2011.11.31

William Child

Wittgenstein

William Child, Wittgenstein, Routledge, 2011, 278pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415312066.

Reviewed by Paul M. Livingston, University of New Mexico


In 1962, Stanley Cavell published a highly critical review of what was then one of the few secondary books in English on Wittgenstein's late philosophy, David Pole's Later Philosophy of Wittgenstein.[1] In his review, entitled "The Availability of Wittgenstein's Later Philosophy," Cavell challenged, among other things, the ease of Pole's suggestion that "Wittgenstein's central ideas . . . are essentially simple," Pole's tendency to assimilate Wittgenstein's views to received positions within "analytical philosophizing," and, especially, hia pervasive failure to appreciate what Cavell saw as Wittgenstein's specific methods, including his continual appeal to ordinary language.[2] Those who share something of Cavell's sense of the importance of such methodological considerations, and their relevance to the ongoing reception of Wittgenstein's thought, may find cause for concern in the fact that William Child's guidebookWittgenstein essentially replicates several of these problematic features and omissions of Pole's work. Still, this should not prevent us from appreciating the genuine merits of Child's book, which is uniformly clear, comprehensive and (according to its own method) highly rigorous.  As such it will be very useful for those approaching Wittgenstein for the first time or seeking an understanding of how the various arguments, views, and positions one may cull from his texts can be situated within the discussions and debates that occupy many analytic philosophers today.

Child's book begins with an informative, if breezy, summary of Wittgenstein's biography, using quotations from letters and memoirs to establish something of the unique and uncompromising character that animated his writing and philosophizing. The next two chapters concern the Tractatus. In chapter 2, Child moves quickly and lucidly through the "picture" theory of meaning, the truth-functional structure of propositions, and the tautological nature of logical propositions. Chapter 3 treats the Tractatus' conception of the interrelated issues of the structure of reality and the limits of language, offering three interpretations of the early Wittgenstein's "metaphysical picture": a "realist" interpretation according to which there are absolute, objective facts about the basic constituents of reality; an "idealist" interpretation according to which these ultimate constituents are "dependent on our system of thought or language," (p. 55) and finally a "quietist" or "deflationary" option on which the very question of dependence is ultimately nonsensical. Chapter 4 gives an illuminating description of the development of Wittgenstein's thinking from his return to philosophical work in 1929 to the Philosophical Investigations, including Wittgenstein's critique there of his earlier thought, and chapters 5 and 6 treat the topics of intentionality, rule-following, mind and private language. Chapters 7 and 8 discuss topics that are often passed over in synoptic accounts of Wittgenstein's work: the late work On Certainty, and Wittgenstein's views on religion and ritual belief. Finally, the concluding chapter 9 gives a brief overview of what Child understands as Wittgenstein's "legacy and influence" for the practice and concerns of analytic philosophers today.

These discussions are uniformly clear and will be readily understandable to those who have no prior acquaintance with any aspect of Wittgenstein's philosophy, as well as those daunted, on a first approach, by some of the more challenging stylistic and literary aspects of Wittgenstein's writing. The scope of issues treated is also generally quite comprehensive, covering most of the topics discussed by Wittgenstein from his first writings to his last (though one noticeable omission is any sustained discussion of Wittgenstein's views on the philosophy of mathematics, certainly a topic he himself thought very important). Additionally, because Child very often situates positions expressed by Wittgenstein with respect to contemporary debates and controversies in the fields of (analytic) philosophy of mind and language, those who work within those fields or would like to gain an introduction to them through Wittgenstein will likely find Child's analyses both accurate and illuminating.

Throughout these discussions, Child's reading of Wittgenstein's texts consists largely in drawing from them arguments for recognizable theses and positions on the nature of the various subject matters taken up, seeking the right solution to well-defined "problems" of these fields. In the concluding chapter 9, Child acknowledges that many have seen Wittgenstein's later philosophy as in tension with current "constructive" and "systematic" philosophical methods. But instead of taking this kind of view, Child suggests, "we should approach Wittgenstein as we would approach any other philosopher." For Child, this specifically means sorting the "ideas that seem promising" from those that seem "unsuccessful" or "implausible" and, above all, always considering "whether his arguments are effective" (p. 244).

This methodology of "extraction and evaluation" organizes Child's analyses throughout the book. For instance, in chapter 2, Wittgenstein's Tractatus is treated as centrally concerned with, and as offering a "referentialist" solution to, the problem of the "relation between a name and the thing it names".  Chapter 3 contains a detailed discussion and evaluation of Wittgenstein's argument for the necessity of the existence of simple objects, concluding that the argument is valid but based on a premise (that of the impossibility of meaning’s depending on contingent facts) that Wittgenstein would later repudiate.  Chapter 5 considers whether Wittgenstein's arguments against the theories of intentionality advanced by Russell and Ogden and Richards succeed in refuting contemporary "causal" theories of intentionality (and concludes that they do not).  Chapter 6 reconstructs the "private language argument" as a direct response to a "Cartesian" view of sensations and their individuation, rejecting Wittgenstein's conclusion that it is impossible for me to say meaningfully that I "know" I am in pain.  In chapter 7, Child interrogates Wittgenstein's views about systems of language and knowledge, suggesting (though he admits that the evidence is somewhat equivocal) that these views may lead to a problematic relativism. This method occasionally extends, as well, to Child's evaluation of existing interpretive positions on Wittgenstein. For instance, after briefly sketching at the end of chapter 3 the "new" or "resolute" reading of the Tractatus, he rejects it, in part on the grounds that it is "hard to believe" its adherents' suggestion that Wittgenstein is not trying to advance a "correct" theory of language and logic (p. 71).

