Nathan Salmon

Content, Cognition, and Communication: Philosophical Papers II


Nathan Salmon, Content, Cognition, and Communication: Philosophical Papers II, Oxford University Press, 2007, 361pp., $55.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199284726.

Reviewed by Elia Zardini, Arché, University of St. Andrews


This is the second volume of the collected philosophical papers of Nathan Salmon. As with the first volume (Salmon [2005]), the publication of this book is most welcome. It collects together for the first time a group of papers by one of the most original, provocative and influential philosophers of language of the last three decades, constituting an extremely valuable resource for scholars in philosophy of language, philosophy of mind and epistemology. As the title aptly indicates, the issues dealt with in the various papers focus on three main broad areas: direct reference and beliefapriority and the semantics/pragmatics distinction. These areas might seem diverse and unrelated. But it is no accident that they constitute the three main focal points of a collection of papers by the author, since one of the doctrines for whose ingenious and sustained defence Salmon has made himself known over the years -- Millianism -- has momentous consequences in all three areas. That being noted, I hasten to add that, while the bold exploration and defence of Millianism certainly takes up a substantial part of these collected papers, it by no means exhausts the significance of the philosophical material contained in them, which abounds with other stimulating arguments, observations and views. I will give a perforce brief and incomplete presentation of the various papers, highlighting what I regard as the most interesting arguments and claims, and pointing out some problems that I believe affect them.


The collection is divided into four parts. Part I explores various themes concerning direct reference in natural language. In "A Millian Heir Rejects the Wages of Sinn" Salmon embarks on a staunch apologetic of Millianism -- roughly speaking, the doctrine that the contribution of a proper name to the semantic content expressed by a sentence in which it occurs (what Salmon calls 'the name's information value') is exhausted by the name's referent. (I'll follow Salmon in thinking of semantic contents as propositions and in calling 'singular propositions' those propositions expressible by sentences containing Millian proper names.) Some of the main and most straightforward objections to the view come from a cluster of intuitions directly or indirectly concerning semantic content. Firstly, there seem to be differences in semantic content between sentences that only differ with respect to co-referential proper names, as in:

(1) Phosphorus is Phosphorus.

(2) Phosphorus is Hesperus.

which, given certain plausible assumptions concerning the compositionality of semantic content, would imply that the information value of 'Phosphorus' is different from that of 'Hesperus'. Secondly, ordinary speakers informed of the extent of the Babylonians' astronomical knowledge typically judge:

(3) The Babylonians believed that Phosphorus is Phosphorus.

to be true, while also judging:

(4) The Babylonians believed that Phosphorus is Hesperus.

to be false. However, given certain natural assumptions about the semantics of belief ascriptions, Millianism requires (3) to be true iff (4) is.

Salmon's reply to both objections is elaborate (and was developed at greater length and detail in Salmon [1986]). He first argues that analogous problems arise on just about every theory of semantic content, so that the objections are likely to overgeneralise. The first objection is then addressed by saying that the informativeness of (2) may be due not to the content semantically expressed, but to some other content that is typically pragmatically imparted by an utterance of (2). Relatedly, Salmon addresses the second objection through his well-known analysis of belief ascriptions involving (more specifically, existentially quantifying on) the triadic BEL relation between subjectsstructured Russellianpropositions and guises (in which the propositions are presented to the subjects), and through the postulation of pragmatic mechanisms exploiting the elements introduced by the analysis. Here, I briefly want to mention a specific problem with understanding the notion of guise. How can a proposition have guises? Salmon's thought (at least in Salmon [1986], p. 108) was that grasping a singular proposition requires grasping the objects that constitute it. Such objects can typically be grasped under different modes of presentation. A guise of a proposition will then be composed (among other things) by certain modes of presentation of the objects that constitute the proposition. This simple and appealing thought generates, for each singular proposition s and each mode of presentation m of an object o constituting s, a class of guises of s agreeing in presenting o under m. As far as I can see, however, this does not yet get us anywhere near to generating, for each singular proposition s and distinct modes of presentation m0 and m1 of an object o constituting at two different positions p0 and p1 (say, as the "subject" and "direct object" of s), a class of guises of s agreeing in presenting the object in p0 under m0 (and not under m1) and in presenting the object in p1 under m1 (and not under m0). (Needless to say, guises along these lines are required by Salmon's treatment of (3) and (4).) Indeed, it is hard to see how that could in principle be done, since it would seem that [the object in po = the object in p1] and the context 'x presents under z' would seem to be extensional. This problem naturally calls for a notion of a mode of presentation of a certain object "as it occurs in a certain position in a proposition", but it is unclear what sense to make of such a relativised notion: objects don't seem to be presented to us relative to positions in a proposition.

