Michael Forster

After Herder: Philosophy of Language in the German Tradition, AND German Philosophy of Language: From Schlegel to Hegel and Beyond

Michael Forster, After Herder: Philosophy of Language in the German Tradition, Oxford University Press, 2010, 482pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199228119.

Michael Forster, German Philosophy of Language: From Schlegel to Hegel and Beyond, Oxford University Press, 2011, 350pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199604814.

Reviewed by Fred Rush, University of Notre Dame

Nowadays one main narrative approach to the history of German philosophy of the early nineteenth century involves a distinctive version of the 'back to Kant' ethos. The rallying call 'back to Kant' seems to have originated with Otto Liebmann, whose Kant und die Epigonen (1865) expresses well, if not exactly in the first flush of things, what became a general sentiment among scientifically-minded philosophers in the mid- to late-nineteenth century: that philosophy should be cleansed of unseemly idealism by picking up where Kant left off. The phrase 'where Kant left off' is no throwaway; there can be and have been many views concerning the question of precisely where Kant left off. Neo-Kantians like Helmholtz and Lange took advances in the empirical sciences of their day to show that one must deepen one's commitment to key Kantian doctrines; Helmholtz, for instance, held that research in the physiology of perception mandated adopting Kant's view that 'cause and effect' is an a priori concept. Thus the twist: science done from a more or less materialist perspective in fact ends one up in a non-materialist, or at least non-'naïve' materialist, epistemology. Scientific methodology and the epistemology of science properly diverge. Lange's Geschichte des Materialismus und Kritik seiner Bedeutung in der Gegenwart (1866) puts the point systematically. Of course, in an important sense, to say that materialism is fine as a methodological precept is profoundly un-Kantian -- Kant himself was quite fond of theologically-based regulative constraints on science. But the point was not to preserve every bit of Kant; it was rather to show that the best science ratified the best bits.

The Helmholtz-Lange form of the 'back to Kant' movement left German idealism out in the cold. Indeed, although it was reacting most pointedly to a surge of materialism in the philosophy of physics and biology of its time, putting down idealism was also an explicit and primary aim of Lange's project. Idealism also met direct resistance from materialism in the emerging social sciences, often initiated from within idealism's own ranks. This was the prompt for Benedetto Croce's posing the question of 'what is living and what is dead in the philosophy of Hegel'.[1] Croce's answer was that it is possible and appropriate to preserve aspects of Hegel's social philosophy as 'humanistic' bulwarks against dialectical materialism, and this diagnosis issued in a qualified call 'back to Hegel' that was crucial for Gramsci's brand of Marxism. 'Back to Hegel' is not 'back to Kant' for Croce: along with 'vulgar materialism', he rejects key aspects of Kant's transcendental philosophy.

Taking this together with its counterpart, the neo-Kantian rejection of Hegel, it might stand to reason that 'back to Kant' and 'back to Hegel' are contradictory rallying cries. But, if some advanced, recent scholarship in German philosophy of the late-eighteenth and early-nineteenth centuries is sound, perhaps they are merely contraries, which can be seen as compatible once one adjusts what 'Kant' and 'Hegel' mean in the rival formulations of their positions. For, another version of 'back to Kant' runs through German idealism, understood now as an etiolated form of Kantianism. This version, 'back to Kant and Hegel', is the distinctive version of the 'back to Kant' ethos mentioned at the outset. Work in this vein typically features a Kantian understanding of Hegel's main achievements and has focused especially on topics like the claimed centrality of apperception to accounts of subjectivity and the nature of moral freedom. The approach is both a form of neo-Kantianism and neo-Hegelianism.

