2011.11.34

Michael Potter and Tom Ricketts (eds.)

The Cambridge Companion to Frege

Michael Potter and Tom Ricketts (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Frege, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 639pp., $38.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521624794.

Reviewed by Jeremy Heis, University of California, Irvine


The long-awaited publication of The Cambridge Companion to Frege is a major event in Frege scholarship. Filling over 600 pages, the 14 essays are closely argued, ambitious, and often philosophically highly novel. In terms of its philosophical penetration and comprehensive coverage, The Cambridge Companion to Frege compares to Michael Dummett's classic Frege: Philosophy of Language. Every serious reader of Frege should read it.

According to the publisher's blurbs, Cambridge Companions are intended to be able to serve as introductory reference works for non-specialists and students -- even upper-level undergraduates. As any consumer of Companions knows, though, different volumes in the series range considerably in the comparative weight afforded to accessibility to students versus interest for specialists. Non-specialists and teachers looking to recommend books for students should know that the editors of this volume clearly intended to put much more weight on the latter.

Many of the essays are animated by a specific vision of Frege scholarship. Frege is often approached by contemporary philosophers as the inventor (or discoverer) of technical or philosophical tools -- polyadic logic, naïve set theory, Fregean abstraction, Frege Arithmetic, "Frege's Puzzle," the compositionality of meaning, the intensionality of propositional attitude ascriptions, modes of presentation -- that can be lifted out of Frege's works and put into our collective philosophical toolbox. This way of appropriating Frege's works, though certainly defensible and useful in its own right, tends to obscure the deep systematicity of his work and, according to many authors in this collection, overlooks the ways that Frege's philosophy differs fundamentally from the analytic philosophy of language, logic, and mathematics that was written after his death. To counteract this, the editors gave the authors in this collection the freedom to develop systematic and wide-ranging interpretations of Frege's thought in its own terms.

Inevitably, the comprehensiveness characteristic of a reference work was less of a priority. For instance, William Taschek's "On Sense and Reference: A Critical Reception" is devoted largely to developing a novel Neo-Fregeanism that he argues is both preferable to contemporary Neo-Russellian views like Nathan Salmon's and closer to Frege's actual views than other contemporary "Neo-Fregean" views. But he does not set it as a goal to discuss the critical reception of Fregean sense in later thinkers such as Carnap or Church, as a more encyclopedic work on the same topic would do. Another consequence of this editorial approach is that many of the essays are quite long: the rich and ambitious works by Tom Ricketts ("Concepts, Objects, and the Context Principle") and Michael Kremer ("Sense and Reference: the Origins and Development of the Distinction"), for example, are each 70 pages. These hefty essays together make up a hefty volume: of the ninety-two other Cambridge Companions to Philosophy currently listed at CUP's site, The Cambridge Companion to Frege is longer than all but one of them.

Obviously, these comments about the aim and scope of the volume are not meant as criticisms. What the collection loses in accessibility to beginners and encyclopedic coverage it makes up for in interpretive depth and originality. Frege specialists will also see that the volume comprises essays written from two very different interpretive camps. I'll elaborate more on the differences below, but one rough way of characterizing the different kinds of interpretation is their relation to Dummett. The first camp (represented by essays 1, 4, 5,9 and 12) sees itself as carrying on his approach, while the second camp (represented by most of the remaining essays) disagrees fundamentally with some of Dummett's assumptions.  (This does not mean that the full diversity of Frege scholarship is on display here. For example, neither the work of contemporary Neo-Fregean philosophers of mathematics, nor Tyler Burge's influential reading, nor the historical style initiated by Hans Sluga are represented.)

This volume has been in the works for quite some time. Readers should be aware that many of the papers are over a decade old now and thus do not engage with the very latest scholarship. Warren Goldfarb’s essay was published elsewhere in the interim, and the content of Joan Weiner’s was published in two separate journal papers.

This review will have two sections. Since many -- though not all -- of the essays engage in the involved and multi-front debate between the two camps I mentioned above, the first section will lay out the fundamental ideas of each interpretation and then the various moves (and counter-moves) that are presented by the authors in the collection. My goal will not be to adjudicate the debate, but to describe it and identify the questions left open by the essays in the volume. In the second section, I'll go through the essays one by one.

