Leslie Stevenson

Inspirations from Kant: Essays

Leslie Stevenson, Inspirations from Kant: Essays, Oxford University Press, 2011, 181pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199778225.

Reviewed by Robert Hanna, University of Colorado at Boulder


Since W.D. Ross, John Rawls, Onora O'Neill, Barbara Herman, Christine Korsgaard, Thomas Hill, Allen Wood -- and most recently Derek Parfit -- made Kant-oriented ethics into a serious player in mainstream contemporary analytic ethical theory, it is commonplace to distinguish between Kant's ethics, i.e., the ethical theory that is developed in Kant's own writings, and Kantian ethics, i.e., contemporary ethical theory inspired by Kant's writings in moral philosophy, which is not slavishly restricted to Kant's own doctrines and is rationally defensible on grounds independent of Kant's texts.

Correspondingly, it is very natural to see a parallel distinction between Kant's metaphysics and epistemology, and Kantian metaphysics and epistemology. But even despite the explicit endorsement of Kant-oriented metaphysics and epistemology by Peter Strawson, Wilfrid Sellars, Nicholas Rescher, and John McDowell, this way of doing M&E has failed to be accorded the philosophical respect of most mainstream contemporary analytic metaphysicians and epistemologists. Indeed, Kantian metaphysics and epistemology is held in generally very low esteem, and not taken seriously at all -- sharply unlike, say, the not dissimilar anti-realism developed by Michael Dummett or the Aufbau period Carnap-inspired constructive phenomenalism developed by Bas van Fraassen and more recently by David Chalmers, or for that matter the panpsychism or panprotopsychism speculatively postulated by Thomas Nagel and Chalmers, all of which are taken very seriously indeed by most of the mainstream.

The reason for this sadly asymmetric state of affairs, I am afraid, is simply that idealism is a taboo word for most mainstream contemporary analytic metaphysicians and epistemologists. Anti-realism, phenomenalism, panpsychism, and panprotopsychism are all philosophically respectable, but idealism is unacceptable. And the thoroughly ugly label transcendental idealism only makes it worse. If you are an "idealist," then you are obviously a bad philosopher; and if you are a "transcendental idealist," then you are obviously a very bad philosopher. It is true that even if you are an idealist or a transcendental idealist, you may still be a good "historian of philosophy." But that is cold comfort indeed, especially in view of W.V.O. Quine's well-known and widely-accepted distinction between the two classes of philosophers -- those who are interested in the history of philosophy, and those who are interested in philosophy. Given this sad state of philosophical affairs, it is hard to avoid the conclusion that most mainstream contemporary analytic metaphysicians and epistemologists have an unreasonable prejudice against Berkeley, Kant, Schopenhauer, Hegel, middle and later Husserl, early Heidegger, earlier and later Wittgenstein, and also against all contemporary views importantly influenced by one or another of these philosophers.

What is transcendental idealism? Idealism, as such, starts with the assumption, held by classical Rationalists and classical Empiricists alike -- not to mention by all phenomenologists and many contemporary mainstream analytic philosophers -- that consciousness and intentionality are primitive irreducible facts about ourselves and about the world. Consciousness is subjective experience, and conscious intentionality is subjective experience of something or about something, hence conscious intentionality, more briefly put, is the characteristic "of-ness" or "about-ness" of the mental. Then transcendental idealism adds to this mentalistic starting point the further classical Rationalist assumption -- itself held by at least a significant minority of mainstream contemporary analytic philosophers -- that normativity, apriority, and modality are also all primitive irreducible facts about ourselves and the world. Idealism, in turn, is a positive essentialist thesis about the mind-dependence of all the objects of conscious intentionality:

Idealism (I): All worldly things, properties, relations, and facts essentially include the actual or really possible existence of conscious intentional minds like ours.

Correspondingly, transcendental idealism is a positive essentialist thesis about the mind-conformity of all the formal or structural features of all the objects of rational conscious intentionality:

Transcendental Idealism (TI): All irreducibly normative, non-empirical, and modal features of all worldly things, properties, relations, and facts are essentially isomorphic with the formal or structural representations of actual or really possible rational conscious intentional minds like ours.

This two-part doctrine might be false. But, on the other hand, it also might be true. In any case, it is not in and of itself bad philosophy.

