2011.12.15

Ruth Abbey

The Return of Feminist Liberalism

Ruth Abbey, The Return of Feminist Liberalism, McGill-Queen's University Press, 2011, 326pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773539167.

Reviewed by Amy R. Baehr, Hofstra University


Ruth Abbey's The Return of Feminist Liberalism explores the feminist liberalisms of Susan Okin, Jean Hampton, and Martha Nussbaum. It is a good and important book, evidence of a maturing of the philosophical discussion concerning liberalism within feminism, and feminism within liberalism.[1]

Abbey's discussion of Okin's, Hampton's, and Nussbaum's feminist liberal thought is comprehensive and in-depth. Abbey takes each thinker in turn, carefully discussing each of their feminist liberal works, connecting these to their oeuvres more generally, and constructing a picture of each thinker's feminist liberal thought as a whole. Abbey also explores carefully the major philosophical debates in which each thinker's feminist liberal thought has played a role, canvassing the relevant secondary works. This is an invaluable addition to the literature and required reading for anyone wanting to get up to speed in the field. Although the book hangs together as a whole (more on that below), scholars will be rewarded by study of individual chapters or clusters of chapters in which they have an interest.

Abbey's book will serve advocates and critics of feminist liberalism alike by carefully sorting through and evaluating the many criticisms that have been leveled against feminist liberalism generally and against Okin's, Hampton's, and Nussbaum's views in particular. (There are papers in the literature that do some of this work, but none manages the comprehensiveness we find here.) Abbey is a fair-minded referee, defending against criticisms, or conceding critics' points, when the reasons push her in that direction. Indeed, she grants special attention to problems unsolved, tensions remaining, and questions unanswered by the particular feminist liberal theories she considers. So, for example, she argues that feminist liberals need to think harder and more explicitly about differences among women (41), about the relationship between theory and women's lived experience (7, 268), about when feminist liberalism ought to advocate state action and when not (51, 262), about how liberal values may be promoted in the family and other associations (248), and about the status of children in feminist liberalism (267). (This list is not exhaustive.) But Abbey does not suggest that these, and others she discusses, are challenges a feminist liberalism cannot in principle meet. They are proposed in the spirit of an agenda for future work.

While Abbey is a fair-minded referee, her book is not on the fence. As I read it, The Return of Feminist Liberalism is a defense. But it does not proceed by considering criticisms one by one, refuting them, and then claiming to have theories beyond reproach, invincible philosophical edifices. (No one should do political philosophy like this anyway. Political philosophy is a struggle to make sense of what matters. No one in this conversation thinks liberty and equality do not matter, or that women are to be excluded. How to think these things together is the challenge. That they are incompatible is as facile a claim as that they are easily reconciled.) Abbey proceeds rather by presenting each thinker's feminist liberal theory in the strongest possible light, giving it the most coherent and persuasive construal she can. This involves considering serious difficulties and the concerns of critics, addressing them, proposing solutions or questions to guide future research. What results are careful and nuanced accounts of Okin's, Hampton's, and Nussbaum's feminist liberalisms with which critics and advocates alike can work.

Scholars with an interest in these thinkers will want to examine carefully Abbey's renderings. For example, Abbey's claim that Okin's work is best understood as a "liberalism of shared meanings" (3) should be considered in the context of the many recent writings attempting to take stock of Okin's work as a whole since her unfortunate and premature death.[2] There is a much smaller body of secondary work on Jean Hampton's feminist contractarianism. Abbey's chapters on Hampton add importantly to this literature, in particular because of the way Abbey situates Hampton's feminism within the context of her other, not explicitly feminist, works. Abbey's argument to the conclusion that Hampton's feminist liberalism is not essentially contractarian is of particular interest, and should engage those inquiring into contract as a device of representation in feminist moral and political theory. As Abbey herself notes, Nussbaum continues to write on feminism and liberalism and thus no attempt can be made to take full stock of her feminist liberalism. But scholars of Nussbaum's work will find of interest Abbey's claim that Nussbaum's human capabilities approach could better meet the challenge of the adaptive preferences criticism if it were given a "more prescriptive and perfectionist interpretation than Nussbaum might feel comfortable with" (183). Clearly Abbey thinks a feminist liberalism cannot make do with as thin a foundation as Nussbaum would like. How thick or thin a feminist liberalism must be is an important question on which future work needs to focus. Indeed, the next generation of feminist liberal thinkers should find Abbey's book a rich resource for such questions.