Admirably (and typically) enough, Salmon tries to turn the tables and show how consideration of belief ascriptions actually provides an argument in favour of Millianism. He correctly notes that the standard semantics of quantification requires that a de re belief ascription like:

(5) For some xx is Venus and Jones believes that x is a star.

is true iff the embedded open sentence

(6) Jones believes that x is a star.

is true under some assignment A assigning Venus to 'x'. He then argues that what A assigns to 'x' can only be Venus itself -- for, if a mode of presentation were also assigned, (6) under A would be de dicto rather than de re. I think this sub-argument is objectionable in two respects. (The overarching argument for Millianism is completed by the (controversial) claims that what goes for variables under an assignment goes for constants, and that proper names in natural language are constants.) Firstly, from a witnessing assignment for (5) (namely A) specifying a mode of presentation it doesn't follow that (5) itself (which is true because of A) specifies a mode of presentation (just as from a witnessing assignment for 'For some xx is the shortest spy' specifying a particular person it doesn't follow that that merely existential statement itself specifies a particular person). Secondly, even if (5) specified a mode of presentation (as it could do for example on the theory mentioned at the end of section 4), it would still count as de re at least in the deep (and admittedly hard to characterise more exactly) sense of purporting to describe a situation in which Jones is in a certain kind of cognitive connection with Venus (as well as in the more operational sense of the term 'Venus' being intersubstitutable in it with any co-referential term).

In "Reflexivity" Salmon elaborates further his Millian theory of belief ascriptions in a sustained discussion of what he calls 'the Richard-Soames problem' (see Richard [1983] and Soames [1985]). Supposing:

(7) The astronomer believes that Phosphorus outweighs Hesperus.

to be true, the theory validates the move to:

(8) The astronomer believes that Phosphorus outweighs Phosphorus.

If the astronomer is rational, the plausible psychological principle:

(L1) If c believes that φα, then c believes that something is such that φit.

would then lead us to expect:

(9) The astronomer believes that something is such that it outweighs itself.

to be true as well (where English syntax requires substituting 'itself' for the last occurrence of 'it'), whereas it would seem to be clearly false for most astronomers in the situation described by (7). Salmon rejects the step from (8) to (9), considering the relevant instance of (L1) false. He nevertheless recognises the onus of providing a better substitute for (L1) which accounts for the latter's successes and failures, and proposes:

(L2) If (∃p)BEL(c, p, f[c, 'φα']), then (∃q)BEL(cq, f[c, 'Something is such that φit']).

where f is a (possibly partial) function that assigns to an English speaker c and a sentence φ the guise under which a proposition is presented to c when it is presented via φ.

However, it is arguable that on Salmon's theory (L2) has false instances for reasons very similar to those for which (L1) has. Consider taking our inspiration from Kripke [1979], a speaker who is unaware of the identity of any pianist with any statesman, assents to the sentence 'Paderewski is a pianist and Paderewski is a statesman' but only associates with it the guise that -- barring the worry presented above -- presents the subject of the first conjunct as a pianist and the subject of the second conjunct as a statesman. While such a speaker would verify the antecedent of (L2), she would falsify its consequent, as there would appear to be no proposition that she accepts under the guise she associates with the sentence 'Something is such that it is a pianist and it is a statesman'. In "Illogical Belief" Salmon advances a more general principle requiring that the subject recognise that the conclusion proposition follows from premise propositions she believes. While it avoids the previous problem, such a principle runs into trouble in cases where the subject knows that she believes a certain proposition thinking of herself only in a "third-personal" way. Interestingly, Salmon's treatment of the main example discussed in that paper virtually entails another kind of counterexample to (L2) (see section 4).