So most mainstream contemporary analytic metaphysicians and epistemologists really do need to get over their unreasonable prejudice against idealism in general and transcendental idealism in particular. For that therapeutic purpose, working carefully and open-mindedly through an excellent collection of essays in Kantian metaphysics and epistemology, such as Leslie Stevenson's Inspirations from Kant, should be just the thing for them.


Inspirations from Kant comprises nine essays, all of them published or written since 2000. (During the same period, Stevenson also published two papers on Kant's philosophy of religion and one on Kant's aesthetics; but, somewhat curiously, these essays are not included in this collection. I will return to this curiosity briefly later.) Essays 1-5 grapple with basic themes in transcendental idealism: (1) the nature of objects of representation; (2) the nature of the synthetic unity (or unities) of experience; (3) the ideality of space and time; (4) the nature of the given, the unconditioned, the transcendental object, and the reality of the past; and (5) the relation between transcendental idealism and contemporary physical cosmology. Correspondingly, essays 6-9 address basic themes in the philosophy of mind, cognition, and action: (6) the nature of belief and knowledge; (7) cognitive freedom, or freedom of judgment; (8) the various "levels" or kinds of mentality; and (9) practical freedom, or freedom of the will. Interwoven with these basic metaphysical and epistemic themes are three special sub-themes:

(1) the contrast between animal and human mentality, and between conceptualized and unconceptualized mental states in essays 2 and 3; (2) the varieties of propositional attitudes in essay 6; and (3) the various kinds of mental freedom or spontaneity in essays 7 and 9. (p. 118)

Like Stevenson, I am particularly interested in these special sub-themes. So as I describe and critically unpack the nine essays, I will also explicitly keep track of the philosophical progress of the sub-themes.

In essay 1, "Objects of Representation: Kant's Copernican Revolution Reinterpreted," Stephenson develops what he takes to be an intelligible and defensible interpretation of the notorious conformity thesis of transcendental idealism -- of which TI above is one version. What Kant himself says in the Critique of Pure Reason is this:

Up to now it has been assumed that all our cognition must conform to the objects . . . let us once try whether we do not get farther with the problems of metaphysics by assuming that the objects must conform to our cognition. (Bxvi, as quoted by Stevenson, p. 3)

So "objects must conform to our cognition." But Stevenson is particularly keen to avoid excessively strong interpretations of this Kantian dictum which hold that rational human conscious minds somehow cause or create the material or real external objects of our cognition. In order to do this, Stevenson takes Kant to mean by "objects of our cognition," objects of human mental representation, and more specifically, objects of human conscious intentionality, and even more specifically, intentional objects of rational human conscious intentionality, whether (a) singular referential intentionality, or (b) propositional intentionality. For Stevenson, all acts or states of rational human conscious intentionality, or "aboutness," are individuated by their contents, which all consist in concepts, which in turn are the same as logically structured modes-of-presentation or senses in (roughly) Frege's sense. Concepts, in turn, inherently correspond to our conceptual capacities, which are naturally manifested and realized in our conceptual practices, and they strictly determine all the contents of our conscious intentional acts or states. And since, for Kant, "the understanding can make no use of these concepts than by judging by means of them" (Critique of Pure Reason, A68/B93) it then follows that all the contents of all rational human conscious intentionality are inherently judgmental or propositional in their basic structure. (Just for the record, and also for the purposes of later discussion, this is a version of the doctrine of Conceptualism about mental content: so Stevenson is saying that a Kantian theory of content is a Conceptualist theory of mental content.)

Now "intentional objects" are objects of conscious intentionality just or "narrowly" insofar as they are uniquely specified by the conceptual contents of rational human conscious intentionality. So according to Stevenson's interpretation, the conformity thesis means this:

In my understanding of Kant . . . it is the contents, the senses or "intentional objects," of our [singular referential or propositional -R.H.] representations . . . that depend on (and are even created by) our representing activities, for there cannot be any such contents unless there are minds with representational practices. There is a tolerably clear sense, then, in which intentional objects, the narrowly construed contents of our representations, are mind-dependent and can be said to "conform to our cognition." (p. 11)

In other words, Stevenson is saying that transcendental idealism, properly interpreted, is the thesis that intentional objects, but not material or real external objects, depend on rational human conscious intentionality.