§I. The Central Debate

In his influential Frege: Philosophy of Language and in subsequent writings, Dummett defended the following interpretive claims:

  1. Frege gave a semantic theory of the workings of language.
  2. This theory is a form of realism,
  3. whose articulation makes ineliminable use of a truth-predicate applied to sentences (or the thoughts expressed by them).
  4. This theory, when applied to Frege's logical symbolism ("Begriffsschrift"), justifies its logical laws and rules of inference, by
  5. stating that the conclusion of each inference licensed by his system is indeed a semantic consequence of its premises.

The opening sections of Peter Sullivan's paper, "Dummett's Frege," defend 1, and Richard Heck's paper, "Frege and Semantics," defends 4 and 5 explicitly. Many readers will be surprised that some (or even any) of these claims are even up for debate. However, beginning in the 1960s, Burton Dreben and Jan Van Heijenoort questioned key elements of this reading. In this volume, Joan Weiner, Warren Goldfarb, Ricketts, and Kremer question all five of these claims.

Let's begin with claim 3, which concerns Frege's use of a truth-predicate. No one disputes that Frege wrote extensively about truth. Notoriously, in fact, he argued that the True and the False are objects that are named by sentences. It follows that

"Socrates is mortal" is true

would be better expressed as

Socrates is mortal = the True.

And this sentence is no more about something linguistic, a sentence, than

Socrates = the teacher of Plato

is about names. The salient interpretive issue is therefore whether Frege used (or needed to use) a truth predicate to make semantic claims: claims that attribute the property being true to sentences or thoughts (where thoughts are for Frege the senses of sentences).

Both Weiner and Goldfarb argue that Frege did not -- and did not need to -- make use of a truth predicate to state the logical laws of his Begriffsschrift. Frege's practice contrasts, they argue, with a popular contemporary conception of logic represented by Quine. On this view, a logical law such as

If p, then if q then p

is not an interpreted sentence in the object-language, but a schematic sentence in the meta-language. This schema is valid (a logical law) because it is true under any interpretation. To say that this logical law holds whatever p and q might be, we need to practice semantic ascent and attribute a truth-predicate to a bit of language:

All sentences of the form 'If p, then if q then p' are true.

Frege, though, does not need to practice semantic ascent and use a truth predicate to state his logical laws. Since sentences are names and truth values objects, Frege can express the logical law using standard objectual quantifiers:

For all p, for all q: if p, then if q then p.

This sentence makes no use of a truth predicate, and it is no more about language than "All humans are mortal" is.

Though Frege -- unlike Quine -- can express his logical laws without a truth predicate, it does not follow that Frege does not need a truth predicate to justify the truthof his logical laws. Perhaps Frege justifies the truth of each logical law by arguing metalinguistically that every sentence of that form is true. Weiner argues, however, that Frege explicitly holds that the only possible justification of a logical law is a proof of it from the more basic logical laws, and the basic laws themselves admit of no justification (60). Goldfarb adds that for Frege the justification of a truth just is a "logical proof of that claim from whatever first principles are its ultimate basis"; the logical laws and rules of inference are thus presupposed in any justification, and it makes no sense to ask for a justification of logical laws and rules themselves (78). In any case, such a "justification" of modus ponens, say, would be circular, since the metatheoretic proof that all instances of modus ponens are truth-preserving would itself need to employ modus ponens (80).

Heck replies that, though a semantic proof of the truth of a logical law may indeed be circular, nevertheless a proof that a truth is a logical law need not be circular. To justify the logical truth of "if p, then if q then p," one could give a proof that itself uses that law (and thus presupposes its truth) without thereby begging the question whether it is a logical truth (345). Heck argues that Frege recognizes that someone may be content with the truth of a law and still intelligibly doubt whether the law is properly logical: indeed, he claims that Frege recognizes this possibility for his notorious Basic Law V (349-50) (and even more controversially, Heck claims that Frege himself had this attitude toward the Axiom of Choice (348)). Now how could Frege (or anyone else) justify that a truth is a logical truth? Plausibly, this justification would require Frege to have some general conception of what a logical truth is (such as being schematized by a schema that is true under every interpretation), and showing that a candidate truth fits that conception.