I'm also unconvinced by the use that Salmon, following Soames [1985], makes of the Richard-Soames problem in order to challenge theories that, while subscribing to important tenets of Salmon's own theory, identify semantic contents with (unstructured) sets of situations (rather than with structured propositions). The objection is that while:

(10) The astronomer believes that Phosphorus is such that it outweighs itself.

would seem to be just as false as (9), its embedded clause is true in all and only those situations in which (8)'s embedded clause is true. On such theories, it follows that the semantic content of the two clauses is identical, which in turn entails, given certain natural assumptions not in question, that (8) is true iff (10) is. Hence, since these theories are equally committed to (8), they are committed to (10). But why does Salmon think that (9) and (10) are clearly false? They are typically rejected by English speakers informed of the underlying facts, but, as we have seen, on Salmon's theory that is hardly conclusive evidence of their falsity. Salmon's apparent endorsement of the picture of belief according to which belief that P consists in assent to the proposition that P when this is presented in a suitable way (see e.g. Salmon [1986], pp. 167--168, n. 2) would suggest that he thinks that (10) is false because there is no sentence to which the astronomer is disposed to assent and which expresses the proposition that Phosphorus is such that it outweighs itself (whereas there is a sentence to which the astronomer is disposed to assent and which expresses the proposition that Phosphorus outweighs Phosphorus, namely 'Phosphorus outweighs Hesperus'). While that may be a stable view under the assumption that propositions are structured, it clearly begs the very question at issue, since, on the theories under discussion, there is indeed a sentence to which the astronomer is disposed to assent and which expresses the proposition that Phosphorus is such that it outweighs itself, namely 'Phosphorus outweighs Hesperus'.

In "Demonstrating and Necessity" Salmon offers an interesting alternative to the favoured account of (true) demonstratives in Kaplan [1989]. His main complaint against (his interpretation of) that account is that in giving semantic clauses only for the concatenation of a demonstrative with a demonstration (or description), it treats demonstrative pronouns and adjectives as incomplete symbols lacking an independent meaning. This objection is supposed to be dealt with by Salmon's proposal, which reads:

(T) With respect to any context c, the (English) content of an occurrence of a complex demonstrative 'that'^NP is the demonstratum of the demonstration assigned to that occurrence in c, provided: (i) there is such a demonstratum; and (ii) NP applies to it with respect to c. Otherwise 'that'^NP has no content.

A first thing to notice with rule (T) is that it is highly non-standard in assigning content not to an expression (relative to a context), but to an expression occurrence (relative to a context). It is not clear to me how to recast the rule in a more standard expression-based -- rather than occurrence-based -- semantic framework (see "A Theory of Bondage"), and, pending this, Salmon has not yet managed to provide an alternative to Kaplan's (expression-based) treatment. Secondly, I think that he has also failed to vindicate his repeated claim that 'that' has a unique meaning. For (T) secures a unique meaning for 'that' no more than its counterpart

(B) With respect to any context c, the (English) content of an occurrence of 'bank*' is the property (either of being a river bank or of being a money bank) referred to by the disambiguating intention assigned to that occurrence in c, provided there is such a property. Otherwise 'bank' has no content.

would do for 'bank*' if stipulated to hold (arguably, 'bank*' so introduced would be just as ambiguous in meaning as the English 'bank'). Relatedly, one should also note that (T) assigns a character only to 'that'^NP rather than to 'that' (when used in a complex demonstrative), and so would appear subject to the same objection that was levelled against Kaplan's account. Thirdly, taken at face value and added on top of the appealing account of validity for a context-dependent language offered by Kaplan's Logic of Demonstratives (see Kaplan [1989], pp. 541--553), Salmon's 'that' would make the consequence relation highly non-classical, since (T) guarantees that many classically valid argument forms will have instances (with multiple occurrences of 'that') that fail to preserve truth in some context (because of different demonstrations of different objects being assigned to different occurrences). The envisaged theory of validity could be repaired by restricting the range of contexts relevant for the definition of validity to those with only one demonstration, but that would seem no less arbitrary than restricting the range of contexts relevant for the definition of validity to those with only one object. (Notice that Kaplan's account is not subject to the same problem since, in some way or other, it incorporates demonstrations into the syntax.) Fourthly, and lastly, as Salmon himself remarks (T) entails that, relative to any context, 'that'^NP is a rigid designator of what it refers to. This consequence is problematic, however, as evidenced by:

(11) Had I had the winning ticket, I would have been that person and had you had the winning ticket, you would have been that person.

(uttered while sadly demonstrating the newly announced lottery winner).

In "A Theory of Bondage" Salmon develops an interesting semantic theory that assigns extensions (and information values) to expression occurrences rather than expressions. Such a framework makes it possible to raise the question of what the extension is (under an assignment) of an expression occurrence containing a bound occurrence of a variable. Salmon develops a simple and elegant theory answering this question. The basic idea is that the extension under an assignment A of an occurrence of an expression ζ bound by a sequence of variable-binding-operator phrases <B1α1B2αB3α3. . . , Bnαn> is the function from ntuples <i1i3i4. . . , in> (with ik belonging to the range of αk) to the ordinary extension of ζ under the modified assignment that is just like A possibly except for assigning ik to αk.