Despite real differences on many key points of doctrine, all three 'back to . . .' stories require adaptation of highly committed, systematic philosophical resources to environments that might be thought inimical to their health. They are, all three -- 'back to Kant', 'back to Hegel', and 'back to Hegel as Kant' -- hybrid hothouse flowers. If they flourish at all, they do so only under very precise, controlled conditions, ones that may strain philosophical credulity. One might do better, therefore, to pitch one's tent in none of the three camps. Naturally, one might doubt any one of the many 'back to . . .' stories on all sorts of grounds. Indeed, there are resources for doing so present in German philosophy of the period, and Michael Forster's two interconnected books, After Herder: Philosophy of Language in the German Tradition [=AH] and German Philosophy of Language: From Schlegel to Hegel and Beyond [=GPL], are vigorous and innovative invitations to look at matters quite differently. The central figure in Forster's account is Herder; indeed, the two books offer the most philosophically sustained, searching, and convincing account of Herder's philosophical achievement to date. Back to . . . Herder!?[2]


Promoting Herder to the first rank of classical German philosophy is not an entirely new endeavor; one can trace a powerful lineage of it in the teacher-student line of Isaiah Berlin-Charles Taylor-Frederick Beiser. What is distinctive about Forster's treatment is his insistence on the superiority of Herder to other figures who precede and follow him -- Counter-Enlightenment and Romantic types -- and whom others have discussed in contrast with the development of systematic idealism, e.g., Hamann, Friedrich Schlegel, Schleiermacher, and Wilhelm von Humboldt. The basis for the claimed superiority is the relation of Herder's philosophy of language to his philosophy of mind and to his social philosophy.

As Forster sets the stage, French and British philosophy of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries did not treat language as its main focus, although philosophy of that period did have plenty to say about the nature of language. To put matters broadly, modern philosophy in large part approached language on the model of a code for thought: thought and language are primarily distinct phenomena, language playing the role of vehicle for the transmission of thought, which was considered to be complete and well-formed quite apart from language. This 'thought first' view arose for a complex variety of historical reasons that are themselves highly interesting to ponder, and there were notable partial exceptions to the view present in the modern period. But Forster allows an idealized 'thought first' view to play the role of a backdrop to his main concern, the decisive step in German philosophy away from the idea of language as mere cognitive intermediary. Such idealizations are entirely appropriate; one wouldn't know where to begin without them.

When one turns to a consideration of the 'language first' strain in German philosophy of this period, one immediately faces knotty questions of historical precedence, concerning who was the key revolutionary in the movement. Berlin typically assigns precedence to Hamann over Herder and tends to assimilate many of the latter's views on the thought-language relation to those of the former.[3] This interpretative stratagem allows Berlin to construe Herder in turn as an 'irrationalist' and to draw further negative consequences from that assignment. Forster dissents strongly from this view, and one can see why. Putting Herder in the train of Hamann allows Berlin to downplay the progressive naturalism of Herder's position, and Forster wants none of that downplaying. To this end Forster offers evidence that the idea of linguistic and cognitive co-dependency was already present in Herder's writings prior to substantial influence by Hamann. The evidence seems to me equivocal. Perhaps the best that can be done given the current state of historical knowledge -- as Forster ultimately allows -- is to mark that making more radical the language-thought relationship was in the air and venture that Hamann and Herder developed interlinking accounts from a common base.[4]

What is at issue here, however, is much more than historical house cleaning. There are important conceptual stakes, two of which stand out particularly, concerning: (1) the nature of the relative empirical commitments of Hamann and Herder and (2) the strength of their rival views of the relation of thought to language. (2) is philosophically more important, but (1) deserves brief comment.