Two apparent problems for this interpretation are (i) that non-conceptualized human sense perception of objects actually happens or is at least really possible (just for the record and for purposes of later discussion again, the thesis that some representational mental contents are not strictly determined by our conceptual capacities or practices but on the contrary are strictly determined by our non-conceptual capacities and practices, and also constitute an essentially different kind of mental content, is a version of the thesis of Non-Conceptualism) and (ii) transcendental idealism, at least as Kant formulated it, is held to extend to all the actual or really possible objects of human sense perception, whether unconceptualized or conceptualized. These two problems, taken together, jointly raise the worry that if Conceptualism is false for human sense perception, then the mind-dependence thesis must also extend to material or real external objects, which are apparently the direct intentional objects of non-conceptualized human sense perception. Stephenson responds to this worry by restricting the scope of rational human conscious intentionality to all and only the conceptualized and propositional objects of human sense perception in a holistic intersubjective network of conceptual and judgmental practices, and also holding that material or real external objects are just the unperceived causes of non-conceptualized human sense impressions or raw sensory data, and not their intentional objects:

Perceptual-based judgments about an object must be interpreted as having a causal relationship with that object, i.e., perceptual confrontations with it must have caused the perceptual experiences on which those judgments were based. It thus emerges that representation is essentially holistic. Referring to a particular object, or having a singular thought, is not a simple property that a given mental state either possesses or lacks quite independently of what holds true of everything else in the mind of the subject. A given mental state represents an object only in virtue of its conceptual role, which depends on a complex pattern of actual or possible relationships to other representational states in that subject (and in other people too, according to Wittgenstein's argument against the possibility of a "private language"). (p. 18)

Hence for Stevenson, transcendental idealism and Kant's Conceptualism are one and the same thesis. This identification is made even more explicitly in essay 4:

Kant's view is not that appearances are mental states (Berkeleian idealism), or that they can be defined in terms of mental states (phenomenalism), but rather that everything we perceive and know must be represented by us, through our perceptions and conceptualization. (p. 58)

Essay 2, "Synthetic Unities of Experience," extends this Conceptualist account of transcendental idealism to an inquiry into the different "levels" or kinds of unity in conscious intentionality, whether this conscious intentionality occurs in non-human non-rational animals, or non-rational humans, or rational humans. In so doing, Stevenson holds, we can recognize that Kant was "asking questions about the relation between preconceptual and conceptual levels of mental functioning that are still of fundamental importance in epistemology, philosophy of mind, and cognitive science" (p. 21).

Stephenson's account starts with Kant's technical notion of "experience" or Erfahrung, as conceptualized, propositional, logically-guided, spatially and temporally unified, objective, self-conscious, personal perceptions of apparent or macroscopic worldly objects.  He analytically decomposes it into five nested levels or kinds:

  1. pre-conceptual, sub-personal, causally-triggered, non-conscious mental processing, associated with what Kant calls sensory intuition or Anschauung and sensory imagination or Einbildung, which together generate "blind" or non-conceptual sensible impressions or sensory data when causally triggered by material or real external objects,
  2. simple conceptualized successions of experiences of objects in time,
  3. simple conceptualized simultaneous experiences of objects at a time,
  4. complex unified perceptions of a single globally-structured spatiotemporal world, and
  5. representations of oneself as an experiencer of objects in a single globally-structured spacetime.

The basic explanatory principles behind this account, for any cognitive level or kind, draw directly on Sellars's Kant-inspired Conceptualist theory of cognition, and are that "what distinguishes experiences from impressions is conceptualization, their being in the space of reasons and available for inference and justification" (p. 40). Another Stevensonian thesis about Kant's theory of mind that draws directly on Sellars is that "Kant's theory of mind is broadly functionalist and is consistent with a nonreductionist form of materialism" (p. 41).

According to this Sellarsian picture, sense impressions are token-identical with brain states (p. 39) but not type-identical (p. 41), and the active Kantian mind with its various levels or kinds of mental operation "is the way in which the whole embodied human being (normally) functions" (p. 41).

In essay 3, "Three Ways in Which Space and Time Could be Transcendentally Ideal," this time drawing directly on Nicholas Rescher's Conceptual Idealism, Stevenson identifies three different interpretations of the thesis that space and time are transcendentally ideal. Each interpretation specifies a different degree of rational human mental involvement in spatiality and temporality. According to the first interpretation, space and time are transcendentally ideal insofar as we perceive space and time either according to a global conception of a system of times and places with allocentric representation of positions in space and time, or else according to a perspectival conception with egocentrically-centered, orientable representation of positions in space and time. Whether one adopts the global or perspectival conception, what makes these approaches to space and time transcendentally ideal is simply "that these conceptual aspects of space and time I have so far been talking about are subject to whatever necessary conditions apply to our conceptualized understanding, our making of judgments about the public world" (p. 45).

