Scott J. Shapiro


Scott J. Shapiro, Legality, Harvard University Press, 2011, 472pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674055667.

Reviewed by John Gardner, University of Oxford, and Timothy Macklem, King's College London

Scott Shapiro's much-anticipated book, Legality, sets out to provide a new account of the nature of law. It is an account in the tradition of 'legal positivism', the tradition according to which, as Shapiro puts it, 'all legal facts are ultimately determined by social facts alone' (27). The main novelty of Shapiro's positivism lies in his claim that the relevant social facts are facts about plans. This claim strikes Shapiro as sufficiently novel and sufficiently powerful to warrant the creation of a new label to designate it. He calls it 'The Planning Theory of Law' (195).

Although the main elements of this theory have been set out and defended in a series of important and well-known scholarly articles, Shapiro has chosen here to recast his ideas in a more accessible style, suitable for law students without much philosophical training, and perhaps even for an educated general audience. His vivid examples, his clear and fluent prose, and his conspicuous enthusiasm for his subject combine to yield a very engaging book. It must be said that Shapiro has given himself a tough assignment in aiming to make this technical area of philosophy accessible at the same time as developing and defending his own distinctive positions within it. He follows in the footsteps of Ronald Dworkin in attempting to do so, but he benefits in comparison from fewer rhetorical flourishes, less equivocation, greater acknowledgement of the achievements of others, and a rather attractive measure of self-deprecating wit.

The self-deprecation is not just an injection of personality, but goes hand in hand with Shapiro's slightly apologetic attitude towards his own profession. At the start of the book Shapiro tries hard to convince sceptical readers, perhaps hard-nosed law students in particular, that there is value in philosophy beyond the solving of intellectual puzzles. Professional philosophers may find these passages irritating for the succour they give to philistines. Fortunately, the apologetics do not prevent Shapiro from tackling the main problems in the rest of the book in a robustly philosophical spirit. All the same, one may wonder whether his doubts about the philosophical patience of his audience may have contributed to what less embarrassed philosophers may regard as Legality's unevenness of argumentation (more on which below).

The book has fourteen chapters, which may conveniently be clustered into four movements. In the first four chapters, Shapiro clarifies his main question ('What is law?'), focuses our attention on the particular problem of law's genesis, a 'chicken and egg problem' (39-40), and canvasses solutions to that problem that have been offered by his legal positivist forebears, notably John Austin and H.L.A. Hart. These chapters succeed admirably in equipping newcomers to the subject with a sense of what is going on and a conceptual apparatus for reflecting on it. The supposed deficiencies of Hart's widely-admired solution lead into the presentation, in chapters five to seven, of Shapiro's alternative, the Planning Theory of Law. Here Shapiro is at his most philosophically demanding, as he attempts to draw on Michael Bratman's technical work on shared agency with a minimum of exegesis. The next three chapters react to the work of Ronald Dworkin, whose criticisms of legal positivism, if sound, would take down the Planning Theory of Law along with its main competitors. Shapiro regards the Planning Theory as having particularly robust resources for resisting Dworkin's anti-positivist manoeuvres. The final movement of the book, in chapters eleven to fourteen, follows the Dworkinian trail out into normative political theory, with reflections on the 'economy of trust' in a modern society, on the judicial role, and on how to understand the moral ideal of the rule of law, all liberally sprinkled with connections back to the Planning Theory.

The chicken and egg problem, which is very expertly set out by Shapiro, goes like this. On the one hand ('chicken'), it takes a legal official to create a legal norm. On the other hand ('egg'), it takes a legal norm to create a legal official. This has sometimes been presented as a logical puzzle about law, which it surely is, but Shapiro follows Hart in presenting it more accessibly as a genealogical problem. How, he wonders, is it possible for law ever to come into existence? Some have tried to solve the puzzle by abandoning the 'chicken' move. This usually entails an abandonment of legal positivism. Shapiro follows Hart in thinking that this is too high a price to pay. Ultimately it forces us to give up on the idea that legal systems are human creations that come into existence to deal with human problems. Shapiro also follows Hart in thinking it premature. There are, he thinks, positivist solutions. Yet he does not adopt Hart's own solution, which he follows Dworkin in regarding as a failure.