On my reading, Abbey's defense also involves giving an account of feminist liberalism as a kind of liberal philosophical project. This she does by situating it on the landscape of liberal political philosophy generally. Abbey tells us that her subject is "feminist liberalism," rejecting the older label "liberal feminism." This is to emphasize that feminism is part of the liberal tradition; and for this reason the arguments and claims of feminist liberals are to be understood as concerning how liberal values themselves should be understood. This suggests then that Abbey's book concerns not so much whether feminism should be liberal -- that is whether feminists should endorse liberal feminism, whether liberalism in some form should animate the activities of the women's movement and guide feminist lives -- but whether liberalism should be feminist. To the latter question Abbey gives us reason to answer in the affirmative. The former question is perhaps more difficult, and is not a focus of Abbey's book. But it is important and feminist theorists should keep it alive.

Abbey recommends we understand the feminist liberalisms of Okin, Hampton, and Nussbaum as versions of what Mark Button calls "transformative liberalisms" (261). These, Abbey explains, emphasize "a commitment to the formation of civic character and the cultivation of forms of political self-understanding and ethical sensibility upon which a liberal political order depends" (261, citing Button 2008, 5-6). Feminist liberalism is a transformative liberalism to the extent it is committed to bringing into being new forms of civic character and ethical sensibility. Thus its focus cannot be simply to determine those feminist ends to which state power may be used. Its focus is much wider, encompassing what Rawls calls the "background culture" of society.

So Abbey thinks that feminist liberalism must be a (partially) comprehensive doctrine (referring to John Rawls' distinction between comprehensive and political liberalisms, the former being moral theories with general scope, the latter being moral theories limited to the political[3]). It is in this context that we should understand Abbey's skepticism about Nussbaum's claim that hers is a political, and not a comprehensive, liberalism. It is also in this context that we should understand Abbey's claim that feminist liberals need to think more, and more explicitly, about when feminist liberalism calls for state intervention and when not, and about how liberal values can be brought to bear on personal and associational life without state intervention (51, 248, 262).

I think Abbey is quite right that feminist liberalism generally is a transformative liberalism. It seeks not only to establish that state power may be used to some feminist ends, but also to change our form of life. But I also think that it is worthwhile to articulate a feminist version of political liberalism, if we mean by that an account of the feminist ends for which there are public reasons.[4] But one does this as only part of the larger project of feminist liberalism, which includes the kind of comprehensive doctrines Abbey claims Okin's, Hampton's, and Nussbaum's theories represent.

Abbey has done scholars a service in writing this book. She has elevated the discussion and set an agenda for its future.


[1] Abbey's title suggests that feminist liberalism has "returned," as if there had been a heyday of feminist liberalism to which we are now returning. I prefer to think of the book as evidence of a maturing instead.

[2] See for example the papers in Rob Reich and Debra Satz, eds., Toward a Humanist Justice: The Political Philosophy of Susan Moller Okin, Oxford University Press, 2009.

[3] John Rawls, Political Liberalism, Columbia University Press, 1993.

[4] For reasons why one might want to develop a feminist political liberalism, see Amy R. Baehr, "Perfectionism, Feminism, and Public Reason," Law and Philosophy 27(2) (March 2008): 193-222; and Amy R. Baehr, "Liberal Feminism: Comprehensive and Political," in Ruth Abbey, ed., Feminist Interpretations of Rawls, Pennsylvania State University Press, forthcoming. See also Christie Hartley and Lori Watson (2010) "Is a Feminist Political Liberalism Possible?" Journal of Ethics and Social Philosophy 5(1): 1-21.