In other words, the first interpretation of the ideality of space and time is just Conceptualism as applied to the representations of space and time. According to the second interpretation of the ideality of space and time, the perspectival conception of space and time requires rational human conscious intentional minds like ours, and can be sharply distinguished from the material, real external world itself. And according to the third interpretation of the ideality of space and time thesis, spatial and temporal relations are literally introduced by the faculty of transcendental imagination into the unconceptualized manifold of sense impressions delivered by the faculty of sensory intuition. This third degree of rational human mental involvement in spatiality and temporality thus postulates the strict determination of spatial and temporal content in our mental representations by the application of our concepts.

So far, as we have seen, Stevenson has been developing an account and a defense of transcendental idealism that depend heavily on the thesis of Conceptualism about mental content. Essay 4, "The Given, the Unconditioned, the Transcendental Object, and the Reality of the Past," extends this line of reasoning to Kant's Critical ontology and, in particular, to the much-controverted distinction between appearances (or phenomena) and things-in-themselves (or noumena). In the Dialectic, Kant says that human reason compels us to look for the ultimate explanatory ground of any conditioned or empirical cognition (a.k.a., "the unconditioned"). Kant also says that human reason assumes that insofar as any conditioned or empirical cognition is given, the total series of antecedent empirical conditions is literally given along with it, as its explanatory ground (which is what Kant calls the "regressive synthesis" of reason), and also that all of the further conditioned implications, or empirical consequences of any particular conditioned or empirical cognition (which is what Kant calls the "progressive synthesis" of reason), are also given. In other words, human reason naturally applies the principle of sufficient reason to all its empirical cognitions, and takes it very seriously indeed. As the Dialectic shows, this is a fundamental mistake. Human reason cannot actually comprehend the complete set of antecedent or consequent conditions of any conditioned cognition. To think so is to confuse the standpoint of a finite, limited cognitive capacity -- our own -- with that of an incomprehensibly infinite, unlimited, and divine intellect. In other words, we naturally want to be God, but cannot ever be more than "human, all too human."

The problem here can be focused on the notion of "the given." Givenness from the human standpoint is just the causal triggering of human sense perception by something beyond it, i.e., by material, real external objects. Givenness in this sense also provides empirical information about those objects, whether direct information about the proximal objects that immediately cause our perceptions or indirect information about the distal objects (i.e., past objects or spatially far-away objects) that mediately cause the proximal objects that immediately cause our perceptions. But human reason all too quickly converts this into the mistaken claim that the objects themselves are also given in themselves via that causal triggering, and that givenness provides insight into the intrinsic non-relational real essences of those objects, i.e., insight into their Leibnizian complete individual concepts.

So there are empirical objects that are directly or indirectly given to human experience, and non-empirical objects -- noumena in the positive sense, or things-in-themselves -- that merely purport to be literally given to human reason in their complete natures or real essences, but are not. Kant's generic term for any such empirical or non-empirical object, i.e., for anything that is real in any sense, whether or not we can actually cognize it from the human standpoint, is the "transcendental object=X". In this sense, in an apparent paradox, the actual past is a transcendental object that both is and is not given to us. It is given to human cognizers indirectly as a series of mediate empirical causes that we can, in principle, learn about through the natural sciences. But it is not given in its completeness, as a thing-in-itself.

This conclusion then segues into essay 5, "A Theory of Everything? Kant Speaks to Stephen Hawking." Here Stevenson argues that from a Kantian point of view, the natural scientific construction of increasingly more comprehensive theories of empirical reality is perfectly reasonable and cognitively fruitful. But the further claim, made by some leading cosmological physicists and philosophers, that in principle physical reality can be completely known by means of some such comprehensive theory as a thing-in-itself, is a serious non sequitur that fails to heed the fundamental difference between the two radically different kinds of objects that can be substituted for 'X' in the formula "transcendental object = X," namely (i) appearances (phenomena) and (ii) things-in-themselves (noumena). About the latter we must adopt a consistent attitude of epistemic humility -- thus expressing our necessary ignorance of things-in-themselves -- or perhaps also expressing an even more radical agnosticism about the very existence or non-existence of things-in-themselves, in addition to epistemic humility about knowledge of their nature. In any case, "If by 'objective truth' is meant representations that exactly correspond to reality as it is 'in itself,' independent of the human mind (even the most well-informed scientific minds) -- that is an ideal that Kant has shown is empty" (p. 77).