Hart argues that every legal system has an ultimate 'rule of recognition' which identifies the system's officials. He thinks that the rule is made by the same officials that it identifies, or by some of them. The rule is not, however, made by the officials in the exercise of a legal power to make it. Rather it is a customary (or social) rule. A group of people (thereby rendered 'officials') regard themselves as bound to follow the practice of their own group in treating certain of their own ('official') actions and activities as creating binding norms. Some other conditions need to be met before the resulting set of norms adds up to a legal system, but the genealogical problem (which is common to all systems of positive norms, not only legal systems) is solved, for Hart, by a benign self-referentiality in the customary rule of recognition (as in all customary rules). One implication is that the ultimate rule of recognition is, to a very large extent, accidentally made. Each official takes himself or herself to be merely following the practice of his or her peers, when in fact he or she is helping to constitute that practice and thereby to shape the rule. The rule changes precisely as it was born, mainly by mistake -- that is to say, by successive attempts merely to follow it that in fact contribute to its development.

Hart's solution, in Shapiro's view, involves a category mistake: 'Social rules cannot be reduced to social practices because rules and practices belong to different metaphysical categories' (103). This is Shapiro's main objection to Hart's solution and his main reason for offering a radically different way forward in the form of the Planning Theory. Yet it is a weak objection, involving a highly uncharitable reading of Hart's work. Hart thought that this particular social practice, the practice of the proto-officials, was in two ways normative. It was a practice of purportedly following a rule which also supplied the content of a rule. This is a point about a particular social practice, not about social practices generally. Hart never says, and indeed goes to some trouble to deny, that 'social practices . . . necessarily generate social rules', which is the view that Shapiro attributes to him (103). Nor does Hart identify the practice exactly with the rule. He identifies the content of the practice, or part of it, with the content of the rule. Shapiro says nothing to suggest that this is a category mistake (just as well, because it isn't one). Other readers may join us in wondering why one should follow Shapiro in his search for an alternative solution to the chicken and egg problem when such a weak reason has been given for abandoning the most prominent and most promising existing solution. (There are other, more testing objections to Hart's solution that one might be persuaded by, such as Dworkin's objection to the rule of recognition on indeterminacy grounds, but Shapiro does not rely on them.)

How does the Planning Theory of Law succeed where Hart supposedly failed? 'The main idea [of the Theory] is that the exercise of legal authority . . . is an activity of social planning' (195). Yet in order to solve the chicken and egg problem that Shapiro so expertly sets up we would need to know what the Planning Theory proposes as a way of identifying the relevant social planners. This challenge of identification (or following Hart we might say 'recognition') is not taken up when Shapiro reassures us that the planners are identified in the 'master plan' (205). How, we may now ask, are the master planners identified? Hart's answer is that when there are such master planners they are identified by a social custom among the officials of the legal system of which they are the master planners. This is the proposal that Shapiro rejects and to which he needs to offer an alternative. However, it is far from clear what that alternative is. His main Bratman-inspired thought seems to be that legal activity, all the way back to the master plan, is a shared activity, meaning (roughly) that it involves lots of officials engaged in practices of mutual recognition. So far so Hartian, you may say − except that Shapiro makes the participation in planning, and hence the mutual recognition, seem on the whole intentional where Hart insists that it is mainly accidental. The very reason why Hart moved away from the intentional is that the intentional creation of norms, whether individual or collective, requires a normative power to create them. By moving back to the intentional, Shapiro recreates the problem that he is seeking to solve. Where do the social master planners get the normative power to make the master plan? (Shapiro does of course notice and allow the existence of customary law, but he insists that this must be analysed as 'plan-like' matter and, what is more, only on the model of 'subplans' of a non-customary master plan.)