However, Goldfarb argues that Frege "frames no overarching characteristic that demarcates the logical laws from others" (72), and indeed that Frege ruled out the very possibility of giving such overarching characteristics. No complete argument for this strong claim appears in the volume. Goldfarb gives two arguments for weaker claims: that Frege's talk of the generality of logic does not constitute a demarcation (73, 353-7), and that Frege's views on truth rule out a demarcation that makes use of semantic notions. (More on the latter argument shortly.) Heck agrees that Frege had not found a principle of demarcation, but he cannot see that Frege denied the intelligibility in principle of searching for one:

if Frege thinks the epistemological status of Basic Law V is subject to rational debate, then any principles or claims to which he might be inclined to appeal in attempting to resolve the question will constitute an inchoate (if incomplete) conception of the logical (352).

If Frege's views precluded the very possibility of such a conception, the effect would be to make the question whether a candidate truth is a logical truth not a substantive question -- and thereby render Frege's logicism itself not a substantive thesis. Heck's hunch, like Dummett's,[1] is that Frege recognized the need for a conception of the logical and developed his semantic notions of sense, reference, etc. in the service of a projected but never completed semantic conception of logical truth and consequence (357).

Goldfarb and Weiner believe that Frege, since he does not adopt a semantic conception of logic like Quine's, has no need for completeness or soundness proofs for his logical system Begriffsschrift. Heck finds this claim incredible, flying in the face of Frege's own practice in Basic Laws. Concerning completeness, Frege surely sought to minimize the number of basic laws, and like any good mathematician recognized the possibility that his choice of basic laws might be too restricted and leave some truths out. A completeness proof would rule out that possibility once for all. Further, Heck argues that -- even if we grant that Frege did not need a truth-predicate to express his logical laws or to justify their truth, and that Frege had no overarching conception of the logical -- it does not follow that Frege would not have seen the need for a soundness proof. After all, Basic Laws introduces a new symbolism and a new axiomatic system, and Frege, if he is to avoid formalism, needs to explain to his reader the meanings of the sentences in his language, and he needs to explain in particular why the primitive sentences in the language express senses that are true. But this is just an argument for soundness, and in fact on Heck's reading Part I of Basic Laws does provide a "correct proof that the logical fragment of the Begriffsschrift -- that is, Frege's formulation of second-order logic -- is sound" (376).

Many sections in Part I of Basic Laws (especially §30-1) certainly look like semantic justifications of Frege's Begriffsschrift. The "no metatheory" interpretation will be implausible unless a convincing alternative reading can be given of these texts. Weiner takes up this task (here and in other writings).[2] She points out that Frege, in introducing and explaining his basic laws and inference rules, consistently says things like

p is the true (i.e., p = the True)

and avoids making overtly semantic claims, like saying that "p" names the True.[3] In the places where Frege is using semantic language (as in §31, where Frege shows that his eight primitive names have a Bedeutung), Weiner (and Ricketts, see p. 197) argue that Frege is giving what he calls "elucidations." The simplest case of an elucidation is where Frege explains to his reader what his primitive terms mean: these elucidatory sentences are not definitions (because the terms are primitive) and they are not axioms (because a reader has to understand the terms before she can understand an axiom). Weiner argues that Frege's notion of elucidation is actually quite wide: it comprises every sentence whose role is to contribute to the propadeutic, and not the theory, of a science. In this wide sense, even arguments (like §31 of Basic Laws) can be elucidatory, and thus not part of the science of logic.

A distinguishing feature of this "no metatheory" interpretation then is the wide application of the notion of elucidation within Frege's writings. Ricketts, for instance, argues that the Kerry paradox ("The concept horse is not a concept"), and indeed any of Frege's uses of "concept" and "object" as contrastive predicates, are elucidatory. Ricketts grants that the Kerry paradox could be avoided metalinguistically: we can say that the predicate "______ is a horse" is unsaturated, and not saturated. However, it is tempting to say that this fact about the predicate is grounded in facts about what the predicate names. More generally, the fact that no predicate names both a concept and an object seems to be grounded in the apparent fact that no concept is an object.

