2011.11.21

Michelle Maiese

Embodiment, Emotion, and Cognition

Michelle Maiese, Embodiment, Emotion, and Cognition, Palgrave Macmillan, 2011, 260pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230576971.

Reviewed by Demian Whiting, University of Hull, UK


What is the relation between body and mind? Is the mind composed of the body and/or its activity? And, if so, is the mind the whole body and/or its activity or only part of the body and/or its activity, the brain say? Or is the relation a non-constitutive one, in the sense that the body might act as some sort of vessel for the mind (and even exert a strong influence on mind), but in no way constitutes the mind, as, for instance, the classical dualist holds? Maiese's view seems to be the former constitution thesis. In her view, mind is, as she puts it, 'constitutively dependent' on the lived body (p. 10). But, unlike those who think mind is brain activity, Maiese holds that mind is 'constitutively dependent' on the whole living body and its activity. In Maiese's view, the mind 'is fully spread out into our living bodies, necessarily including the brain, but also not necessarily restricted to the brain' (p. 12). Maiese's project is to make her view of embodiment plausible, examining emotion as a paradigmatic case of embodiment, and to show how her theory of embodiment and emotion might cast light on various topical issues in philosophy. There is much ground covered in this interesting but sometimes difficult to interpret book, and it is not possible to describe or evaluate the many suggestive ideas and arguments Maiese advances. Instead, I will summarise briefly some of the main themes developed in each of the book's chapters before critically discussing Maiese's theory of emotion and embodiment.

In Chapter 1, Maiese defends her 'Essential Embodiment Thesis', which holds that 'conscious minds are necessarily biologically alive and completely embodied in all the vital systems and organs of our living bodies' (p. 2). In this chapter Maiese develops the notion of 'sensorimotor subjectivity', which is a 'primitive, pre-reflective bodily awareness' and which 'penetrates into every aspect of our mental lives' (p. 22). According to Maiese, sensorimotor subjectivity contains a number of intrinsic structures (including intentionality and 'conative affectivity', which describes 'the "experiential" aspect of consciousness', p. 26), and these structures are rooted in the 'autopoietic processes of autonomous, living systems and their associated neural bodily dynamics' (p. 35). In Chapter 2 Maiese outlines her desire-based theory of emotion. According to Maiese, emotion's essential (though not only) component is that of conscious embodied desire. And it is qua conscious embodied desires that emotions have an affective nature (thus emotion is a form of 'conative affectivity', involving characteristic bodily feelings, p. 34) and count as a primitive, non-conceptual form of appraisal (which gives rise to the notion of 'affective framing', pp. 82-89 -- about which, more shortly).

In Chapters 3 to 6 Maiese seeks to demonstrate how her desire-based theory of emotion might inform our thinking regarding a number of topical issues in philosophy. Thus, in Chapter 3 she explores the role that embodied, desire-based emotions play in the formation of a sense of 'self'. According to Maiese our sense of self is 'reflexive, pre-reflective, and non-conceptual' and is embodied and 'rooted in desire-based emotions' (p. 91). In Chapter 4 Maiese revisits the notion of 'affective framing'. Drawing on various empirical findings, including work carried out by Antonio Damasio, Maiese argues that emotion provides a 'pre-deliberative evaluative backdrop', which significantly assists us in, indeed is necessary for, making decisions and moral judgements. In Chapter 5 she claims that neither theory-theory nor simulation theory provide correct accounts of our understanding of other minds and that such understanding is better thought of as a matter of 'bodily attunement' which involves 'a vast bodily dynamics, so that our whole lived and living bodies, not just our brains, resonate with the other person' (pp. 5-6, emphasis in original). And, in an interesting final chapter, Maiese explores how problems in emotion might be implicated centrally in schizophrenia, autism and psychopathy. So, for instance, in the case of schizophrenia, Maiese claims there is a breakdown in 'affective framing' (or disruption in a person's 'desiderative bodily feelings'), and as a result the natural environment and interpersonal world begin to lose significance and reality (pp. 187-204).

This book is likely to be of some interest to those who share a similar theoretical outlook to Maiese, including those already persuaded that mental states and emotions in particular are 'embodied' (in some sense of that term). Moreover, the project of exploring the relation between mind and the body is an interesting and worthwhile one (especially given, as Maiese helps to show, many mental states, including emotions, do seem to be 'shaped and structured' by the body and its activity). I also found several of the book's chapters -- in particular, the last chapter on emotion and psychopathology -- thought-provoking and suggestive. On a more critical note, however, I did not find this an easy book to read. I was not always able to follow the author's line of thought, and quite a few sentences and paragraphs are packed with a lot of detail, which left me feeling somewhat bewildered at times. Moreover, insofar as I understood them correctly, I was convinced by neither Maiese's desire-based theory of emotion nor her embodiment thesis, and in what follows I will try to say why.