One point of the enterprise is to vindicate some suitable version of the Principle of Extensionality (PE), which, as Salmon points out, fails in standard expression-based semantics. Although under any assignment:

(12) (∃x) (Shirley MacLaine is a sister of x).

is true, the open formula:

(13) Shirley MacLaine is a sister of x.

is false under an assignment A assigning Marlon Brando to 'x'. So is the open formula:

(14) x ≠ x.


(15) (∃xx ≠ x.

is false rather than true (under A). While Salmon's theory may respect (PE) as far as bound occurrences are concerned, it is still committed to failures thereof for what we might call 'binding occurrences' (e.g. the first occurrence of 'x' in (12)), as it might be evinced by comparing the truth of (12) with the falsity of:

(16) (∃y) (Shirley MacLaine is a sister of x).

(under A). Let us assume that A assigns Brando also to 'y', and that the latter has the same range as 'x'. In expression-based semantics, the pair (12)/(16) violates (PE) because (16) results from (12) by substituting expressions that (under A) have as their extension Brando; in Salmon's occurrence-based semantics, the pair (12)/(16) violates (PE) because (16) results from (12) by substituting occurrences that (under A) have as their extension the identity function over the range of 'x'. The last co-extensionality claim follows from some niceties of Salmon's definition of scope; the more general point is that it is not clear how to develop the semantics so as to provide natural extensions for binding occurrences that vindicate (PE) (interpreted as encompassing them).

Another point of the enterprise is to help to expose some fallacies in certain recent influential arguments in the philosophy of language caused by confusing what a theory says about expressions with what it says about occurrences. In particular, in discussing a certain argument against E-type theories of donkey anaphora, Salmon puts forth the most natural reading of the rather theoretical:

(17) A comedian composed the musical score for City Lights. That he was multi-talented is a contingent truth.

as evidence that the donkey pronominal expression is rigid. Such a reading is however easily predicted also by a D-type theory (as in Neale [1990]), by exploiting the scope ambiguities generated by definite descriptions and hence without need to suppose that the expression 'he' contributes a rigid designator. Moreover, there seem to be non-rigid readings of similar donkey pronominal expressions, as in:

(18) Pedro ended up buying a donkey. But it would have been better if it had been a dog.

With Geach (see e.g. Geach [1962]), Salmon then argues that the occurrence of a donkey pronominal expression typically corresponds in logical form to a bound occurrence of a variable. Contra Geach, he postulates that in the logical form of:

(19) A comedian composed the musical score for City Lights. He was multi-talented.

the second sentence has an initial quantifier phrase binding the occurrence of 'he', yielding something like '[a y: comedian(y); y composed the musical score for City Lights] (y was multi-talented)'. Setting aside the question of the syntactic plausibility of this postulation, it would be interesting to develop this idea further in order to try to give a systematic account of a sufficiently wide range of cases of donkey anaphora. (For example, Salmon is aware that, for reasons pointed out in Evans [1977], pp.492-494, sometimes the hidden quantifier phrase will have to have universal rather than existential force. Still, I would point out that it cannot be a merely universal quantifier, lest the second sentence in:

(20) Just two actors starred in City Lights. They were both multi-talented.

be true in a situation where no actor starred in City Lights. It would seem that here Salmon needs to appeal to a rather artificial quantifier Q such that Q(FG) iff | | = 2 and F ⊆ G, and to higher-cardinality variants thereof to deal with analogous cases.) In so developing the idea, it will be crucial that the Scylla of undergeneration of admissible readings is not avoided only at the cost of steering straight into the Charybdis of overgeneration. An example of a pertinent challenge here will be to explain why there is no reading on which the second sentence in:

(21) I met a man yesterday. If some men I met yesterday are 29-years-old, he is 29-years-old.

expresses a truism (given that the hidden quantifier phrase should in general be allowed to govern only the consequent of a conditional, in order to account for common or garden donkey anaphoras such as 'If Pedro has a donkey, Pedro beats it').