Hamann asserted the extraordinarily strong thesis that language and thought are identical; one cannot think without thinking linguistically (AH, pp. 290, 308-09). This is not a 'language of thought' thesis in the contemporary sense. The 'language' that Hamann had in mind was not an innate universal syntactical structure; rather, it was natural language, at least of a sort. The caveat 'at least of a sort' marks the supernatural foundationalism in Hamann's philosophy of language, which accounts for the emergence of human language (and thought) in terms of a theological doctrine of the creative power of divine naming. Hamann's guiding thought was that creation itself was a divine linguistic act (in essence that the thought-language equivalence also holds of God, or holds because of God) and views the individuation of things in terms of their being 'called forth' by divine naming. Such names are absolutely singular; every individual thing is tagged into existence by its own unique name -- in essence a theologically-based theory of logically proper names. Post-lapsarian humans have no direct access to these names, resulting in alienation from both self and world. At our linguistic, albeit 'fallen', best we can attempt to understand ourselves and the world discursively, i.e., by means of general terms that by their very nature abstract away from and ultimately obscure the nature of things.

While both Hamann and Herder are impressed by the social constitution and possible social variance of even quite basic linguistic constituents, and while they both emphasize the interpretative difficulties of establishing overlap between culturally or historically different linguistic communities, Herder is not burdened with a non-naturalistic origin thesis for language (AH, pp. 309-11). This is not just a point about secular tidying up of one's philosophy of language fundamentals; Hamann's understanding of naming marries the thought-language thesis with a negative theological version of mathesis universalis where the actual structure of things can never be known. This invites the following project, which runs contrary to many aspects of Herder's approach to language: attempting to recapture some of the lost pre-lapsarian past by undercutting the fixity of general terms. Hamann thought he had a way to do this, and his prescription has not been without its adherents. The main thrust is to reconceive the primary hold of concepts on the world in terms of the structure of metaphor (or in terms of other poetic forms of language that wear their conceptual indeterminacy on their sleeves). This makes much more explicit that fixity of conceptual terms comes about initially through a process of condensing meaning from less determinate thought. Of course, putting the point in terms of metaphor is cheating a bit: at this early stage of general thought there is no metaphoric thought sensu stricto, since metaphors require some fixity of their terms in order to achieve their focal comparative effects. But metaphors are the best one might do in modeling the non-discursive undergirding of thought from the unavoidable perspective of discursivity. Walter Benjamin, whose eminence as an interpreter of this linguistic tradition in German philosophy persists, was drawn powerfully into the vortex of just this thought. Although Kantians would no doubt think the suggestion perverse, there is a kind of Kantian impulse lurking in the thought: while one can never achieve names, one can asymptotically converge on them -- Kantian regulative reason in reverse.

What differentiates Herder from Hamann in terms that have lasting philosophical interest, however, is the strength of the language-thought thesis: (2) above. While Hamann identifies language and thought, Herder holds the more qualified thesis, in Forster's formulation, that 'thought is essentially dependent upon and bounded by language [;]. . . one cannot think unless one has a language and one can only think what one can express linguistically' (AH, p. 56). Attention naturally falls on the second clause, having to do with thought and linguistic expression, but the first clause is no triviality. In fact, one might think the first clause the more jarring, if one were allied to a strongly disjunctive view of the relation of language to thought.[5] In the second clause, the modal constraint is crucial. In a way (although it is slightly anachronistic to put it this way), what Herder is after has a parallel with Kant's views on the significance of apperception for cognition. It is not necessary that each and every thought be accompanied by the thought that it is a thought, but it is necessary that it be possible for thoughts to be so structured. For Herder, there may be thoughts that are not in fact expressed in language, but they must be so expressible in order to qualify as thoughts. To extend the analogy a bit, in terms of their philosophies of language one might say that Hamann plays Fichte to Herder's Kant. Hamann insists that all thoughts are linguistic, and Fichte held that a kind of self-relation that is logically prior to and constitutive of thought must occur in each and every thought. To be fair, Fichte did not hold this to be apperception in Kant's sense. Still, the contrast between Herder and Hamann is illuminated by the comparison.

