a dialethic, paraconsistent solution). Our concept of truth ties us up in logical knots that cannot be undone. So the only real question is whether we should keep the concept, revise it, or throw it out.

Burgess and Burgess wisely think we should keep it, at least for most purposes. One of them (A. Burgess) suggests that we can make sense of our doing so by seeing truth as a sort of fiction. This idea, first pioneered by James Woodbridge, suggests that according to the semantic story we tell ourselves, the equivalence principle is true.[5] But things are not so simple outside of the story. In the real world, so to speak, the concept of truth is incoherent, and adopting the equivalence principle leads to inconsistency. This is an appealing idea, even if it is somewhat shocking on first hearing ("truth is a fiction" sounds a bit like "dogs are cats"); nonetheless, it has more going for it than one might think, and it remains an open research program. But it also requires some sort of distinction between the "serious" or literal content and fictional content. How is this distinction to be drawn? Not in terms that appeal to truth, presumably. Otherwise, we would seem to be drawing the line between the fictional and the non-fictional with fictional chalk.

The authors end by suggesting that "deflationism is well ahead of its rivals" precisely because it is "well matched" with an inconsistency approach to the paradoxes. I find myself attracted to inconsistency theories myself, but I don't see the force of this particular point. As the authors suggest, the meaning of the truth predicate "might be given by T-introduction and T-elimination rules", and maybe these rules are simply inconsistent, period. But that doesn't show that truth exhaustion has an edge. Again, the mere fact that the meaning of a predicate is easily explained does not entail that it picks out a property or properties with no nature at all. And without further argument, this point would seem to stand even if the meaning of that predicate is inconsistent.[6]

I began by noting that philosophers are currently thinking a lot about truth even while maintaining there is not much to say about its nature. As Burgess and Burgess make clear in this intelligent and provocative book, this is partly because there is not just one problem of truth, but many different problems. But I'd like to think there is another reason as well. Perhaps we intuitively sense that while the surface of this particular theoretical pond seems clear and placid, we have not yet plumbed its real depths.

[1] Contrast, however, the view of the profession at large, at least as codified by the PhilPapers survey: http://philpapers.org/surveys/.

[2] Say that a property P is real just when it is not a merely honorific property -- it is not simply the property of falling under the concept P. Say a property is distinct just when it is not reducible to some other property.

[3] This is just the view William Alston held in A Realist Concept of Truth. (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1996).

[4] Nor does it seem particularly promising to claim that truth's being the norm of belief is "really" a fact about belief and not a fact about truth. It is equally or more plausible to think that truth's being the norm of belief is a fact about both belief and truth.

[5] Woodbridge, "Truth as a Pretense," in Fictionalism in Metaphysics, ed. Mark Kalderon, pp. 134-177. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005). A. Burgess also developed a version of the view in his doctoral thesis at Princeton. See also "Why Deflationists Should be Pretense Theorists (and Perhaps Already are)," by Woodbridge and Bradley Armour-Garb, in New Waves in Truth, eds. N. Pedersen and C. Wright, pp. 59-77 (Basingstoke and New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2010).

[6] Further argument: An inconsistent predicate couldn't pick out any property. But why not? It could pick out a coherent property (or properties) but do so inconsistently, or it could consistently pick out a property that is de re incoherent.