Michael J. Thompson (ed.)

Georg Lukács Reconsidered: Critical Essays in Politics, Philosophy and Aesthetics

Michael J. Thompson (ed.), Georg Lukács Reconsidered: Critical Essays in Politics, Philosophy and Aesthetics, Continuum, 2011, 253pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441108760.

Reviewed by Max Pensky, Binghamton University

This anthology of essays on Georg Lukács (1885-1971) counts as part of a current wave of secondary literature on the Hungarian Marxist theorist, philosopher and literary critic. Lukács' work and intellectual legacy, always complex and provocative, have in fact never wanted for attention, but in the past few years new impetus for re-engaging with his work has come from literary studies, where his theory of literary realism and his implacable opposition to literary modernism in all its forms resonate with neo-realist aesthetics, and from social and political theory, where Axel Honneth's recent re-appropriation of the central concept of reification has initiated a renewed critical conversation on just what Lukács did and did not mean by reification, and how well the concept might survive transplantation into theoretical climates far different than Lukács' own.[1] "Reconsideration" (an earlier anthology, by Lukács' Hungarian students, opted to "revalue" him[2]) is therefore an apt expression.

Thompson's anthology is divided into three sections. A first section on Lukács' "philosophical legacy" begins with Stephen Eric Bronner's lucid and expansive exploration of the complexities of Lukács' intellectual and political trajectory, a fitting introductory essay since Lukács' dialectical reading of Marxism effectively invented the very idea of "Western Marxism," but also laid the basic terms of Lukács' interminable disagreements with virtually every Marxist thinker he interacted with in the course of the twentieth century. (In one of those peculiar Newton-Leibniz, Darwin-Wallace incidents of simultaneity, Lukács' History and Class Consciousness coincided virtually precisely with Karl Korsch's Marxism and Philosophy; the latter is virtually forgotten.) While Bronner's chapter reconstructs the issues and personalities in Lukács' adventures in communism, his overview does not engage in any depth with philosophical issues -- specifically, it does not engage on the philosophical level with Lukács' appropriation of Hegel, even as it ably reconstructs how this appropriation was definitive for Lukács' remarkable (and at times deplorable) political trajectory. Tom Rockmore's chapter on "Lukács and the Recovery of Marx after Marxism" reconstructs Lukács' path toward a genuinely Hegelian Marxism; the chapter by Stanley Aronowitz on Lukács' Destruction of Reason explores his critical response to the irrationalist current of post-idealist German philosophy from Nietzsche to Heidegger. Finally, Michael Löwy's chapter explores the fascinating story of the history of the reception of Lukács' chief philosophical work, History and Class Consciousness, a magisterial re-reading of the Marxist theory of labor and class struggle through the lens of Hegel; the book, which would prove so influential for the rise of critical theory and for the very idea of a philosophical appropriation of Marxism, was promptly condemned by the Fifth Cominterm Congress in 1924; decades later Lukács himself notoriously rejected much of the work's philosophical foundations, and in particular the dialectical heart of the book's central claim: the status of the global proletariat as the subject-object of the historical process.

For years, however, the question of why Lukács seemed to offer no eppur si muove defense before Zinoviev's tribunal remained open. In 1996, Lukács' unfinished and voluntarily unpublished manuscript on Tailism and the Dialectic was published, documenting that he did indeed mount a vigorous defense of History and Class Consciousness against the Party's ideological enforcers. Löwy, among the great interpreters of Lukács, brilliantly explores this complex story. Löwy frames his reading of the rediscovered text with a detective's simple question: "Now that we know that Lukács found it necessary to defend History and Class Consciousness against his 'orthodox' Marxist critics . . . the obvious question, curiously not raised by the editors (both of the Hungarian and English edition) is why did he not publish it?" (66). The answer(s) Löwy develops to this question, while too complex to be summarized here, lead to a deep engagement with the trajectory of Lukács' post-History and Class Consciousness political theory. Löwy argues that Tailism and the Dialectic amounts to a declaration of faith to the core political commitment of Lukács' dialectics: that subjectivity, in the form of class-consciousness, had to be preserved against Party Marxism's deeply anti-intellectual faith in a jejune "objectivity" that would generate utopian outcomes if only intellectuals would follow behind it -- the 'tailism' that Lukács condemns in the unfinished manuscript.