Unfortunately, the sentence "No concept is an object," though not overtly paradoxical, is in fact inexpressible in Begriffsschrift, given the type distinctions in the symbolism. One route is to claim that the sentence is trying to express an ineffable truth. Ricketts denies that Frege has any room in his thought for ineffable truths. Instead, Ricketts claims that this sentence is elucidatory -- it provides to the uninitiated a route into understanding the fact that expressions in Begriffsschrift are typed. "The master of Begriffsschrift is free to discard the contrasting use in Frege's elucidations of the predicates 'object' and 'concept', of 'saturated' and 'unsaturated', as so much hand-waving. There is no residue that goes unexpressed in Begriffsschrift" (193). Ricketts thus motivates the wide use of the notion of elucidation needed for the "no metatheory" interpretation by showing that Frege needs such a wide notion in his writings on concepts and objects. (This reading also is intended to make it more plausible that apparent semantic truths (e.g., that predicates name concepts) can be similarly "discarded," and therefore have no place in the science of logic.)

Still, though, even if Frege does have a wide notion of elucidation, why argue that Frege's apparent semantic arguments belong in the propadeutic and not the theory of logic? On the "no metatheory" reading, it is because Frege not only does not use or need a truth predicate in stating or justifying his logical laws; Frege in fact denies that there is a truth predicate under which falls all and only true thoughts (or sentences). As Kremer (266) and Goldfarb (74) point out, there are many passages in Frege's writings where he appears to deny that truth is a property of sentences or thoughts.[4] A thought relates to truth as sense to reference, not object to property. For Frege, judging is the advance from thought to truth value, not predicating a property of a thought. If we take these passages very seriously, it follows that Frege would not allow a soundness proof -- a proof that every sentence provable in the language is true -- as part of the science of logic. "True" when used like a predicate is like "concept" when used as a contrastive predicate with "object": usable only in the propadeutic, not the theory, of logic.

In his paper, Kremer draws radical conclusions from this view of truth. If there were a relation (named by the word "determines") that relates senses to references, then truth would be a predicate of senses: we could say

The sense of p is true iff the sense of p determines the True.

So there is no such relation between senses and references (269), and -- inasmuch as semantics would state facts about the conditions under which thoughts are true, or words of the language refer to their referents -- there cannot be a science of semantics or even semantic facts. But things get worse. Frege held that words like "Odysseus" have sense but no reference, and sentences like "Odysseus was set ashore at Ithaca" express thoughts but have no truth value. But without a relation likedetermines we cannot say that the sense of "Odysseus" fails to determine a reference. Indeed, there cannot be two distinct semantic relations in which a name can stand to a sense and to a reference, respectively. If there were, then we could define a determines relation after all:

The sense S determines the referent B iff there is a name n that expresses S and designates B.

Kremer concludes the Frege could not consistently hold onto one of his deeply held views: the possibility of sense without reference (290-2; Weiner provides a different take on pages 61-2).

Some readers will decide that these conclusions are too much to swallow, and choose instead to interpret Frege's remarks on truth differently. Kremer and Goldfarb argue, however, that allowing a truth predicate would fundamentally alter deep aspects of Frege's thought. According to Kremer, when Frege argues that thoughts relate to truth as sense to reference, not object to property, he is insisting that judgment is "something quite peculiar and incomparable" (266)[5] -- and thus maintaining the special status of sentence meaning that Frege earlier expressed with his famous Context Principle. Goldfarb argues that when Frege denies that there is a truth predicate, he is asserting that "there is no theory of how the thoughts expressed by sentences are determined to be true or false by the items referred to in them." Frege therefore cannot be a realist of the sort Dummett alleges. More elusively, Goldfarb claims that Frege's conception of truth is "immanent within our making of judgements and inferences," which conception Goldfarb claims is opposed to realism (75).

