T.M. Rudavsky


T.M. Rudavsky, Maimonides, Wiley-Blackwell, 2010, 225pp., $31.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405148986.

Reviewed by Daniel Davies, University of Cambridge

Many think of Maimonides as the paradigmatic Jewish philosopher. But the very notion raises the question of what Jewish philosophy might be. Tamar Rudavsky considers Maimonides a Jewish philosopher because he is engaged in "an intellectual dialogue with elements of Judaism" (viii) drawing on "an eclectic collection of philosophical works" (ix). Furthermore, she shows that "analyzing Maimonides' philosophical views becomes an exercise in hermeneutic interpretation as well as critical analysis" (x), so Rudavsky's volume enables the Guide to continue being a partner for discussion today and an inducement to the kind of Jewish philosophy that she describes. She writes with wide understanding of the issues treated in Maimonides' philosophy and skillfully weaves them into a helpful narrative. The book is presented as an introduction but, as well as presenting the topics, Rudavsky assesses the individual philosophical arguments and the coherence of Maimonides' system as a whole. Overall she strikes a balance between writing a summary of the topics and delving deeper into their implications and puzzles. She also presents helpful suggestions for further reading at the end of each chapter.

After a biographical chapter, Rudavsky introduces Maimonides' major "philosophical" work, The Guide for the Perplexed, explains its purpose -- to ease "perplexity" and to comment on scripture -- and the importance of logic. Here also is the crucial distinction between different kinds of arguments, dialectical and demonstration, and an explanation of the role that demonstration plays in affording scientific knowledge. Maimonides' respect for science and scientific method, generally that of Aristotle and his followers, comes through well.

Chapter three moves on to discuss Maimonides' arguments about God. Two connected matters are treated: God's existence and religious language. Maimonides presents his arguments for God's existence in chapter one of part two of the Guide. Rudavsky presents a particularly clear account of a very difficult chapter to untangle. Of the four arguments in Maimonides' chapter, the second is perhaps the weakest. Herbert Davidson has remarked that it "is so feeble that the reader will be hard put to see how Maimonides could have supposed it to be a demonstration."[1] This second argument seems to be omitted from the book, but Rudavsky still presents four arguments in total. The fourth is an argument from "particularization" and draws upon remarks Maimonides makes later in part two. If it is supposed to augment the second argument in 2:1, it is an intriguing new explanation. Rudavsky also questions the third argument, which is the argument that Maimonides seems to think is strongest, by pointing out that it contains a premise that could be false, the principle of plenitude. Maimonides' discussions of divine unity and religious language presume some knowledge of Aristotelian categories and metaphysics. Placing this chapter here in the volume allows Rudavsky to introduce basic concepts and ways of thinking that will be continue to be useful in later chapters and also to explain them, which she does in an admirably clear way.

In chapter four Rudavsky discusses the controversial question of Maimonides' view on creation and gives it a novel twist. He presents three alternative models: creation ex nihilo, creation from matter, and eternity of the world. Creation ex nihilo is the one that he professes to accept. Some have argued that his proclamation is a mere pretense and that, in truth, he accepts Aristotle's view that the world has existed eternally. So far as I'm aware, Rudavsky is the first current writer to support the view that Maimonides agreed with the position of creation from matter, which he attributes to Plato.[2] She makes a good case inasmuch as she emphasizes the unclarity in Maimonides' presentation of Plato's view. I will return to the question below. This chapter also considers what Maimonides says about astronomy and explains his "epistemological skepticism". He argues that humans are ignorant about much of what is in the heavens. Scholars are divided on the question of whether Maimonides thinks this ignorance reflects an essential human condition or the present state of human knowledge. Rudavsky supports the view that Maimonides held that the ignorance could in principle be overcome.