Even Herder's more moderate version of the thought-language thesis may seem to land him in the mire of what is often called 'relativism', and Forster addresses this question at several points in both volumes. It is best -- and here I believe Forster would agree -- to treat the concept 'relativism' as an unwelcome and unnecessary artifact of the presence of an equally unwelcome and unnecessary underlying thought. The underlying thought is that true understanding, true meaning, etc. requires absolute invariance, or something approaching it, across a relevant cognitive domain. Sometimes, depending on domain, this seems reasonable; so, for instance, one might insist on this in mathematics or in theoretical physics. Insisting on it across the board, especially when it comes to ethical, political, and aesthetical evaluation, seems highly implausible.

Kant was a formative influence on Herder, but this Kant was the 'pre-critical' Kant, and the attraction of this Kant for Herder resides in the emphasis Kant places in his early writings on skepticism concerning rationalist metaphysics and adherence to a form of empiricism in evaluative contexts. Because Herder ties the possibility of thought and thus of knowledge to the possibility of expressing thought linguistically, and because the resources for linguistic expression differ, sometimes radically, culturally and historically, it is reasonable to pose the question of the extent to which Herder's insights defy the critical Kant's basic epistemological apparatus. One might try to be conciliatory here and argue that it is open to Herder to allow that the schematized Kantian categories hold come what may but that they so underdetermine what anyone who was really interested in experience would credit as being full-blooded 'experience' that such invariance is of little moment.[6] What Herder is doing primarily is what Kant would have termed 'anthropology'.

Herder does not really come head to head with Kant's critical philosophy in a concerted way. His forays into criticism of Kant's transcendental idealism always stem from his own focal interests, e.g., in language, the nature of history, the analysis of art, etc., and not from interest per se in universalism.[7] All told, one has to be uneasy on Herder's behalf with the conciliation. Herder never embraces a priori constraints on experience, which he associates with rationalist metaphysics.[8]For him, Kant was just a rationalist metaphysician who had increased the ante by internalizing the a priori constraints. In a real sense Kant wasn't even a 'good' rationalist by Herder's lights; Herder never credited any account of the mind that involved, as did Kant's own, a modular faculty psychology. At least Wolff had this much right: there is one faculty of mind. That Kant inherited from the empiricist Tetens the idea of discrete faculties whose operation only realized cardinal mental states conjointly was no mitigation.[9] Herder's primary philosophical orientation remained empiricist and naturalist. His concerns about language operate almost entirely at concrete levels of analysis and it is here that -- in social and cultural terms -- he presses issues of interpretation, translation, and the degree of overlap between different conceptual frameworks.[10] His main insight was that the whole project of rationalism, transcendental philosophy included, must give way to naturalism. Even what Kant called facta, i.e., that in terms of which transcendental philosophy regresses to its conclusions, are not written in conceptual stone. From Herder's perspective such purported 'facts' beggar the very concept of a fact.[11]


Herder's influence is not limited to what one now might call 'the philosophy of language'. Indeed, part of the power of Herder's thought is that he denies that the philosophy of language can be circumscribed in the narrow way currently prevalent. His philosophy of language instead properly includes literary theory, the study of history, anthropology, linguistics, etc. After Herder and German Philosophy of Language bring out in rich detail the organizing power of Herder's views on language for the emergence of what are now quite distinct social sciences. Forster covers much ground here, advocating the significance of Herder on a number of fronts: the birth of modern anthropology (AH, pp. 199 ff.), the development of political liberalism (AH, pp. 244 ff.), and the emergence of linguistics as a social science (GPL, pp. 109 ff.; AH, pp. 391 ff.). I focus my remarks on Herder's hermeneutics, which contribute to several of these innovations.

Commensurate with the moderate conception of the linguistic dependency and boundedness of thought, Herder holds that there is no bar in principle to understanding others in more or less their own terms. Of course, one won't be able to understand matters precisely from another's point of view, if what that means is that one must understand matters with all of the emotional, aesthetic, and psychological resonances that another experiences. But that is an impossible task, and more to the point, an unnecessary one; one can understand what another means without being the other person. In Herder's view understanding is public, as is meaning, and it is perfectly permissible to think that one might understand what another means even better than she does herself at least in some cases. Herder is one of the originators of what has come to be known as social externalism in the theory of meaning, and this has strong bearing on his theory of interpretation.