The book's second section, "Extending Aesthetic Theory," reconsiders the multiple debates engendered by Lukács' attacks on aesthetic and literary modernism and his defense of realism in the course of his long post-war career as a sort of professional defender of socialist culture and aesthetics. Here we have an extended reflection on the famous Adorno-Lukács debates over aesthetic theory by the great literary theorist and historian Peter Uwe Hohendahl; a study of Lukács' poetics of the novel by Werner Jung; an engaging study of Lukács' theory of literary history by the Hungarian philosopher János Keleman, and a study of Lukács' fascination with the historical novels of Walter Scott by Norman Arthur Fischer.

In this section, Hohendahl's essay, "The Theory of the Novel and the Concept of Realism in Lukács and Adorno," stands out as the core of a bold reassessment of a by-now hackneyed personal enmity and philosophical gulf. Challenging the standard view that Adorno could find value (even negative) only in Lukács' work up to and including History and Class Consciousness, Hohendahl demonstrates that Adorno's own reading of the theory of the realist novel, and of literary and aesthetic realism as such, remains in profound dialogue with Lukács' work, and with the implications of that work for the deeper theoretical questions of the social context of literary representation, even as he dismisses Lukács' realist theory of the 1950s. In this way Hohendahl demands a revision of a confrontation that has become emblematic of the fate of Western Marxism: Lukács' work remained alive for readers of critical theory largely as a one-dimensional foil for Adorno's aesthetic theory, an undialectical posture that neither author could have condoned.

The anthology's third section, "Perspectives on Critical Theory," continues this contrastive work: Konstantinos Kavoulakos' opening essay, "Back to History? Reinterpreting Lukács' Early Marxist Work in Light of the Antinomies of Contemporary Critical Theory," refers to familiar criticisms of the shortcomings of Habermas' discourse-theoretical revision of the projects of critical theory in order to suggest that Lukácsian thought, mutatis mutandis, offers help in addressing the charges of formalism and proceduralism in Habermas's theory, and the resulting problem of a lack of traction on the substantive ethical context of modern life. Kavoulakos' chapter attempts to rescue Lukács' philosophy of history from the complementary misreadings of a no-longer tenable idealism on one side and an "empirically refutable futurology" (162) on the other. The revised version emphasizes an open history as the site of "a nonmechanistic emergence of a qualitatively new form of consciousness and a corresponding social practice as the concrete embodiment of effective human freedom," a claim that remains entirely indeterminate until some further claim is made of the precise subject or subjects of such a new form, which is just the question at hand. Absent a retrograde claim for the factual emergence of a global proletariat, an updated Lukácsian world history is left with

nothing but the classical idea of Enlightenment, the idea of enlightening people about their real conditions of existence and the application of this knowledge to the field of politics and the social practice of citizens. If today it strikes us as outrageous it is because -- despite the 'democratic' spirit of our age -- we have, to a great extent, lost faith in the power of deliberate agency. (162)

Maybe, but the recasting of Lukács' difficult philosophy of history into this anodyne version of Enlightenment (which I think few political theorists would find outrageous) also loses touch with the distinctive and productive problem of Lukács' approach, which is to identify a macro-subject of a 'new form of consciousness' in a way that is free both of the baggage of metaphysics and the inconvenient truth of the 'empirical consciousness' of the actual people involved. Kavoulakos' solution here is to claim that Lukács means by "proletariat" less a determinate class of actual persons than a "process whereby the universal breaks forth in history;" (163) a "theoretical mask" meant to denote how social processes open up objective possibilities for effective insight with practical implications on the part of a macro-subject to-be-determined. This solution -- and the request that we train ourselves to see social processes where we would prefer to see "mere" facts -- is one Lukács himself was perhaps excessively fond of. It's not clear to me whether such a reformulation advances the philosophical problem especially. But it certainly runs the risk of adopting the worst of both sides of this antinomy.