Weiner adds a second line of defense. If Frege countenances semantic facts (such as the soundness or completeness of a formal language), and includes these facts as parts of logic, he would then maintain that logic (or at least a part of it) is not about everything, but instead about words and the senses of words. Frege, however, insisted that logic is completely general -- its laws quantify over everything, and its primitive vocabulary is utilized in every special science (56). Goldfarb calls this Frege's "universalist conception of logic" (68, 169). By this Goldfarb seems to mean primarily that Frege thinks of logical laws as completely general, and so (since truth values are objects) is able to frame his logical laws as general truths without semantic ascent. But, given this more recent argument from Weiner, many of the authors in this collection seem to think that the "universalist conception" entails that no semantic facts are included in the science of logic.

This I take to be the state of the dialectic after all of the arguments from The Cambridge Companion are in. As I see it, the "no metatheory" interpreters owe us a story of how Frege can countenance no general theory of logicality while still maintaining that the logical status of a basic law is a substantive question. They also need to give plausible readings of Frege's apparent semantic arguments in part I of Basic Laws. Those in Dummett's tradition need, on the other hand, a convincing alternative reading of Frege's apparent claims that truth is not a predicate.

§II. The Essays

Potter's "Introduction" does a good job of giving an overview, in thirty short pages, of Frege's life, his major works, and their reception. (Indeed, I think it the best introductory essay of its kind and length that I am aware of.) It is written from a broadly Dummettian point of view. Potter also gives a sympathetic one-page characterization of Neo-Fregean philosophy of mathematics -- the volume's longest discussion of this active field of Frege research. Potter does not, however, give an overview of the chapters in the volume -- an unfortunate omission, given that the complexity and size of many of the papers would have made an overview helpful for the reader.

The content of roughly the second half of Weiner's deeply interesting "Understanding Frege's Project" concerns Frege's conception of truth, which I discussed above. (To avoid repetition, I'll focus my discussion in this section on material not discussed already in §I.) She begins with a puzzle. Surely, if Frege wants to define "1", he needs to assure us that his definition refers to the same object that we, prior to reading Frege, referred to with our numeral "1." But why does Frege never argue that his definition does in fact corefer with other mathematicians' use of "1"? Her solution is radical: on Frege's view, before his definition, the numeral "1" had no meaning.[6] Indeed, for Frege truth is obtained (and words designate referents) only in a complete science with clearly identified basic laws, primitive vocabulary and unambiguous definitions. (Frege's Basic Laws would then have been the first science.) Not only did Frege's project not integrally involve giving a theory of meaning for natural language, as Dummett argued: for Weiner's Frege, words in natural language do not even have meanings.

Goldfarb's "Frege's Conception of Logic" contrasts what he calls Frege's "universalist conception of logic" with the contemporary "semantic conception" exemplified by Quine.

The first half of Sullivan's "Dummett's Frege" sympathetically reconstructs Dummett's argument from the opening chapters of Frege: Philosophy of Language that Frege's logicist project necessitated that he give a theory of meaning. The second half of the paper tries to resolve a paradox that arises for Dummett's Frege. Dummett believes that Frege wanted to fashion a compositional theory of meaning that explains how a speaker of a language can understand novel sentences in that language. This led Dummett to distinguish, on Frege's behalf, between the simple predicates the grasp of which is needed to understand a novel sentence and the complex predicate into which an already understood sentence can be decomposed. A paradoxical consequence is that Frege would have to distinguish in the sentence "Socrates is mortal" the simple predicate "______ is mortal" from the complex predicate "x is mortal." Sullivan argues that the distinction in this case is only apparent, and the paradox is resolved.

Alex Oliver, in his "What is a Predicate?", distinguishes five different candidate accounts of what a predicate is: (i) a plain expression like "is mortal"; (ii) a disinterpreted schema like "is mortal" where x is a schema, not an object language variable; (iii) a function that maps, e.g., "Socrates" to "Socrates is mortal"; (iv) a property shared by sentences like "Socrates is mortal," "Caius is mortal"; (v) an expression with a blank like "______ is mortal". He argues convincingly (against Dummett and Geach) that Frege's view is (v), but he argues against Frege that there is no principled reason to prefer any of the five candidates to another.