Modern European hermeneutics first developed in the context of Christian biblical scholarship, migrating into the general account of linguistic meaning and into more secular social philosophy in the late-eighteenth century.[12] Forster is certainly right to credit Herder as a prime mover in its philosophical, literary, and social scientific development. What sets Forster's treatment of the topic apart from other accounts is his claim that Herder is both misunderstood and unfairly discounted relative to later figures in classical German hermeneutics like Schleiermacher, Dilthey, and Gadamer. Schleiermacher is in better shape than the others, according to Forster. First, Schleiermacher does not commit the cardinal mistake of much twentieth-century European hermeneutics and hold the view that understanding another's meaning is insuperably problematic on more or less Cartesian grounds, at least not in his better moments. Nor does Schleiermacher rely on empathic projection as a necessary means to bridge a perceived gulf between one's own understanding and the understanding that is the target of interpretation, as Gadamer claims he does (AH, pp. 370-71).[13] When one strips away the anachronistic overlay provided by post-Schleiermacher hermeneutical theory, one is left with a core position that, in fact, is quite close to Herder's.

Forster also contends that Herder's views on interpretation and translation are superior to Schleiermacher's in one very important respect. In spite of his better judgment, Schleiermacher sometimes can fall into the pit of the a priori, attracted to the idea that 'conceptualization can never be exactly the same between two people' (AH, p. 419, emphasis in original). More positively, Forster credits Schleiermacher with a number of important 'refinements' to Herder's initial position having to do with the importance of holism in interpretation (AH, pp. 420-21). Schleiermacher, much more than Herder, appreciates that holistic constraints in some cases can operate so powerfully from within the frameworks of the interpreter and what is interpreted that the task of the interpreter/translator is made quite difficult. But it is crucial to keep in mind that this is not a matter of an a priori block to interpretation, but rather an empirical concern with establishing enough context for intelligibility. Schlegel had already insisted on this, and Forster's treatment of Schlegel in this and in other contexts is quite insightful.[14]


Forster is right that this is a significant advance on Herder, amplifying the decisive shift away from the idea of translation as recodification to the pragmatic idea of translation as interpretation. Consider an extended example. In the novel Despair, Nabokov employs riddles at two crucial points in the narrative, the solution of which requires answering a series of questions posed by a character in conversation, which answers are used as phonetic constituents of the syllables of the solution to the riddle. Nabokov wrote Despair in Russian under the pseudonym of 'Sirin' during his period of expatriation in Berlin. It was first serialized and then was published as a whole in 1936. A year later Nabokov's own English translation of the book appeared (his revision of that translation came out in 1965).[15]Translation is in any event tricky; translating Nabokov's work, in which word-play is omnipresent yet not at all ornamental, is even trickier, and self-translation allows for that linguistic hall of mirrors to ramify. Nabokov delighted in exploiting this effect. The first of the integral puns in Despair is illustrative of a point brought out well by the Herder-inspired view of hermeneutics, especially when considered across the linguistic divide of translation from Russian into English.

Two protagonists of the novel, the married couple Hermann and Lydia, are readying for sleep, conversing in bed. Their discussion concerns Hermann's failing business, the manufacture of chocolate. In the English version of the novel, Hermann hears a sound on the street outside, which is reported by him onomatopoetically as 'Chock', stimulating the riddle he then poses to Lydia (citing from the English translation): 'My first is that sound, my second is an exclamation, my third will be prefixed to me when I'm no more; and my whole is my ruin'. The English solution to the riddle is 'chocolate', i.e., (1) 'chock' + (2) 'O!' + (3) 'late'. 'Chocolate' ('шоколад') is a French loan-word in Russian, as it is in English. One might think, then, that it would be relatively easy for Nabokov to render the answer to the riddle in English from the original Russian, given that there is sufficient phonic overlap due to the common root in French and the phonetic resources native to both English and Russian to mimic the French word. The first syllable might be handled simply by the onomatopoeia. Hermann believes the sound results from someone hitting lampposts with a cane. This attribution of sound to source is important because it gives Nabokov the option of dictating the linguistic rendering of the sound. Presupposing the absence of a strong onomatopoetic convention governing such sounds, he can tailor the sound to the syllable. But that is not at all the route Nabokov takes in the Russian; he makes things hard on himself in the English translation by recasting all of the clues.