Another way to put the challenge is to point out that the problem of planning is a special case of the problem of rule-making and rule following. The problem of how legal rules can be made and followed needs to be solved, as Hart saw, before we can move on to the question of whether legal rules belong to plans, or structures of command, or other specialized modes of rule-making and rule following. Shapiro admits this: 'Legal activity is more than simply the activity of formulating, adopting, repudiating, affecting, and applying norms for members of the community. It is the activity of planning' (195). No doubt legal activity is more than simply the complex of norm-related activity listed, but it is at least that complex of norm-related activity, and so we have to understand how it can be that complex before we move on to the other things that are true of it. We might of course take a sneak preview of those other things, to find out if any of them would help to solve the problem of law's existence, the chicken and egg problem, but the planning suggestion, even if true, does not seem to promise any progress with that particular problem, whatever progress it promises with others.

Be that as it may, the truth of the Planning Theory would clearly still be a prize worth winning for Shapiro, even if it depends for its completeness on some other answer to the chicken and egg problem, an answer such as the one Hart provided. So is Shapiro right to think of legal systems as systems of planning within a master plan? The suggestion strikes us as implausible. It seems to skew the analysis in favour of a certain sub-class of legal systems with founding moments, written constitutions, and a high measure of official self-consciousness.

Indeed, there were several points in the book at which we felt that Shapiro was following Dworkin in admitting too few normative systems into the class of legal systems. For example, he declares early on that groups of people that 'lack formal authority structures and are governed mostly by tradition, consensus, and persuasion by elders . . . don't have law' (35). This is a premature conclusion, to say the least. If these groups have elders they have officials, and the mere fact that the officials in question don't have formal authority doesn't show that they don't have legal authority until we know what 'formal' means. If it just means 'legal' then the example is question-begging. If it means something else then we need to know what else. Does the English legal system have formal authority structures, given that its authority structures include many that are purely customary? The example would not be problematic for Shapiro were these structures at the level of a mere sub-plan, but in England and other countries with a common law constitution they are indubitably at the level of the so-called master plan. They therefore call into question the thesis that there is any such thing as a master plan, a thesis that Shapiro could at that point sustain only by calling into question whether England has a legal system. (We are here leaving aside Hart's point that essentially the same is true in the United States: the non-customary rules of the document created in Philadelphia in 1787 are rules of US law only because of a custom of treating that document as a source, perhaps the ultimate source, of US law.)

Even when Shapiro's classification of normative systems as law or non-law seems well judged, his explanations for the differences between the two sometimes seem ill-judged. So the view that Nazi Germany lacked a legal system strikes Shapiro as 'idiosyncratic' (16). On the other hand, he does not think that there is Mafia law (215) and presumably he does not regard this view as equally idiosyncratic. His suggestion for the difference between the two seems to be that law must have a moral aim: 'the aim of remedying the moral deficiencies of the circumstances of legality . . . to compensate for the infirmities of custom, tradition, persuasion, consensus, and promise' (213). But is this criterion really enough to distinguish Nazi law from Mafia non-law? Contrary to the impression given by Shapiro, traditional Mafias, such as the 'Ndrangheta, tend to have a strongly moralistic self-image, and often regard themselves as better placed than the law of the land to provide security against social disorder by use of a tough code, firmly enforced. In particular it is far from clear, pace Shapiro, that a Mafia don could not properly be criticized for corruption in his role as an official of his clan, just as a legal official might be. He could certainly be criticized (and possibly end up sleeping with the fishes) for failing in his duties of honour towards the rest of the clan, e.g., by passing business to the clan's competitors or tipping off the Carabinieri.

It seems to us that an explanation of why the normative order of a Mafia is not a legal system, if indeed it is not, needs to be looked for elsewhere, possibly in the radical distinction that such orders tend to draw between the position of clan members and the position of non-members, or possibly in the fact that a Mafia has as part of its nature the attempted subversion and exploitation of some other law, which it could therefore never replace. Shapiro's way of denying legal status to Mafia orders seems more confected than either of these. More importantly, in as much as it succeeds in throwing doubt on the existence of Mafia law, it seems to throw even more doubt on the existence of Nazi law, the supposed moral aims of which seem even harder to take seriously. (From which fact we, unlike Shapiro, would draw the conclusion that a legal system need not have moral aims at all, but need at most pretend to have them.)