To begin with, then, I will outline two reasons why I am not persuaded by Maiese's desire-based theory of emotion. First, her claim that every emotion contains a conscious desire seems implausible to me on phenomenological grounds. Not only is it possible to desire something without having an emotion (consider the desire to eat that accompanies hunger, for instance), but it seems possible, commonplace even, to have an emotion without desiring anything. When listening to the news on the way to work, for instance, I undergo a range of emotions, depending on the news item in question: anger on hearing a politician evading a question, amusement on hearing about some funny incident, shock on hearing about the occurrence of a natural disaster, and so on. And sometimes desires are present when I undergo such emotions -- I wish politicians answered the questions asked of them! But it is by no means true that I always desire something when I undergo an emotion on hearing such news items. Often I am just affected or moved in some way -- perhaps I just feel irritated or tickled or pained by what I hear -- and that is all there is to it. Moreover, even when I do desire something it is by no means obvious that the desire is part of the emotion. For instance, when I feel angry at a politician's evasiveness or dishonesty I might experience an irritable feeling and on account of that wish politicians would be more forthcoming or honest, but it is by no means obvious my desire or wish is part of my anger, rather than something following on from the anger I undergo.

Now, it is very likely Maiese will respond that in the cases just discussed, the emotions in question do contain desires because the feelings undergone (say, the irritable feeling in the case of anger) are themselves conative in nature (or, are a form of 'conative affectivity'). But this leads me to the second feature of Maiese's theory of emotion that I find unpersuasive. According to Maiese emotions do have an affective nature -- which, in her view, and I return to this thought shortly, is what gives emotions and other mental states their phenomenal character or their what-it-is-likeness -- but for Maiese these affective or feeling properties are inseparable from emotions' intentional (and, in particular, in her view, conative) properties. As Maiese puts her view, 'insofar as the distinctive phenomenal character of emotion (affect) is essentially linked to what emotions are about, emotions can be understood as intentional states that are intrinsically phenomenal' (p. 72).

Of course, even if Maiese is right to think that affectivity has intentional properties (or that there is such a thing as 'affective intentionality' p. 83), it does not follow that affectivity is conative in nature (thus, perhaps emotional feelings are cognitive, not conative by nature, or, perhaps, feelings or affects are sui generis intentional mental states). And indeed the discussion of the paragraph preceding the last should lead us to think that affectivity does not involve conscious desire (for the reason that affectivity can be present without conscious desire being present). But is Maiese right to claim that the affective properties of emotion are inseparable from the intentional properties of emotion? Well, putting aside for now the question of whether emotions (or, at least, some emotions, such as moods) have intentional properties, Maiese's claim once again seems unconvincing to me on phenomenological grounds. This is because although emotions present themselves to consciousness as possessing affective or feeling properties, those affective properties of emotion do not present themselves to us as having an intentional nature. Thus, for instance, there is nothing to the irritable feeling I undergo when angry or the heavy-hearted feeling I undergo when sad that contains a representation of anything (in much the same way that, phenomenologically speaking, there seems to be nothing intentional or object-directed about a sensation of physical pain, for instance).

Does this mean, then, that a mental state's intentional properties are not tied up essentially with its phenomenal character? This would follow only if phenomenology must solely be a matter of feeling or affectivity. This seems to be Maiese's view, of course -- for Maiese affectivity (or 'conative affectivity') describes 'the experiential aspect of consciousness' (p. 26) -- but such a view strikes me as being far too limited an account of phenomenal character. To speak of a mental state's phenomenal character is to speak only of a mental state's appearance, and although some mental states and properties might possess an 'affect-appearance' or 'feeling-appearance', that is not to say all mental states and properties must possess such an appearance. Indeed, it seems clear that many mental properties, including a mental state's intentional properties, do not present as feelings or affects.