The Russian text does not contain an onomatopoetic representation of the sound; instead, Hermann says that (my translation) the 'first means "hot" ["жар"] in French'. The answer: 'chaud'. He continues: 'they impale Turks on my second'. The answer: 'a stake', in transliterated Russian 'kol' ('кол'). And: 'my third is a place where we shall all end up sooner or later'. The answer: 'Hell', in transliterated Russian, 'Ad' ('Ад'), i.e. 'Hades'. Taken together, the Russian yields: (1) 'chaud' + (2) 'kol' + (3) 'ad', a phonetic equivalent of 'шоколад'. Once one has Nabokov's solution for the translation of the riddle as a whole, one can see the original riddle in a new light. The translation and its source, so to speak, amplify one another's latencies. The key is in what Nabokov denied himself in the translation. Given the status of the Russian and English words as loan-words from the same source, he could have deployed the first clue, as stated in the Russian, in precisely the same way -- 'chaud' works in either context. The English translation, unlike the Russian, presents the sound as part of the clue. Whatever the reason for the change -- and one can put forth a number of possible interpretations here -- the fact that the change was made now places Nabokov's original literary intent in a broader context, highlighting as well what avenues in the Russian were not taken. Nabokov's view seems to be not so much that translations and interpretations are two essentially distinct matters; rather translation involves interpretive decision-making, even when the translator and the translated are one and the same.[16]

Nabokov's practice here is, I would suggest, emblematic of Schleiermacher's improvement on Herder. The difficulty of the interpretative task invites an exercise in adaptive imagination and a rigorous attention to holistic constraints at work in each of the schemes relevant to the translation -- Russian, English, and their intersection. There is no a priori defeatism about the very possibility of translation, and yet there is also no cavalier attitude toward the interpretative task at hand. Nabokov capitalizes on just this; the translation is a small wonder because of the way he refuses both ways out of the essential task. Nabokov's achievement is to let the difficulty of the task to be present in the work under an aspect of lightness. As with all worthwhile prestidigitation, the artistic hand recedes in advance of the seemingly instantaneous effect.


Forster also offers a glimpse into the possible contemporary relevance of German philosophy of language that follows the path Herder clears. Given the proximity of the philosophy of language to the emergence of linguistics in the German tradition that stems from Herder, it stands to reason that the most direct point of contact with recent philosophy of language would be with philosophical theories that take developments in linguistics seriously, an emphasis more common in Europe than it is in the United States and Great Britain.[17]

Forster argues that Herder's more open-textured account of language is invulnerable to objections that hobble modern Bloomfieldian linguistics, in particular Chomsky's concept of universal grammar. Forster notes that Chomsky congratulates von Humboldt on his conception of universal grammar, but for Forster this is a retrograde aspect of von Humboldt, one that turns out not to be present in Herder at all. One might think then that the Boas-Sapir-Whorf line would fare better in Forster's estimation as an inheritor of the German tradition in philosophical linguistics (Sapir was Bloomfield's teacher, so there is poignancy to the question of inheritance). And it does: while the Sapir-Whorf hypothesis (i.e., different grammars produce different conceptualizations) is 'controversial,' it is 'likely correct . . . in some form' (GPL, p. 117 and n.54).