Essay 6, "Opinion, Belief or Faith, and Knowledge," follows up on this theme of epistemic humility or perhaps even radical agnosticism by exploring Kant's extremely important but often-overlooked distinction, almost scandalously buried away in a short section of the Doctrine of Method in the first Critique at A820-831/B848-859 – although, to be fair, Kant does mention it again in both the Jäsche Logic and "What is Orientation in Thinking?" -- between

(i) "opinion" (Meinen),

(ii) "belief" (Glauben), and

(iii) "knowledge" (Wissen),

with a special emphasis on two sharply different kinds of Glauben, namely

(iia) cognitive or epistemic belief (or what I would call "belief-that"), and

(iib) practical or moral belief, i.e., faith (or what I would call "belief-in").

In so doing, Stevenson offers a general and well-grounded interpretation of Kant's famous remark that he had "to deny knowledge (Wissen) in order to make room for faith (Glaube)" (Bxx, as quoted by Stevenson, p. 77).

In many ways, this essay is the epitome of Stevenson's philosophical method and its subtle negotiation between Kant's M&E, Kantian M&E, and contemporary mainstream analytic M&E. Here Stevenson very carefully unpacks Kant's threefold distinction against the backdrop of Kant's theory of judgment, with its threefold ambiguity as between (1) the propositional content of judgment, the Satz, (2) the mental act of judging, or Urteilen, which essentially consists in the propositional attitude of "taking-for-true" or Fürwahrhalten, i.e., the act of assertion, and (3) the mental power, innate capacity, or faculty for judging, Urteilskraft. As it turns out, Meinen, Glauben, and Wissen are held by Kant to be different degrees or modes of taking-for-true, or Fürwahrhalten. But this is only the beginning of the philosophical story, since not only does Kant say some very unclear and perhaps even inconsistent things about the three degrees or modes, there is also the rather large family of distinct senses of the English word 'belief" to be contended with. In order to sort this out, Stevenson distinguishes no less than five distinct types of Glauben, which he then translates into five corresponding distinct types of belief:

Belief 1: to hold or take a proposition to be true. (p. 93)

Belief 2: to hold a proposition to be true while acknowledging that one does not know it. (p. 93)

Belief 3: to hold a proposition on the basis of testimony, rather than any more direct evidence about the relevant states of affairs. (p. 94)

Belief 4: to hold a proposition with a certain degree of strength, measurable by the person's dispositions to action (given her values), in particular her willingness to accept bets at certain odds. (p. 94)

Belief 5: to hold a proposition, realizing that one can never have sufficient evidence to claim knowledge of it (or of its negation), while maintaining a firm commitment to it as a reason for certain principles of action. (p. 94)

Stevenson proposes, and I agree completely with him, that "Belief 5 represents . . . Kant's main intention in his talk of Glaube" (p. 94). I also completely agree with Stevenson's gloss on belief in this sense -- i.e., belief-in, or practical/moral belief, as opposed to belief-that, or cognitive/epistemic belief, in the explicit absence of sufficient reasons for cognitive/epistemic belief:

Kant remarks on the necessity and stability of "moral belief" (A828/B856). What he means by the latter phrase is not (as might be expected) beliefs about what one ought or ought not to do; rather he has in mind certain metaphysical claims -- his old favorites about God and immortality -- that he thinks one has to accept if one is to be motivated to strive towards one's own moral perfection and the highest good, i.e., the unity of virtue and happiness in the world. The acceptance or belief that he sees involved here is of a very special kind: the conviction is not logical but moral certainty, and, since it depends on subjective grounds (of moral disposition), Kant suggests that one should not say "It is morally certain that there is a God," etc., but rather "I am morally certain," etc. (A829/B857). Here Kant strikes an existentialist note, anticipating Kierkegaard. His distinction between moral beliefs and theoretical beliefs (even those about things-in-themselves) is not between different propositions, but different styles of believing the same proposition. (p. 93)

I would only want to add to Stevenson's gloss, that this practical/moral conception of belief comports perfectly with the epistemic humility or radical agnosticism that Stevenson discussed in essay 5. And to the extent that this is so, then the sense in which belief 5 requires that one "accepts" the metaphysical claims about God and immortality cannot be that one believes them in the cognitive/epistemic sense, or knows them in the sense of scientific knowing or Wissen, since that is explicitly ruled out by Kant. Rather this attitude of acceptance must itself be practical/moral in nature -- roughly, acting as if one believed or knew them, although one also knows, as a fundamental thesis of Kantian M&E, that one cannot believe them in the cognitive/epistemic sense or know them. Here the similarity between Kant's notion of Glaube and Kierkegaard's "leap of faith" (and also Pascal's so-called "wager" for that matter) is particularly evident and vivid.