The interpretation of Frege in Ricketts's paper, "Concepts, Objects, and the Context Principle," is distinctive in two respects. It gives a unified reading of the Context Principle and the concept/object distinction -- two topics infrequently discussed together. And it gives what one might call a logical (as opposed to a semantic orepistemological) reading of the Context Principle. The paper is wide-ranging, highly original, and difficult; it repays close re-readings. The starting point of the paper is the fact that Frege introduces the Context Principle and the concept/object distinction together as two (of the three) fundamental principles of Foundations and that Frege's invocations of the principle in the body of Foundations (crucially in §60ff., where Frege is introducing his definition of number) are interlaced with Frege's employment of the concept/object distinction. Moreover, Frege's definition presupposes an appreciation of the revolutionary features of his new logic -- in particular its treatment of quantification -- which Frege is trying to communicate informally to an uninformed audience. Putting these ideas together, Ricketts claims that the Context Principle "sets forth the connection between logical segmentation and quantificational generality" (149-50). More specifically:

The Context Principle encapsulates the connection between names and quantificational generality: an expression is a meaningful (designating) name by occurring in true or false sentences that express instances of generalizations expressible by replacing the name with a variable. (163)

This use of variables introduces predicates, and this notion of quantification allows for quantifying over predicates. The principle thus motivates a type distinction between proper names and predicates, and the ontological distinction between concepts and objects. Of the many interesting consequences of this approach, I'll highlight two. Against epistemological readings that see the principle as answering the question of how we can know numbers that are not given to us, Ricketts reads the principle as motivating a logical notion of objecthood that makes non-spatial, non-causal objects philosophically innocent (170). Further, Ricketts gives a purely logical reading of the "unsaturatedness" of concepts. By the Context Principle, concepts are distinct from objects inasmuch as second-order quantification is distinct from first-order quantification. But the relation coextensive (which is the surrogate for concepts of the identity relation among objects) presupposes first-order quantification, since F is coextensive with G iff for all x, Fx iff Gx (168).

Kremer's rich and thought provoking "Sense and Reference: The Origins and Development of the Distinction" is a high point of the collection. The paper gives not only a close reading of Frege's paper "On Sense and Reference," but also a convincing and detailed account of Frege's development of this distinction from his early notion of "conceptual content." Kremer argues that Frege had two notions of "conceptual content" in his first book Begriffsschrift: inferential potential for sentences, and referent for names. These notions come in conflict when two expressions with coreferential names differ in inferential potential. Frege solves this conflict by distinguishing cognitive value or sense (which Kremer controversially reads as inferential potential) from reference. Along the way, Kremer elaborates on the "no metatheory" interpretation by arguing that, for Frege, p, "the reference of p", and "the reference determined by the sense of p" all have the same sense. This reading gives Kremer an interesting third way between the traditional readers of "On Sense and Reference" who see Frege as there rejecting the metalinguistic reading of identity proposed in Begriffscchrift and the revisionist readers who see Frege as retaining the metalinguistic reading. For Kremer, "a = b" and "the reference of 'a' = the reference of 'b'" have the same sense, and so there is in fact no difference between an objectual and metalinguistic reading of identity. As I mentioned in §I, this interpretation precludes sense without reference. Kremer closes the paper by arguing that this is what Frege should have said anyway, since senses that determine no reference would have to be understood either psychologistically or platonistically.