Part II investigates several aspects of how direct reference impacts our understanding of apriority and analyticity. In "How to Measure the Standard Meter" Salmon takes issue with Kripke's [1980] famous contention that:

(22) The length of S at t0 (if it exists) is one metre.

expresses a proposition apriori knowable by a human being who stipulates that 'one metre' is to refer to the length of S at t(call that proposition, stipulator and length 'Peter', 'Hero' and 'Leonard' respectively). Assuming that Peter is a singular proposition about Leonard, Salmon expresses serious doubts that such a stipulation is ever sufficient to confer on Hero knowledge of Peter. In particular, he argues that, in case Hero has never come into empirical contact with S and Leonard (e.g. by seeing them), although she may knowapriori that (22) is true, she cannot grasp Peter and so a fortiori cannot disquote and know it apriori. (Note that Salmon grants that Hero's stipulation was successful, and hence that Hero can competently use 'one metre' to say things about Leonard. I'll briefly comment on this in section 5.) In case Hero has come into empirical contact with and Leonard (as we'll assume henceforth), Salmon grants that she knows Peter, but expresses serious doubts that such knowledge is apriori. For, as he points out, even if Hero could somehow already grasp Peter (say because she has already experienced Leonard in some other of its exemplifications), if she came to believe Peter merely on the basis of reflection without the relevant experience of S her belief would not be knowledgeable.

However, while this shows that experience does more than simply enable Hero to grasp Peter in some way or other, it falls well short of showing that experience does more than simply enable her to grasp Peter via the stipulation of the truth of (22). Even if Hero might already be able to grasp singular propositions about Leonard, experience might still simply play the additional role of enabling her to grasp those propositions by using 'one metre'. (Compare: it might be that a speaker needs experiential input to understand 'actually' and its relatives, even if she can already refer to the actual world by some other means without realising that it is the world "she is in". For such a speaker, experience would simply play an analogous additional role in her apriori knowledge that [snow is white iff, actually, snow is white].) Indeed, there are reasons to think that experience does simply play such an additional role (or, at least, no role that would detract from the apriority of Hero's knowledge), relating to the fact that the knowledgeability of Hero's belief seems to be pretty much insensitive to the quality of her experience. Firstly, it would seem that, in the kind of case in question, a belief in Peter is made knowledgeable by an experience e only if e does not present S as being, say, as long as the Brooklyn Bridge. However, it is arguable that Hero's belief would be knowledgeable even if her experience did present S as being as long as the Brooklyn Bridge. Secondly, it just seems to fly in the face of our limited powers of perceptual discrimination to think that, in the kind of case in question, casual observation can crucially contribute to the knowledgeability of a belief in Peter (understand 'one metre' as referring to a maximally specific length). (I offer a third, rather different, reason two paragraphs below.)

Salmon proceeds to defend the claim that there is a good argument to the effect that, contrary to a situation where Hero already uses another unit of measure, in a situation where the so introduced metre is the only unit of measure she knows (apparently aposteriori) how long S is at t0. He also defends the claim that there is a good argument for the opposite conclusion. He solves the tension by correctly emphasising the context dependence of knowledge-wh ascriptions. It remains however unclear whether the second horn of the dilemma can so much as be made plausible on Salmon's terms. He tries to push it by pointing to the fact that Hero would not be able to provide the canonical name of Leonard in, say, inches. However, linguistic abilities involving '39.3701 inches' or synonyms seem to be irrelevant in typical cases (a Russian scientist employing a much more fine-grained metric system than inches may typically count as knowing how long S is at t0) -- what seems needed is some relevant non-metalinguistic proposition Hero is still ignorant about. Interestingly, Salmon seems to be barred by his own dialectic from taking the natural candidate for this (i.e. the proposition that S at tis 39.3701 inches long). For, if 'one metre' contributes Leonard as information value (as required by Salmon's anti-Kripkean strategy), so, plausibly, should '39.3701 inches', and hence (by Millianism) Hero knows that S at tis 39.3701 inches long! This strongly suggests -- contrary to the original assumption in Salmon's anti-Kripkean strategy -- that measure phrases contribute as information value something more complex than their referent, a possibility that Salmon himself mentions in passing.