For some audiences this general framework will be a merit of Child's book; for instance, it allows him to discuss, in passing, the interpretive and substantive views of many of the prominent analytic commentators who have also read Wittgenstein as being, at least in part, in the business of providing "explanations" and "accounts." But there are obvious problems with the simple attribution of this business to a philosopher who famously remarked, "If someone were to advance theses in philosophy, it would never be possible to debate them, because everyone would agree to them,"[3] and "we may not advance any kind of theory. There must not be anything hypothetical to our considerations. All explanation must disappear, and description alone must take its place."[4]

And if Child's framework does serve to make certain theses and arguments expressed in Wittgenstein's work more accessible to some, from other perspectives it will certainly seem limiting. In general, Child's recurrent discussions of "contemporary mainstream philosophy" have in view only a handful of sub-specialties of contemporary analytic philosophy (especially philosophy of mind and language). The very different "continental" reception of Wittgenstein (in the work of such figures as Habermas, Lyotard, and now Badiou), for instance, is completely ignored. Nor is there any substantive discussion of the reception of Wittgenstein even within analytic philosophy in fields such as ethics and political philosophy, to which his writings have a clear and direct relevance.

Some of these omissions might admittedly be forgiven in the context of a book that is avowedly introductory and whose interpretive aims are not overtly dependent on reconstructing a history of reception.[5] Nor does Child completely ignore the suggestion that Wittgenstein wishes, in a significant register of his work, to distance himself from the philosophical task of arguing for theses and rendering accounts. Child does not consider in detail what may be the specific reasons, internal to Wittgenstein's own reflection on method, for these animadversions about what were already in Wittgenstein's time "mainstream" methods of analytic philosophy. Rather, he repeatedly domesticates these suggestions within a framework that makes them appear simply to be a series of further merely thematic commitments (for instance to "quietism," "anti-reductionism," "anti-essentialism," "deflationism," and so on), essentially on a level with what are taken as Wittgenstein's more topical and specific views about the nature of mind, language, and reality.

With respect to these more topical commitments as well, Child's manner of treatment produces specific claims which might be questioned from the perspective of a broader sense of Wittgenstein's method or methods. We can see this in detail by considering Child's treatment of two of the issues that are, on any account, most central to the Philosophical Investigations: rule-following and private language. With respect to rules, Child construes Wittgenstein as asking, at least in part, the "constitutive" question of what it is that makes a certain way of going on (for instance in completing a mathematical series) the single correct one. According to Child, this question can, in general, be answered by means of three different possible views of rules. One possibility is a "Platonism" that holds that "there is an absolutely objective fact about which way of going on from the initial steps in a mathematical series is the correct continuation, and an absolutely objective standard" of what constitutes going on in the same way as before (p. 123). The position of "constructivism" (or "anti-realism"), by stark contrast, denies that there are any such "absolutely objective standards"; the "normative" constitutive issue of what it is to continue the series correctly is rather to be settled by reference to "empirical claim[s]" about what people actually do in continuing it (p. 128).

Child takes it as uncontroversial that Wittgenstein himself rejects the first (Platonist) option, and he agrees with influential interpreters such as Dummett in holding that there are many passages in which Wittgenstein at least "seems to adopt" the constructivist view of rules. There is, however, a third interpretive option, according to Child, which may capture the "main thrust" (p. 134) of Wittgenstein's remarks better than either of the other two. This is a "deflationism or quietism" that takes "facts about rules and standards of correctness as basic and irreducible" (p. 130). Whereas the Platonist and the constructivist both take philosophy to be capable of giving an "informative answer" to the question of what makes one continuation the correct one, the deflationist, on Child's account, denies this, holding that there is simply nothing to be said in answer to this philosophical question. Child here follows McDowell in suggesting a distinction between two perspectives one can imagine taking on our practices: an "internal" perspective, from which we agree, in any particular case, on what the correct continuation of a series should in fact be, and an (actually largely illusory) "external" perspective from which, if we could occupy it, it would be possible to reflect philosophically on our practice and give an answer to the constitutive question of what makes one continuation the right one.