The last three essays in the collection complete Stevenson's philosophical trajectory from theoretical M&E to the metaphysics of practical agency -- including the metaphysics of morals -- in Kantian philosophy.

In essay 7, "Freedom of Judgment in Descartes, Spinoza, Hume, and Kant," Stevenson develops a series of philosophically illuminating comparisons and contrasts between Cartesian voluntarism -- the in-principle unrestricted scope of the will in affirming or denying propositions, which of course leads to error when it is not constrained within the limits of clear and distinct rational intuition -- Spinoza's breathtakingly extreme fatalism about rational willing in judgment, Hume's compatibilism about the will's operations in judgment as the "slave of the passions," and Kant's thesis of the autonomy of reason in judgment, whether theoretical or practical. As regards Kant's doctrine, Stevenson focuses his discussion on Kant's equally difficult and important notion of "spontaneity," and very helpfully distinguishes five different Kantian conceptions or kinds of spontaneity:

  1. The spontaneity that characterizes the distinctively human level of thought (whether theoretical or practical -- in judgment or action), merely in virtue of the language-based conceptualization involved.
  2. The spontaneity that applies to the reflective control of judgment by the conscious evaluation of reasons, as opposed to the unreflective, quasi-automatic, primitive kind of belief formation.
  3. The spontaneity that characterizes reason in Kant's sense, where ideal concepts are employed, either in the scientific explanation of observed phenomena (the pure theoretical use of reason), or in deciding what one is morally required to do, or to strive toward (the pure practical use of reason).
  4. The spontaneity or Neutral Freedom of choice [a.k.a. freedom according to "The Principle of Alternative Possibilities," a.k.a. "the freedom to choose or do otherwise" -R.H.] that is a two-way power.
  5. The absolute spontaneity of an uncaused event (including exercises of Capricious Freedom [i.e., the ability to choose or do whatever I want -R.H.]). (p. 117)

Each of these different conceptions of spontaneity isolates a different but also collectively compatible sense in which cognitive/epistemic or practical/moral judgment is free, or can be free. Interestingly, Stevenson also wants to say that there is an important asymmetry between cognitive/epistemic and practical/moral judgment in this connection:

practical decision is often free or spontaneous in the fourth sense involving a two-way power, and sometimes even in the fifth sense involving "Capricious" choice, but neither of these seem to apply to [cognitive/epistemic -R.H.] judgment or belief formation. (p. 117)

In essay 8, "Six Levels of Mentality," Stevenson returns to his Conceptualist vs. Non-Conceptualist sub-theme and expands it into a comprehensive six-part Kant-inspired conception of the nature of animal minds, including non-rational non-human animal minds, non-rational human minds, and rational human minds. Along the way, he nicely and critically juxtaposes this conception with slightly different but not wholly dissimilar accounts offered by L. Jonathan Cohen, Daniel Dennett, Gareth Evans, William James, Ronald De Sousa, Keith Lehrer, and H.H. Price.

Stevenson's six-part Kant-inspired conception includes the following levels or kinds of "belief" -- with due regard to all the ambiguities of meaning associated with the English word 'belief' that Stevenson noted in essay 6:

  1. Non-linguistic object-directed beliefs.
  2. Non-linguistic mind-directed beliefs.
  3. Linguistic object-directed primitively formed beliefs.
  4. Linguistic mind-directed primitively formed beliefs.
  5. Linguistic object-directed reasoned beliefs.
  6. Linguistic mind-directed reasoned beliefs. (pp. 134-135)

Stevenson then extends this scheme to a corresponding six-part conception of desires and emotions. It is especially important to note that in each six-level scheme, the first two levels are modes of non-conceptual mindedness, and the last four levels are all modes of conceptual mindedness. Hence the conceptual/non-conceptual distinction that is so central to Stevenson's interpretation of transcendental idealism also fully informs Stevenson's Kant-inspired theory of the mind.