On the European side of things, the decisive influence is Heidegger and, according to Forster, that is all for the worse. Both the main Heideggerian camps -- Gadamer's hermeneutics and Derrida's splicing of Heidegger and Saussure -- tend to introduce unwelcome global skepticism concerning the possibility of linguistic understanding. Although Forster does not exactly unfold a roadmap, he seems to view the way ahead in the philosophy of language to consist in being alive to developments in associated disciplines that take their evidence as it comes, realistically, and do not indulge in the kind of antecedent gerrymandering that he sees as one of the retrograde aspects to the tradition that he admires and a dominant theme in much other modern philosophy of language.

After Herder and German Philosophy of Language are books to be reckoned with and will amply repay the most serious attention from historians of philosophy, philosophers of language, and social theorists. While there is significant overlap between chapters due to the origins of some of them as separate essays published previously, and while some of the pieces are synoptic, taken as a whole these essays comprise a cohesive alternative vision for both the philosophy of language and the history of the period. Along with a philosophical reconsideration of Goethe, reevaluating Herder is of the utmost importance to a balanced view of the German philosophical tradition and of its philosophical resources.

To return to the initial question: is the slogan 'back to Herder' apt? Probably not. The object of a slogan must present itself, or be presented, as a stable point of reference. For some, Kant is such a figure. I think this is an error. Kant is much more a transitional figure, simultaneously inhabiting two very different philosophical worlds at their interstices: one rooted in theologically-based teleology and the other in naturalism. But there can be no mistake about Herder in this regard. He is patently many-sided and, for that, a fitting figure for consideration in genealogies of many concepts that have come to play significant roles in various philosophical disciplines. But being of genealogical importance is precisely not to be an appropriate object for 'back to . . .' sloganeering.[18]

[1] Ciò che è vivo e ciò che è morto della filosofia di Hegel (Bari: Laterza, 1906).

[2] Forster never uses or suggests use of this slogan.

[3] See Vico and Herder (New York: Vintage, 1976) and The Magus of the North (New York: Farrar, Straus, Giroux, 1993).

[4] The idea that thought and language are much more fundamentally and intimately related than the standard Enlightenment picture took them to be was by no means even a minority view at the time of Herder's earliest writings: see, e.g., Mendelssohn, Abbt, Süßmilch, Rousseau, Leibniz, etc., as Forster acknowledges. Forster writes that aspects of Herder's mature views on the thought-language relation are present in writings as early as the mid-1760s. But even here Herder flirts with Hamann's identity claim (but not his nominalism) (AH, p. 58 n.20).

[5] For example, Descartes held that accounting for language-use required adverting to the existence of thinking souls, but he did not hold (nor need he have, on the basis of his views) that thought presupposed language. 'Reply to Hobbes', AT VII: 178. Even Descartes' tentative hypotheses concerning 'pure' or 'artificial' languages do not go so far as to require the dependency of thought on language -- quite the reverse.

[6] The degree to which the basic framework of Kant's transcendental idealism underdetermines empirical regularity is a point of contention in the secondary literature that I cannot address here.

[7] Herder's most interesting engagement with Kant seems to me to be in the philosophy of art. It is no accident that aesthetics is the domain in which Kant most proximately (and problematically) associates issues of the a priori form of experience with the 'lived contingency' of empirical agents. This must have seemed to Herder an attractive point of entry into Kant's thought, even though he is quite critical of Kant's way of handling the issue.

[8] Sometimes it seems that Herder does embrace some such constraints en passant. But that is a mirage. In such passages -- many occur in his writings on the philosophy of history -- Herder proposes deep commonalities between epochs that are recognized due to increased sensitivity of the historian in discerning the relevant historical features, not commonalities that result from any a priori constraints operative in the self-conceptions of the historical agents. No doubt Herder overstated historical continuity in several cases, but his tendency to do so is not the result of smuggling a priori constraints into his account; it is just bad historical judgment.

[9] The idea is also present in, e.g., Baumgarten. Lewis White Beck, Early German Philosophy (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1969) is still an excellent introduction to the topic.