In chapter 6, Child applies much the same framework to the notorious "private language argument" of the Philosophical Investigations. As with the discussion of rule-following, the central issue here is seen as turning on the question of the establishment of a "standard of correctness" (p. 154).  In particular, the "private linguist" (such as the diarist of PI 258) who wishes to establish a purely private meaning for her terminology with reference to internal mental states or phenomena has in fact failed to do so, Child suggests, in that she has failed to establish such a standard, and so has not established what will be a correct, and what an incorrect, use of the allegedly designative terminology.

When Cavell reviewed Pole's book, he emphasized, against Pole's opening declaration of the essential "simplicity" of Wittgenstein's views, that "the difficulty of philosophizing, and especially of the fruitful criticism of philosophy, is one of Wittgenstein's great themes."[6] Pole's neglect of this theme yields in his text, according to Cavell, a "pervasive" and regrettable "absence of any worry that some remark of Wittgenstein's may not be utterly obvious in its meaning and implications."[7] Although Child occasionally treats Wittgenstein's statements as equivocal or as not providing sufficient evidence for which of various well-defined positions he actually holds, Child's discussions, similarly, never suggest much of a sense of the internal "difficulty" of the application or interpretation of Wittgenstein's remarks, nor of their significance to the massive question of criticism that Cavell here broaches.

This absence also has more specific and thematic consequences. As we have seen, for instance, Child recurrently poses the issues of rule-following, private language, and the threat of relativism as issues of the institution and maintenance of "normative standards"; here Child essentially replicates Pole's claim that, for Wittgenstein, "normative notions -- rightness, validity, and we may perhaps add truth -- are significant inasmuch as there exist standards which we can appeal to and principles we can invoke."[8] Child shares with Pole an evident sense that it is simply a clear-cut matter, in any particular case, to determine (given the "standards," "practices," and "rules" that define existing "systems" and allow us to occupy a position "internal" to them) what counts or should count as "going on" in the same way.

As Cavell notes, this general picture is reminiscent of the later Carnap's conception of rigorously delimited "language frameworks" capable of defining a sharp distinction between questions "internal" and "external" to their structures.[9] However, Cavell suggests, as a description of Wittgenstein it is "ironically blind": "not merely wrong," but indeedfundamentally misguided in that it misses the massive fact that "Wittgenstein's ideas form a sustained and radical criticism of such views."[10] In particular, whereas Pole and Child both speak as if, from an "internal" perspective at least, it is readily possible to determine the correctness of performance by reference to well-defined standards or rules, "That everyday language does not, in fact or in essence, depend upon such a structure and conception of rules, and yet that the absence of such a structure in no way impairs its functioning, is what the picture of language drawn in [Wittgenstein's] late philosophy is about."[11] Further investigation of this central "topic" of the later philosophy would necessarily have involved, Cavell suggests, a much more involved discussion of the central notions of "criteria" and "grammar," notions that (unlike that of "standards") together articulate Wittgenstein's complex and fragile sense of the manifold ways in which we find ourselves, or find ourselves challenged, in the new applications we make of words and concepts to the inexhaustible variety of circumstances encountered every day in the course of an ordinary life.

In view of these issues, one may certainly come to feel that if Child's work may be considered representative of the state of "mainstream" interpretation of Wittgenstein's thought, there is still significant cause for concern over the "availability" of this thought today. Indeed, one need not share Cavell's specific sense of the possibilities of ordinary language philosophy in order to share some concern that the kind of reading that Pole and Child both practice poses significant problems for the registers of Wittgenstein's thought that are in incessant dialoguewith the question of the possibility of philosophy itself. None of this should be taken to impugn the genuine rigor and skill with which Child has performed the work of culling and considering arguments and positions that are sketched, entertained, or evaluated at various places in Wittgenstein's texts; nor do I mean to suggest that Wittgenstein does not often make arguments and indeed at least sometimes hold relatively well-defined "positions." But it is to be hoped, as much today as when Cavell wrote in 1962, that the interpretation and exegesis of Wittgenstein's text in terms of the familiar problems of contemporary analytic philosophy does not preclude the availability of other, more reflexive and critical, more challenging and indeed difficult, moments of his unique and radical thought.



[1] Pole, David. The Later Philosophy of Wittgenstein: A Short Introduction, With an Epilogue on John Wisdom. London: Athlone Press, 1958.

[2] Cavell, Stanley. "The availability of Wittgenstein's later philosophy." Philosophical Review 71 (1962): 67-93. Reprinted as chapter 2 of Must We Mean What We Say? (updated edition) Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.

[3] Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, revised 4th edition. Transl. by G.E.M. Anscombe, P.M.S. Hacker, and Joachim Schulte. Blackwell, 2009, section 128.

[4] PI 109.

[5] For a much fuller sense of the substantive issues and excesses involved in this reception over the course of its complicated history, see Anat Biletzki's fascinating study(Over)Interpreting Wittgenstein (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 2003).

[6] Cavell, p. 45.

[7] Cavell, p. 45.

[8] Pole, p. 56.

[9] Cavell, p. 47.

[10] Cavell, pp. 47-48.

[11] Cavell, p. 48.