In the final essay in the book, essay 9, "A Kantian Defense of Free Will," Stevenson presents a Kant-inspired way of thinking about the free will problem against the backdrop of an interpretation of Kant's doctrines of causality, spontaneity (previously discussed in essay 7), and free will. The basic line of argument that Stevenson takes is this. The free will problem is normally formulated as a fundamental puzzle -- or to use Schopenhauer's nice phrase, "world-knot" -- about how there can be rational human conscious intentional free will in a deterministic world. But the very idea of determinism -- i.e., that for any moment of time, the laws of nature, together with all the settled facts about the past, causally or metaphysically or logically necessitate all future events -- assumes the possibility of, in effect, noumenal scientific knowledge of physical nature as a thing-in-itself. But Kantian epistemic humility or radical agnosticism, together with what we know about quantum indeterminacy and complex systems dynamics, entails the rejection of this kind of knowledge of physical nature. Hence we have sufficient reason to hold some form of non-determinism. In the light of our commonsense or garden-variety conceptions of natural causation, together with Kant's insight in the third antinomy of pure reason that both hard natural determinism (the thesis) and indeterministic metaphysical libertarianism (the anti-thesis) are alike based on the shared mistake of failing to recognize and take seriously Kant's fundamental metaphysical and epistemic distinction between appearances (phenomena) and things-in-themselves (noumena), we are then led to a Kantian version of compatibilism. According to this, our necessary and ineliminable Idea of ourselves as acting, in a fully intersubjective context with Strawson's conception of the "reactive attitudes" also fully in play, under the guidance of reasons and for the sake of reasons, provides a robust conception of free will in a natural world that is also appropriately scaled to the human condition:

Perhaps, dear reader, you are still wondering how all this relates to the timeworn philosophical debate between compatibilism and incompatibilism. Well, I put it to you that determinism (as a constitutive claim) is a paper tiger: there is nothing there that you need to worry about being compatible or incompatible with. But do you wonder if all this really counts as a defense of free will after all? Do you still hanker in your heart after the idea of undetermined acts of will, possessing that "transcendental freedom" that Kant alleged to be essential to practical freedom? Well, as Laplace said to Napoleon about God, I have no need of that hypothesis. To recapitulate: First, Kant himself ended up saying that this is a "transcendental idea," of which we cannot understand even the possibility; second, I have backed this up by arguing that both determinism and indeterminism are figments of our philosophical imaginations; and third, in the conception of treating each other as amenable to reason (in the broad sense outlined here), we have all the free will worth wanting. (p. 161)

Formulated in the first-person and addressed directly to the reader, this is a suitably rousing conclusion to an excellent book.


In view of the fact that I have recommended reading Stevenson's Inspirations from Kant to most mainstream contemporary analytic philosophers working in M&E as an effective antidote to their unreasonable prejudice against transcendental idealism, it would somewhat blunt that point for me to spend much time or space in domestic philosophical disagreements with Stevenson about fine points of Kant-interpretation or Kantian philosophy. I will, however, say three very brief and comparatively minor things by way of criticism.

First, I do think that there is more to be said in favor of a Non-Conceptualist reading of Kant, as opposed to Stevenson's Conceptualism, that also preserves a suitably weak and defensible version of transcendental idealism. Second, I would have very much liked to see Stevenson develop the elective affinities between Kant's doctrine of Glaube and Kierkegaard's existentialism (as well as Pascal's), particularly in the context of Kant's moral theology. I think that Stevenson does this, at least to some extent, in the two essays on Kant's philosophy of religion that were not included in this collection, which leads me now to wonder aloud and explicitly: "Why weren't these two essays also included?" I for one would have very much liked to read them alongside the other essays. Third and finally, I think that although Stevenson's Kant-inspired epistemic approach to the free will problem is certainly a significant step in the right direction, nevertheless the free will problem also needs a more fully metaphysical solution. For all that Stevenson has said, it is still at least metaphysically possible that we are nothing but deterministic or indeterministic automata that merely epiphenomenally dream (in a reasons-sensitive way, to be sure) that we are free. In order for a Stevenson-style epistemic solution to be adequate and viable, the proposition that we are nothing but reasons-sensitive deterministic or indeterministic automata also has to be shown to be synthetic a priori impossible, in a way that is smoothly consistent with transcendental idealism.  Otherwise, to borrow Kant's lovely phrase in the Critique of Practical Reason at AK 5: 97, we will never have more than "the freedom of a turnspit."