In "Analyticity and Apriority" Salmon develops the heterodox view, also advanced elsewhere in the collection, that, in a natural sense of 'analytic', sentences like (22) are analytic but express aposteriori propositions. Given certain natural assumptions, it seems that he is thereby committing to denying that the proposition expressed in Hero's idiolect and context by:

(23) 'The length of S at t0 (if it exists) is one metre' is true in my idiolect and context only if the length of S at t0 (if it exists) is one metre.

is apriori knowable by Hero. I would regard this as an implausible consequence of the view. For such a consequence is inconsistent with the appealing principle that, if a rational subject s with suitable conceptual resources grasps via a non-metalinguistic sentence φ in her idiolect and in a context c the proposition expressed by φ in I and c, the proposition expressed in I and c by:

(24) 'φ' is true in my idiolect and context only if φ.

is apriori knowable by s. In "How Not to Become a Millian Heir" Salmon seems to oppose something like the last apriority claim (with 'my idiolect and context' replaced by 'English' -- I ignore this difference in what follows) by appealing to content-preserving translations of, say, (23). I guess the idea is supposed to be that the fact that the content of (23) is not apriori knowable under the guise typically associated with such translations indicates that the content is not apriori knowable tout court. However, such a criterion would appear independently to undergenerate, since a content-preserving translation of an utterance of 'Snow is white iff, actually, snow is white' might be typically associated with a guise under which its content is not apriori knowable (consider a translation of 'actually' with 'that world' such that it is not apriori knowable that the world so demonstrated is the world "one is in").


Part III harks back to several salient themes already touched on in part I, developing some of the fine details of a theory of belief and belief ascriptions hospitable to Millianism. In "Illogical Belief" and "The Resilience of Illogical Belief" Salmon addresses an objection raised in Schiffer [1987]; [2006]. Suppose that Floyd knows full well that the reporter is the superhero, while also knowing about Lois' ignorance of that fact. Both:

(25) Floyd believes that Lois believes that Superman is a superhero.


(26) Floyd believes that Lois does not believe that Clark Kent is a superhero.

may well be true in such a situation. However, Salmon's version of Millianism reduces de re belief of x that Pit to de dicto belief in the singular proposition that Px (see "Is De ReBelief Reducible to De Dicto?"), and so would require:

(27) Floyd believes of Superman that Lois believes that he is a superhero.


(28) Floyd believes of Clark Kent (i.e. Superman) that Lois does not believe that he is a superhero.

to be true as well. This is problematic since Floyd may well be perfectly rational and by construction of the example does not associate two different modes of presentation with Superman that he does not recognise to present the same object.

Salmon offers an extremely interesting and penetrating discussion of the problem, in which the point already made in "Reflexivity" to the effect that one can believe of x that Pit(equivalently, on Salmon's view, believe that Px) without believing to be such that Pit (equivalently, on Salmon's view, without believing that x is such that Pit) is argued to extend to cases where 'Pit' contains only one unbound occurrence of 'it'. (Salmon then deploys such extension in "Relational Belief" against Quine's [1956] and Kaplan's [1986] analyses of de re beliefs in terms of attribution of the relevant property to the relevant res, and against Lewis' [1979] and Chisholm's [1981] similar analyses of de se beliefs.) The example is supposed to be given exactly by Floyd, who, despite the truth of (28), is argued not to believe Superman to be such that Lois does not believe that he is a superhero. Although Salmon is not very explicit about the diagnosis, the point would seem to rely simply on the conjunction of an appropriate theory of structured propositions and the possibility of, for some x, a subject's believing that Px without believing that it is x itself (rather than, say, x plus a mode of presentation) that exemplifies the property expressed by 'P'. If so, the point would seem to generalise even further -- contrary to what seems to be Salmon's view -- to cases where 'Pit' contains only one unbound occurrence of 'it' and this is in subject position. Consider Willard who assents to 'Rudolf is possibly a nominalist' but thinks that phrases like 'is possibly a nominalist' always create an opaque context that "looks" at the subject's mode of presentation rather than denotation. It is plausible to conclude from Willard's assent that he does believe of Rudolf that he is possibly a nominalist, but there seems to be no more reason for the further conclusion that Willard believes Rudolf to be such that he is possibly a nominalist than there is for the analogous conclusion in Floyd's case -- just as with Floyd, Willard does not assent to any sentence to the effect that Rudolf is such that he is possibly a nominalist.

Going back to the problem that I originally presented: Salmon's solution is that there is in effect an object with which Floyd associates two different modes of presentation that he does not recognise to present the same object -- not Superman himself, but rather the proposition that Superman is a superhero. This move raises a host of delicate issues, and I will here rest content with mentioning a couple. How can a philosophically unsophisticated subject such as Floyd so much as have the cognitive resources to mistake a proposition for two, given that he does not so mistake any of its constituents? And, granting that Floyd does so mistake the proposition that Superman is a superhero, how is it that it would still seem irrational in his state of information to harbour conflicting attitudes about its truth value?