We have now identified two points at which Shapiro seems to elevate features of some but not all law so as to make them look like features of all law. Some but not all legal systems have something resembling a master-plan. Some but not all legal systems have a moral aim or aims. In elevating these features of some law to be features of all law Shapiro seems too intent on making bold claims that distinguish his view from those of his forebears. It seems intrinsically unlikely that his forebears have got matters so wrong that it would take such bold additions to make their views true. It seems more likely that the work of Bentham, Kelsen, Hart, Raz, Finnis, Coleman, and others on whose shoulders Shapiro is standing needs subtle tweaks to deal with specific oversights or infelicities rather than displacement by a new capital-T Theory of the nature of law. In Legality a new capital-T Theory of the nature of law is made to seem necessary mainly by selective reporting or uncharitable reporting (although happily not straight misreporting) of work already done by others. This makes it look, by the end of chapter four, as if there is a large vacuum of thought waiting to be filled. Then, from chapter five on, the more charitable representation of Shapiro's own views, which are not subjected to the same measure of critical scrutiny as Hart's (especially on the chicken and egg point), make it look as if his thinking is just what is needed to fill the vacuum. What is not conveyed is that many of Shapiro's ideas about law, leaving aside what he adds from Bratman, were anticipated, and some subjected to damaging objections, by some of the same giants on whose shoulders he stands, notably by Hart himself. Indeed, the Bratmanian ideas sometimes come across as a contemporary gloss on a largely Hobbesian picture of law, law as the intentional ordering of an unmanageable state of nature, a picture which Hart, we think, put to long overdue death.

Space does not permit us to reflect as extensively as we would like to on the later chapters of the book. It is fair to say, to balance out what we just said about the light touch of auto-criticism, that the Planning Theory is subjected to quite careful critical scrutiny from a Dworkinian direction in the third movement of the book, and comes out of the encounter undamaged, even fortified. But the answers that Shapiro gives to Dworkin on behalf of the Planning Theory are often answers that could equally have been given on behalf of some other legal positivist views, so the special mettle of the Planning Theory, as an innovation, is not really being tested here. Nevertheless, Shapiro's work on broadly Dworkinian topics (legal principles, judicial discretion, theoretical disagreement, interpretation) is masterful and the distinctive voice of the Planning Theory hardly intrudes into what is, by any standards, a very sensible and cogent refutation of confused objections to legal positivism.

There is also much good sense in the final chapters of the book. Shapiro has many original and helpful things to say about the social and political role of law. As his discussion gradually reveals, the success or failure of the Planning Theory as an explanation of the nature of law is neither here nor there when we come to ask about the value of law as an aid to planning. Perhaps legal systems are necessary for planning even though planning is not necessary for legal systems. Not everything that law by its nature is well-equipped to do is something the doing of which is required for it to qualify as law.

In the second half of the book, Shapiro more or less succeeds in uniting his wish to make the subject accessible with his wish to advance some distinctive views of his own. We do not think that the same can be said of the earlier chapters. Although they do give a keen sense of what is at stake and a decent introduction to key concepts in philosophy of law, they will mislead students in respect of the menu of problems, the solutions that have been proposed, and the order in which these should be investigated. If treated as the state of the art, these chapters may well set the art back. They are also, in our judgment, slightly hubristic. There is a touch of life imitating art in the fact that Hart emphasised law's accidental aspect, whereas Shapiro emphasises its intentionality. For Hart's The Concept of Law was a student guide to the subject that accidentally turned into a major breakthrough. Whereas Shapiro's Legality is, we think, a work that tries too hard to make a major breakthrough to serve as a reliable guide.