Chapter five discusses human nature as a combination of body and soul, and the different parts of the soul. It finishes with consideration of the afterlife as immortality of the soul and bodily resurrection. Maimonides considers resurrection a miracle, and miracles are treated in chapter six. Prophecy, by contrast, he views as a natural phenomenon, although he makes room for the miraculous here too. Rudavsky argues that Maimonides rejects resurrection because it is miraculous and explains prophecy in a way that minimizes the importance of the miraculous, thereby rendering it an entirely natural phenomenon. Interpreting miracles as natural phenomena is an approach that Rudavsky identifies more generally in Maimonides' work.

The seventh chapter is dedicated to a discussion of divine providence, taking up the issues of God's knowledge, the presence of evil, and human freedom. After stating that Maimonides "says surprisingly little about the will (human or divine) in the Guide" (154), Rudavsky argues that the way he presents the topics treated in this chapter indicate that much of his writing tends toward determinism. When explaining Maimonides' opposition to astrology, in chapter six, she stated that his "apparent rejection of astrology on the grounds that it rules out human freedom is only convincing if we are right in concluding that Maimonides is in fact a proponent of human freedom" (95). Since Rudavsky has argued that he probably espouses a form of determinism, it makes sense to surmise that she thinks either that Maimonides ultimately accepts astrology or that he failed to provide a convincing refutation.

Two concluding chapters consider what Maimonides has to say about ethics and politics, and include explanations of what he thought to be good behavior, the place of the Jewish law in fostering it, and the best kind of human life. Rudavsky explains Maimonides' views of the ethical mean and his virtue ethics against the background of Aristotle and al-Farabi and explores those cases on which he differs from the earlier philosophers. Reasons for the commandments are also explained here. Finally, when considering Maimonides' view of human perfection, Rudavsky highlights the tension between philosophical and practical ideals.

The variety of takes on Maimonides is well showcased by this book, in which Rudavsky explains all of the major strands of interpretation popular today and also touches on medieval responses. One of the great advantages of Rudavsky's presenting the panoply of interpretations in such a fair minded way is that it emphasizes how diverse and how dynamic a field Maimonidean studies is. In the spirit of these ongoing debates I register a disagreement with her interpretation of Maimonides' arguments about creation, which has itself been one of the most disputed topics in Maimonidean scholarship through the centuries.

As mentioned above, Rudavsky argues that Maimonides adhered to the Platonic view. One reason that I am not convinced by the argument is that it is based on the assumption that Maimonides hid an unorthodox philosophical view that is opposed to the one he openly professed. A major stimulus for such a reading is to be found in Maimonides' introduction to the Guide, in which he states that during the course of his work he will use premises that contradict other premises that he also makes use of. One of the reasons, he says, is to hide something from the masses, "accordingly they must in no way be aware of the contradiction." Many think that Maimonides is hiding his true philosophical opinion behind a view more acceptable to the masses and he is indicating as much in this comment. As someone who does not adhere to this school of thought, I do not think that this take is right because it does not seem to fit Maimonides' description of the particular cause for contradictions that is invoked. But perhaps it is not necessary to draw on that kind of contradiction for this particular case. Maybe there are philosophical reasons indicating that Maimonides would have preferred Plato's view, and in these chapters Rudavsky marshals as evidence some of the complexity often overlooked.

Rudavsky draws support for the claim that Maimonides ultimately rejects creation ex nihilo from the following statement:

one's saying God 'was' before he created the world -- where the word 'was' is indicative of time -- and similarly all the thoughts that are carried along in the mind regarding the infinite duration of his existence before the creation of the world, are all of them due to a supposition regarding time or to an imagining of time and not due to the true reality of time. (Guide 2:13, quoted on 71)

She points out that Maimonides explains that any notion that there was a 'before' creation is based on a mistaken understanding of time, one derived from 'imagination' rather than reason. Maimonides attacks kalâm thinkers for basing their opinions on imagination rather than reason, so when he mentions imagination here Maimonides is indicating a connection between the doctrine of creation ex nihilo and the ideas of the kalâm. Neither coheres with correct scientific views because they are both based on imagination. Therefore, argues Rudavsky, Maimonides would not have accepted creation ex nihilo. Plato's position would have been the most preferable because it serves as a compromise between creation ex nihilo and Aristotle's view of eternity. Maimonides states that Plato's view is consistent with the notion that God creates through purpose, which is what is important about the Mosaic view. Unlike the Mosaic view, however, Rudavsky argues that Plato's view coheres with the important aspects of Aristotle's position as well because it preserves Aristotle's view of time. Overall, then, Plato's opinion is the most acceptable because it allows for both the religious view of the law and the scientific approach of Aristotle.