Andrew Feenberg's contribution, "Reification and its Critics," like Hohendahl's, stages a serious reformulation of the standard account of Adorno's critiques of Lukács. Just as Hohendahl obliges us to re-think the very concept of realism, so Feenberg presents us with a richer and stranger version of an already rich and strange concept: reification. Taken as the global, structural circumstance in which intersubjective relationships can only appear as relationships between objects while objects take on person-like qualities in their relation to one another, Lukács' concept captures both the large-scale and small-scale, both the structural and psychological qualities of what it is like to live in a wrong world. Of course, the problem as Adorno insisted was that a genuinely dialectical account of reification cannot simply arrest the interpenetration of subject and object at a normative Archimedean point of one's own choosing, as he claimed Lukács consistently did by 'siding with the subject.' Adorno always insisted that Lukács remained to the end an idealist, and that the concept of reification could only maintain the critical function Lukács ascribed to it through an idealist short-circuiting of a stringent dialectical reading.

Feenberg argues that this Adornian criticism overextends its credit, creating a straw man out of Lukács' original conception of reification. For Feenberg, reification offered Lukács a distinctive solution to a familiar problem: the fact-value distinction and its role in the production of critical social philosophy. As both a psychological state and a structural feature of capitalist societies, reification, as Feenberg deftly shows, is in fact dialectical through and through, as is its possible overcoming:

Reification is not overcome by its opposite -- will -- but by its determinate negation: 'the forms of mediation in and through which it becomes possible to go beyond the immediate existence of objects as they are given, [must] be shown to be the structural principles and the real tendencies of the objects themselves.' This is the resolution of the antinomy of fact and value that seems inevitable under the horizon of reification. The facts are no longer rigid barriers to the realization of values but have become fluid as values enter reality as a living force (181).

Honneth's well-known recent reconsideration of the concept of reification proposes to repurpose it as a tool for the larger project of overcoming the excessive proceduralism of Habermasian discourse theory. In Honneth's case, this demands a theory of social pathologies with real psychological and affective ramifications for persons, rather than a description of misfired communicative processes. In "Returning to Lukács," Timothy Hall analyzes Honneth's appropriation and chides him for an 'idiosyncratic' reading of the concept; a familiar strategy that attempts to excise a useful conception from its context to repurpose it for aims foreign to it.

This is of course a criticism to which Honneth might reasonably reply that any reconceptualization of Lukácsian reification will be idiosyncratic if it intends to strike out beyond the highly distinctive uses to which Lukács' critical theory puts it.  For Hall, however, Honneth's conception of reification as a form of systemic 'forgetting of recognition' is so fixated on avoiding the Lukácsian discourse of the collective subject of domination that it unnecessarily deprives reification of much of its critical power by divorcing the concept from its place in a diagnosis of the crisis of political agency as such. (197) By "filleting" reification fromHistory and Class Consciousness and adapting it to the purposes of a theory of recognition, Hall argues that Honneth has effectively turned reification from a category of political domination to a negative concept in a moral philosophy, for which 'recognition' provides the foundational norm. And recognition is not a norm that Lukács would have been inclined to grant much in the way of practical power.

For Hall, Honneth's recognition-theoretical reformulation of Habermasian proceduralism does little to correct the underlying transcendental ambition of a critical theory: basing a norm of rationality in the most fundamental (read: unmediated) forms of human interaction, a fixed star that Lukács' open and improvisational conception of political praxis would hardly tolerate. Moreover, as Frederick Neuhouser points out in his review of Honneth's Reification in these pages,[3] Honneth's argument that reified relationships to self, others, and world are in some important sense conceptually interdependent and equivalent threatens to flatten reification into a mere negation of recognition in all its forms: where reification is at heart a radicalization of Hegelian epistemology, Honneth's appropriation implies that reification is simply an inability to care in the Heideggerian sense. Otherwise it is not possible to understand what Honneth could mean by "recognition" of objects in the world. What remains at issue -- and unresolved -- is therefore whether reification is in essence an intersubjective phenomenon of failed recognition that "carries over" in important ways toward our attitudes toward the objective world or -- what Lukács himself argues -- whether reification properly understood indicts as dominative the very possibility of generating a stable account of a subject-object relation given the implications of the commodity form both for objectivity and for subjects.