The goal of Taschek's "On Sense and Reference: A Critical Reception" is to articulate and defend -- both as a reading of Frege and in its own right -- a logical, as opposed to epistemic, theory of sense. The phenomenon Frege wanted to account for, Taschek claims, is the possibility that two expressions with the same referential truth conditions may nevertheless differ in logically relevant ways. A sense of an expression is that the grasp of which enables a speaker to think about its reference in a way that enables the speaker to appreciate its logical properties. This way of interpreting sense does not require that Frege construe the sense of a singular term in epistemic terms -- say, as a description, a cluster of descriptions, or even a procedure for identifying the referent. (And this is good, he thinks, since these proposals are refuted by standard Kripkean arguments.) Neo-Russellian accounts, like those of Scott Soames or Nathan Salmon, do not even meet the challenge for which Frege introduced the notion of sense. Since they claim that "Superman flies" and "Clark Kent flies" do not differ in semantic (but only pragmatic) content, they cannot respect our deeply held conviction that these sentences differ in logical potential (which, Taschek claims, was Frege's starting point). Taschek ends by acknowledging that his logical account of sense, though it respects the logical differences in coreferential expressions, cannot give an independent explanation of these differences.

Heck's "Frege and Semantics," which I discussed in §I, argues against the "no metatheory" interpreters that Frege does indeed make very serious use of semantic notions. A highlight of his paper is a reading of Frege's use of roman letters, which Heck claims gives an account of quantification that is a "perfectly coherent alternative to Tarski's treatment in terms of satisfaction" (371).

Mark Wilson's "Frege's Mathematical Setting" continues the project of some of Wilson's earlier papers (and similar work by Jamie Tappenden) to locate Frege's philosophical writings within the context of nineteenth-century mathematics. There are at least five goals of this project: to understand how a trained mathematician could end up producing the philosophical works that Frege did; to argue that Frege's motivations were mathematical, and not entirely philosophical; to show, by Frege's example, how rich a philosophy of mathematics engaged with mathematical examples can be; to locate Frege's "absolute logicism" within the context of late nineteenth-century "relative logicist" projects within number theory (i.e., Dedekind's) and geometry (i.e., Von Staudt's); and to identify mathematical examples that illustrate some distinctly Fregean ideas in the philosophy of language. With respect to this final goal, a highlight of the paper is the clear explanation of how the geometer Plücker's use of line coordinates would have given Frege a vivid example of the possibility and utility of "recarving content" that Frege enshrines in the Context Principle. Wilson builds on this point to give a novel and provocative explanation for why Frege was unimpressed with some of Hilbert's geometrical work, such as his proof of the independence of Desargues' Theorem in two-dimensional projective space.

Frege's debate with Hilbert is the dedicated topic of the next chapter (Michael Hallett, "Frege and Hilbert"). Hallett focuses the debate around the importance that Frege (but not Hilbert) assigned to fixed reference. There are three noteworthy features of Hallett's detailed and interesting piece. First, he illuminatingly locates Frege's criticisms of Hilbert's failure to provide fixed referents for the terms in his Foundations of Geometry against Frege's own similar criticisms of the proposal -- which Frege considered but then rejected on account of the notorious Julius Caesar objection -- to found arithmetic on Hume's Principle alone. Second, he argues that Frege's system fails to meet his own standards. Frege's recognized need for elucidations raises the possibility of ineliminable failures to fix reference. More convincingly, Hallett claims that Frege, in his infamous "permutation argument" (Basic Laws, §10), unwittingly gives a general argument that precludes fixity of reference in principle. Third, Hilbert saw this failure of fixed reference as an intrinsic feature of mathematics: it allows a mathematician to study what does not follow in an axiom system. Frege never appreciated, Hallett claims, Hilbert's insight that studying what does not follow from a mathematical theory is just as important as understanding what does.

Peter Milne's wide-ranging essay, "Frege's Folly: Bearerless Names and Basic Law V," opens with the proof within Frege's system of the paradoxical claim that every truth-value gap implies a glut:

It's not true that P and it's not false that P only if it's both true that P and false that P.

Frege, of course, would resolve this paradox by prescribing that a logically perfected language have no bearerless names. Milne advocates instead adopting a semantic (as opposed to Frege's functional) theory of negation. He rejects Frege's solution because it precludes a plausible semantics for ordinary language, and because the set-theoretic paradoxes show that even a scientific language such as Frege's own needs to allow for the possibility of singular terms (like "the extension of x∉x") that are nevertheless bearerless. Milne's essay ends by sketching an alternative system to Frege's in second-order classical free logic.