In "Being of Two Minds: Belief with Doubt" Salmon further develops his theory of cognitive attitudes (and of the ascriptions of these attitudes) with regard to cases of conflict among these (as with Kripke's [1979] Pierre). He contrasts it in particular with the so-called 'hidden-indexical theory' (introduced in Schiffer [1979]), which for our purposes we can take to be just like Salmon's theory with the only exception that a belief ascription is also supposed to say that the relevant guise is of a contextually determined kind (where the kind in question is typically so fine-grained as to individuate a unique guise). Salmon argues that the hidden-indexical theory is bound to deem invalid the following argument:

(I1) Pierre believes everything Jean-Paul says about London.

(I2) Jean-Paul says (about London) that London is pretty.

(I3) Therefore, Pierre believes that London is pretty.

on the grounds that, in typical contexts, the theory predicts (I3) to carry information about a specific kind of guise which, according to Salmon, one would not be warranted to infer to simply on the basis offered by (I1) and (I2). Since Salmon grants that the theory can assume (I2) to specify the same kind as (I3), his point must be that it is (I1) to be too weak to sustain the inference. There are various ways however in which the hidden-indexical theorist could resist this last claim. She could flat-footedly insist that the quantifier phrase in (I1) changes nothing relevant as to its logical form, which still contains two references -- relating to Pierre's believings and Jean-Paul's sayings respectively -- to the kind also referred to in (I2) and (I3). Alternatively, she could adopt a more sophisticated analysis of (I1), which makes it equivalent with:

(I1*) For every (contextually salient) kind K, for every proposition P, if Jean-Paul says in a K guise that P about London, Pierre believes in a K guise that P.

Either way, (I1) would have the required logical strength. One might retort that, on either scheme, validity is vindicated at the cost of making it implausibly hard for utterances of (I1) to be true, but the complaint would seem to ignore the great flexibility enjoyed by the theory in the level of fine-grainedness of the kinds referred to (or quantified over): choosing suitably coarse-grained kinds will allow utterances of (I1) to be true despite the (likely) cognitive differences between Pierre and Jean-Paul.


Part IV discusses several foundational issues concerning the semantics/pragmatics distinction, using as a springboard the debate on so-called 'referential' uses of definite descriptions (i.e., uses where the speaker has some specific thing in mind she intends to refer to by using the description). In "Assertion and Incomplete Definite Descriptions" and "The Pragmatic Fallacy" Salmon argues against the following thesis concerning the semantic significance of referential uses:

(SS) In a context where a definite description ιx is used referentially, a sentence containing that description expresses a singular proposition about the object o the speaker intends to refer to, at least if o is the unique satisfier of φx in that context.

He grants that, in a referential use, such a singular proposition is asserted by the speaker, but insists -- rightly, in my view -- that that constitutes very poor evidence for (SS), which concerns what is expressed by the sentence (in a context). He then proceeds to offer a direct argument against (SS). Suppose that Keith correctly believes Jones to be Smith's murderer and, wanting to express his further belief that Jones is insane, utters:

(29) The murderer is insane.

in a context where Jones is the only salient murderer (so that Keith is using 'the murderer' referentially). Salmon points out that (SS) is virtually committed to holding that in Keith's context (29) is true with respect to a world where, although no one has murdered Smith and Jones has not murdered anyone, Jones is insane, and that in that context 'the murderer' denotes Jones with respect to that world. Salmon judges that to be implausible and to violate the intuition that ιxφcan never denote an object that does not satisfy φx (intuition which Salmon deems to ground the reluctance many have in accepting Donnellan's [1966] claim, that, in a referential use, ιxφx can refer to an object even if this does not satisfy φx).

One could legitimately retort here that the most natural interpretation of the contribution of 'never' to the content of the intuition in question is, roughly, as 'in no context' rather than 'in no circumstance of evaluation'. This could be supported by considering the role played by this and other adverbs of quantification in the expression of similar semantic intuitions: the intuition that ιx@φcan never denote an object that does not satisfy φx, the intuition that 'I' always refers to the speaker, the intuition that 'Now is three o'clock' is sometimes true sometimes false. Indeed, the 'in no circumstance of evaluation'-version of the intuition would seem to be false even for certain readings of definite descriptions used non-referentially. To wit, there is an easily accessible reading of:

(30) The teacher of Alexander is stillborn.

in an actual context and even when used non-referentially under which it is true with respect to a world where, although no one has taught Alexander, Aristotle is stillborn, and under which 'the teacher of Alexander' denotes Aristotle with respect to that world. (This can easily be accommodated and indeed predicted in the semantics by postulating, for example, that the description introduces a hidden world variable which, in the reading I'm focussing on, is contextually assigned the actual world.)