The section concludes with two final chapters: Katie Terezakis' chapter on "Living Form and Living Criticism" explores Lukács' early Soul and Form and finds in Lukács' philosophical romanticism a comportment toward his critical objects that carries through his work and that bears on the current situation of 'professional critics' within the academic institution; finally, Thompson writes on "Ontology and Totality: Reconstructing Lukács' Concept of Critical Theory."

The editing of scholarly anthologies falls into that class of labor-intensive productive activities that disappear in the final product when done well. This is unfortunately not the case in Lukács Reconsidered. Editorial lapses, both on the part of the editor and the publisher, detract from the book's usefulness. Thompson's oddly perfunctory editor's introduction offers little in the way of perspective on emerging trends in Lukács scholarship of which it is so clearly a part. Indeed the introduction's opening statement, that "It is perhaps one of the greatest losses of contemporary intellectual life that the writings of Georg Lukács have fallen into almost total neglect," apart from its hyperbole, is patently incorrect, as the very essays and authors he anthologizes amply document. (The opening sentence of Timothy Hall's contribution to this anthology - "In recent years there has been a revival of interest in the social and political thought of Georg Lukács across a range of disciplines" -- might on its own have signaled the inappropriateness of Thompson's opening claim!)

How the reconsideration of Lukács on offer here relates to other recent projects -- Honneth's reappropriation, of course, as well as Timothy Bewes' Reification or the Anxiety of Late Capital from 2002 -- the reader must determine for herself.[4] In any case, evidence for an emergent new Lukács scholarship is available quite close by, since Continuum Press itself is the publisher of another Lukács anthology, also from 2011 and edited by Bewes and Hall, that tracks in close parallel to much of the work done here and can be read very profitably in tandem with the current work.[5] In fact, Bewes and Hall's excellent editors' introduction offers a lucid and comprehensive view of the recent reappropriation of Lukács' work that could be profitably consulted as an introduction to the present volume as well.

The absence of a perspective-granting introduction is not a fatal lapse in an anthology; nor is the unevenness of the quality of the contributions. Not every essay can be a home run, and Lukács Reconsidered, despite the superb contributions of Löwy, Hohendahl, and Feenberg, contains chapters that ought to have been returned for shortening, clarification, or more. Again, this is hardly uncommon and not necessarily ruinous, as any anthology editor will likely agree. Far more serious are editorial lapses that compromise the scholarly usefulness of the book as a whole, a goal high on any list of an anthology's purposes, above all one aspiring to reconsider and rejuvenate the work of an unjustly marginalized author. Here I mention only the two most glaring of a number of editorial miscues. Jung's essay on "Time -- The Corrupting Principle: A Short Apology for Georg Lukács' Poetics of the Novel" is the victim of a translation from the German so bungled that a forensic reading is the only viable option for the reader attempting to wring meaning from it. Stanley Aronowitz's short chapter on Lukács Destruction of Reason, while staging an important argument for Lukács' status as a forerunner of criticisms of philosophical postmodernism, is so marred by typographical errors, misprints, elisions, and other flaws that it is difficult to believe that the essay was at any point actually copy-edited. Given the absence of notes, references, and bibliography, the chapter is rendered nearly useless as a scholarly resource.

Readers will have to cope with these infelicities while they profit from the considerable number of strong essays that make their way into the volume.

[1] Axel Honneth, Reification: A New Look at an Old Idea (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2008).

[2] Agnes Heller (ed.), Lukács Revalued (Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1983).

[3] Frederick Neuhouser, Review of Axel Honneth, VerdinglichungNotre Dame Philosophical Reviews, March 7, 2006.

[4] Timothy Bewes, Reification or the Anxiety of Late Capitalism (London: Verso, 2002).

[5] Timothy Bewes and Timothy Hall (eds.), Georg Lukács: The Fundamental Dissonance of Existence (London: Continuum, 2011).