Abandoning the idea that affectivity has intentional properties is not, then, to relinquish the idea that intentionality is relevant to (constitutive of, even) a mental state's phenomenology. Therefore, even if Maiese is right to hold that the distinctive phenomenal character of emotion is 'essentially linked to what emotions are about' (which, of course, assumes that emotions are or can be about anything, and I take a dim view on this), this does not show that feeling or affectivity has intentional properties. Rather, it succeeds in showing only that there must be something other than (or in addition to) affectivity -- perhaps a cognitive component of emotion in virtue of which emotion has intentional properties -- that is able to make a difference to emotion's phenomenology.

Now, it is possible to disagree with Maiese's desire-based theory of emotion (including her view that feeling or affectivity has an intentional nature or structure), but continue to hold that emotions (and conscious mental states in general) are 'embodied'. So, for example, one might hold that emotions are feelings (in the Humean or Jamesian tradition, say) but agree with Maiese that 'conscious minds are necessarily biologically alive and completely embodied in all the vital systems and organs of our living bodies' (p. 2). Now, I found nothing in Maiese's book to persuade me of the first part of this thesis, namely that conscious minds are necessarily biologically alive, but I want to focus briefly instead on the second part of the embodiment thesis, namely, the thought that conscious minds are 'embodied in all the vital systems and organs of our living bodies'. As already stated, Maiese's view seems to be that the body or its activities (or its 'operative neurobiological dynamics', p. 13) are constitutive of our mental states. Thus, for instance, Maiese talks about human cognition and sense being bodily activities p. 2; on p. 50 she also says that emotion is bodily activity), and elsewhere she talks about experience being 'constituted by the facts of my embodiment' (p. 11). And in support of her embodiment thesis Maiese cites studies and phenomenological considerations that do indeed seem to indicate there being a close relationship between bodily and mental activity.

I think Maiese's considerations do give some solid support to the idea that mind is 'shaped and structured' by the body and its activity (p. 12), where 'body' here means more than brain. But what is not obvious is that we should conclude from this that the body and its lived activities somehow constitute mind, including the emotions. Certainly, in my view, none of the empirical considerations Maiese draws on supports that view over the alternative one that the relationship between body and mind is a non-constitutive (albeit, perhaps, causally necessary) one. An artist provides a causally necessary ground for a painting and a parent provides a causally necessary ground for a child, but paintings are not composed of artists and children are not composed of their parents. So why suppose differently for body and mind? Neither does the phenomenology get us much further. This is because although phenomenological considerations give some support to the idea that emotions, for instance, are bound up with various bodily sensations (and that these sensations correspond closely to bodily activity, 'racing hearts', for instance) we are none the wiser as to whether the relation between body and mind is one of constitution, or one of, say, causal dependency only.

Moreover, the idea that the body and its activities are somehow constitutive of mind faces a number of well-known problems that Maiese does not engage with. Indeed, she seems more concerned to show why her account is to be preferred to the view that minds are nothing more than brain activity than she is to show how her account can be defended against the sorts of objections that might be levelled at both the view that mental states are constituted by brain activities as well as the view that mental states are constituted by bodily activities more generally. So, for instance, how is Maiese to respond to the worry that bodies and minds just seem to be very different kinds of things, possessing very different properties? For instance, conscious mental states seem to be directly perceivable only to the person undergoing those mental states (thus, you cannot directly observe my pain), whereas the same does not seem to be true of body or bodily activity. Also, whereas there seems to be no appearance/reality distinction in the case of conscious mental states or particulars and their appearances (thus, arguably, conscious mental particulars just are their appearances -- for instance, pain's painful appearance seems indistinguishable from pain itself), there does seem to be an appearance/reality distinction in the case of bodily activities and their appearances. But, again, how are we to explain this if mind just is bodily activity? And, finally, if bodily activity constitutes mind how are we to explain away the strong intuition that there might be creatures that have living bodies resembling in every way our own bodies and bodily activity, but which lack consciousness altogether?

I have reservations, then, regarding Maiese's theory of embodiment and emotion. However, I wish to conclude by emphasising again that, despite such reservations, I found this to be a thought-provoking book full of suggestive and challenging ideas. And, certainly, it succeeded in forcing me to sharpen up and articulate better my own thinking regarding the nature of emotion and mind. Also, even though as a thesis about the composition of mind Maiese's theory of embodiment faces the sorts of worries just outlined, there is obviously a more sympathetic reading of the embodiment thesis in which the links between body and mind are taken to be causal, not constitutive. And read as a thesis about mind's causal dependency on the body and its activity, the embodiment thesis along with the various considerations Maiese advances in support of the idea that the whole body, not just the brain, 'shapes and structures' mind, do strike me as being illuminating and worthy of further investigation.