Milne's essay illustrates very starkly the divisions between the two interpretive traditions represented in the book. Milne assumes, without acknowledging the many readers who disagree, that Frege uses a truth predicate that holds of all and only true sentences, and that Frege wanted a semantics for ordinary language. His derivation of the paradox uses modern notions of entailment, although (as Kremer points out (227-9)) Frege's notion of inference differs fundamentally from modern notions of entailment. Thus, what other readers would see as demonstrating the elucidatory character of truth-talk, Milne sees as exposing a paradox in Frege's thought that needs to be corrected using contemporary logical machinery.

Peter Hylton's very clear, accessible, and illuminating chapter, "Frege and Russell," locates the well-known differences between them (say, concerning sense) in fundamental features of their thought. Russell takes acquaintance, a direct and unmediated relation between the mind and an object, to be the foundation of all our knowledge. This makes him suspicious of intermediate entities, such as Fregean senses, between the mind and the objects it represents. This commitment also makes it difficult for Russell to understand how a proposition could be about something without containing it; Russell's fundamental tool of analysis is therefore the part/whole relation, as opposed to Frege's function/argument analyses. (This part/whole way of thinking motivates Russell's logic, which is not intrinsically typed like Frege's, and is fundamentally intensional.) Moreover, for Hylton, Russell's thought -- but not Frege's -- raises questions that force a foundationalist epistemology, because there is a basic difference between Russell's "object-based" and Frege's "judgment-based" metaphysics.

"Inheriting from Frege: The Work of Reception, as Wittgenstein Did It" -- Cora Diamond's chapter that closes the Companion -- falls into two parts. In the first half she notes two features of Wittgenstein's thought, early and late, that derive from Frege. Wittgenstein, like Frege, insists that differences in logical kind are not differences in properties: Fregean concepts did not differ from objects in having the property being unsaturated; mental processes did not differ from other processes, according to the later Wittgenstein, in having the property being incorporeal. Further, Wittgenstein adopted from Frege's critique of other philosophers a "quasi-moralistic" approach to thinking: a philosopher should mean something "all the way, without dependence on equivocation or evasion" (562). (Diamond might also have emphasized the affinity, implicit in many chapters in this volume, between the "resolute" reading of the Tractatus and the "no metatheory" reading of Frege. On this reading, Frege's audience -- after mastering the Begriffsschrift -- is meant to "discard" Frege's talk of concepts, objects, sense, reference, and truth.) The second half of the paper (§§4-7, with an appendix) gives a provocative reading of Wittgenstein's hard to understand criticism (Tractatus 5.02) that Frege's theory of sentence meaning confuses an argument of a function with an index. Though novel and interesting, I found this reading less persuasive than the simpler and less revisionist reading proffered by Goldfarb (which Diamond considers and rejects in the paper's appendix).[7]



[1] See Michael Dummett, Frege: Philosophy of Language (2nd ed., Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1982) 82-3.

[2] See pages 52-56 of Weiner's chapter in this volume, as well as her paper, "Section 31 Revisited: Frege's Elucidations" (in Erich Reck, ed., From Frege to Wittgenstein, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002).

[3] Heck dismisses this argument, claiming that Frege just wasn't careful about use/mention differences (360).

[4] See, e.g., Frege, Posthumous Writings (edited by Hans Hermes, Friedrich Kambartel, and Friedrich Kaulbach, translated by Peter Lond and Roger White), Oxford: Basil Blackwell. 1979), 234.

[5] Kremer is here quoting "On Sense and Reference," p. 159 in the Frege Reader (edited by M. Beaney, Oxford: Blackwell, 1997), original: 35.

[6] The content of Weiner's chapter has been published in a slightly longer form in two papers from Mind. See "Semantic Descent" (Mind, 114 (2005), 321-54) and "What's in a Numeral? Frege's Answer" (Mind, 116 (2007), 677-716). In the latter paper, she argues that on Frege's view, the numeral "1" prior to his definition has neither sense nor reference.

[7] In writing this review, I profited from conversations with Robert May, Ian Proops, Brian Rogers, Tom Ricketts, Clinton Tolley, Kai Wehmeier, and Joan Weiner.