Here, though, I was left wanting more. What aspect of Aristotle's view of time is preserved by the Platonic view but not by the Mosaic view? If it is that time is the number of motion, it is not clear to me why Maimonides' explanation that time is something created is an insufficient response, or that he would himself have considered it so. If it is that time is eternal, time cannot simply begin, that seems to beg the question that Maimonides is asking. Can the claim that time must have been everlasting be established beyond any doubt? One response might be to say that Maimonides' question is whether the world is eternal, not whether or not time is eternal. However, I would want to see more in order to be convinced that Maimonides would have separated the two issues, particularly given his comment that time is created.

Furthermore, it seems to me that the passage Rudavsky quotes to support her argument is open to an interpretation that supports rather than opposes creation ex nihilo. Maimonides might be saying that believing in creation at a first moment does not entail believing that there was a 'before' to this first moment; talk of before and after requires the existence of time, but time itself was also something created at the first moment. What this means is that even God cannot be said to have existed 'before' the world was created because there was no time, and 'before' only makes sense if there is time. God is creator of time and is not numbered by time; Maimonides is stressing that God is not subject to the passing of time.

To my mind Kenneth Seeskin's explanation is closer to the mark.[3] He argues that Maimonides is distinguishing between the kind of creation that takes place within an existing world and the unique act of creation ex nihilo. On this reading, Maimonides is arguing that it is impossible to draw a conclusion about the beginning or otherwise of time from the perspective of created beings. While things that come to be within the world are always preceded by a time before their existence, the coming to be of the universe as a whole might not be. A weakness with such an explanation might stem from the fact that in 2:17 Maimonides explains why Aristotle's view need not be accepted in a way that implies that the world was preceded by something else:

No inference can be drawn in any respect from the nature of a thing after it has been generated, has attained its final state, and has achieved stability in its most perfect state, to the state of that thing while it moved toward being generated. Nor can an inference be drawn from the state of the thing when it moves toward being generated to its state before it begins to move thus.

I do not, however, think that Maimonides posits a 'before' to creation. He uses an analogy to make his point, and I see his wording as reflecting the inherent limitation of analogies.

Whatever the truth of this matter, this book is an important contribution to the literature about Maimonides, and I finish by noting that it is aimed both at scholars in the field and at students, and also at those with no knowledge of Maimonides. All these groups will find it useful for different reasons. It will make an excellent first port of call for students looking for a serious way into Maimonides studies, and also for scholars in related fields, who will find a comprehensive account of the immense and daunting secondary literature, and of the questions discussed therein. Scholars of Maimonides will benefit from the philosophical clarity and the range of sources that Rudavsky brings to many of the discussions. She has done a good job of emulating Maimonides' own success in speaking to different audiences in a single book.

[1] Moses Maimonides: the Man and his Works (New York: Oxford University Press, 2005), 357.

[2] Herbert Davidson is sometimes said to support this position but he does not. He argues that it would be the logical conclusion should a particular way of reading Maimonides be accepted. However, he opposes that method. "Maimonides' Secret Position on Creation," in Isadore Twersky (ed.) Studies in Medieval Jewish History and Literature (Cambridge: Havard University Press, 1979). Alfred Ivry supports a similar view to Rudavsky, in that he argues that Maimonides posited a pre-existence out of which creation took place. However, Ivry distinguishes what he takes to be Maimonides' real view from the Platonic view, since the pre-existing thing can not be called a thing nor, properly speaking, did it exist. 'Maimonides and Creation' in Novak and Samuelson (eds) Creation and the End of Days (Lanham: University Press of America, 1986).

[3] Maimonides on the Origin of the World (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005), 71-77.