[10] Thinking of matters in this way places Herder in the camp of Friedrich Schlegel. To my mind the intersection of linguistic rationality and conceptualization is the chief distinction between Novalis and Schlegel. Novalis is concerned with foundationalism and with Fichte in a way that Schlegel, at least in his better moments, is not. Thus, Novalis attempts in his Fichte-Studien to generate an a priori reconstruction of the categories in terms of the ordo inversus. Schlegel is basically indifferent to this; he takes on board the thrust of Novalis's negative critique of Fichte as compatible in result with his own findings, but does not endorse the project's responsiveness to the a priori.

[11] There are several points in the two volumes where Forster discusses doctrines in the philosophy of language that attempt to divide up neatly levels of language on a similar basis. While he allows that such a division in grammar between the universal and the particular is not in itself a problem, Forster emphasizes that a number of well-known attempts to model problematic cases in terms of alleged universalities have come to grief (or should have), e.g., von Humboldt's, Chomsky's (GPL, p. 123 f.)

[12] This is not to discount at all either the importance or the distinctive character of Judaic theories and practices of biblical interpretation, especially in Hamann. Such theories and practices, and especially their connections to negative conceptions of theological understanding, are essential to understanding the full range of options available to nineteenth- and twentieth-century European social philosophy.

[13] Forster also charges Dilthey with this understanding of Schleiermacher, and this seems to me correct. On the received view of Dilthey's own hermeneutic theory, he allots to empathy a central role. So, it may seem that Dilthey's interpretation of Schleiermacher displays a pardonable form of what the literary theorist Harold Bloom calls a 'strong reading' of his own views on the nature of interpretation back into Schleiermacher. But the matter is a bit more complex. Dilthey only rarely uses the term 'empathy' (Einfühlung); when he speaks of hermeneutic understanding, his main term of art is simply 'understanding' (das Verstehen) and usesdas Hineinversetzen or das Nacherleben to refer to acts of experiencing things from another's point of view. True, Verstehen is a loaded term in this intellectual tradition, but this still suggests a much more Herder-like view. The culprit here I think is Gadamer, who likely is following Heidegger's interpretation of Dilthey as inappropriately 'subjective'. On the other hand, Dilthey, but not Gadamer, incorrectly views Schleiermacher's hermeneutic theory as essentially ahistorical.

[14] The degree to which holism can overlap with or replace a prioricity as an integrating and stabilizing force in the constitution of concepts, conceptual change, and experience is a recurrent topic in this period in the history of philosophy, cf. Schlegel, Hegel, et al.

[15] Despair (London: John Long, 1937, rev. ed., New York: Putnam, 1966). Russian text in: Собрание сочинений русского периода в пяти томах, vol. II (St. Petersburg: Symposium, 1999).

[16] One delicious possibility: that Nabokov thought of the two renderings of the riddle at the same time and as interconnected, forming something on the order of a single system, comprised of two elements that mirror one another. His translation of Despair came only a year after its publication in Russian, so such a thought is not beyond the pale. I have not been able to consult the very rare first translation of Despair to determine whether the revised translation of 1966 differs in its rendering of the riddle. The very useful Jane Grayson, Nabokov Translated: A Comparison of Nabokov's Russian and English Prose (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1977) does not mention any relevant variance (see pp. 59-82).

[17] This explains Forster's dismissal in the early sections of these works of much current Anglo-American philosophy of language that features the concepts 'translation' and 'interpretation', e.g., Quine and Davidson (AH, p. 6 n.8). Forster also views Herder-inspired philosophy of language as a corrective to Frege's linguistic Platonism, which holds the philosophy of language hostage to implausible accounts of linguistic rules and rule-following. Forster's own leanings are distinctly Wittgensteinian.

[18] Thanks to Karl Ameriks for his useful comments on a prior version of this review essay and to Michael Forster for his generous and helpful responses to it.