In "The Good, the Bad, and the Ugly" Salmon expands on his claim about what, in using a definite description, is asserted by the speaker, arguing that, quite generally, in uttering 'The F is G', if there is a (contextually) unique (let x be it), one asserts, among other propositions, the singular proposition that x is G (whether or not one is using 'the F' referentially). Given Salmon's anti-latitudinarianism about belief, he is committed to holding that in some situation, although one asserts that x is G, one does not believe it. This combination of latitudinarianism about assertion and anti-latitudinarianism about belief is in tension with the plausible principle that one should only assert what one believes (consider a case where one knows that there is a unique F but has no idea as to what that is: it does not seem that one would violate any norm of assertion if one uttered 'The F isF'). It also does not sit comfortably with the already mentioned picture of belief, so central to Salmon's own theoretical viewpoint (see sections 2, 3, 4), according to which belief that P consists in some form of assent to the proposition that P. Certainly, if one asserts a proposition, one is assenting to it, and why does that not count as a form of assent sufficient for belief?

Interestingly, Salmon uses latitudinarianism about assertion to explain so-called 'pseudo de re' uses (see Kaplan [1989], pp. 555--556, n. 71) as reports of genuine de re assertions. Pseudo de re uses are, roughly, uses where the speaker substitutes what she knows are co-referential singular terms inside a 'that'-clause of an attitude ascription. The standard example here is John uttering:

(31) The man I sent you yesterday is honest.

and David, thinking very little about the man in question, reporting:

(32) John said that the lying SOB who took my car is honest.

Salmon maintains that the first definite description in (32) takes wide scope over the attitude verb, and hence that (32) reports a de re assertion, which his latitudinarianism about assertion predicts to exist given an utterance of (31).

One problem with generalising this approach to the pseudo de re is that the phenomenon seems to persist even when the singular terms are substituted in positions that are not taken to be able to scope out of the attitude verb, as e.g. in relative clauses involved in noun phrases in the scope of the attitude verb (suppose that John utters 'The unicorn that belongs to the man I sent you yesterday is beautiful' and David reports 'John said that the unicorn that belongs to the SOB who took my car is beautiful'). A second problem is that the phenomenon seems to persist for belief ascriptions, even in cases where Salmon's anti-latitudinarianism about belief would concur in judging that no de re belief is present (suppose that John utters 'The tallest Chelsea supporter is honest' having no de re connection with such a man and David reports 'John believes that the tallest SOB supporting Chelsea is honest'). A final problem is that on Salmon's interpretation, assuming:

(33) John says that Scott wrote all the Waverley novels.

a plausible synonymy transformation yields:

(34) John says that Scott = the man who wrote as many Waverley novels as the number of Waverley novels.

and another one yields:

(35) John says that [the number n such that Scott = the man who wrote n Waverley novels] = the number of Waverley novels.

whence a pseudo de re substitution yields:

(36) John says that the number of countries in Utah = the number of Waverley novels.

and another one yields:

(37) John says that the number of countries in Utah = 29.


But it would seem that (33) can be unambiguously true and (37) unambiguously false, which, granting the truth preservingness of the synonymy transformations, would impugn that of (either of) the pseudo de re substitutions.


As the foregoing presentation should have indicated, the volume is very dense, with each paper containing, in addition to its own overarching train of thought, an impressive array of independently interesting arguments, remarks, examples, and open questions inviting the reader to extremely rewarding digressions (some footnotes have kept me thinking for afternoons). In spite of this richness of detail, however, the bigger picture is almost never lost sight of and one marvels at how Salmon's meticulous labouring of a seemingly minute point typically results in illumination of some of the deepest issues in the area.

Throughout the volume, the style is admirable for its clarity, precision and liveliness. Technicalities are kept to a minimum, and most of the material will be accessible to anyone with an undergraduate-level training in contemporary philosophy of language. There are a few typos scattered throughout this long book, but they almost never affect understanding. An odd feature that the collection format reveals is the fact that some paragraphs are reproduced from one paper to another. There are also some minor asymmetries and deficiencies in the referencing system that a more thorough editing could have avoided: some chapters have references at the end, others have them in the text; some chapters reference other chapters but provide page numbers only of the original version. In addition to the individual papers, the volume comes with an interesting introduction, a complete up-to-date bibliography of Salmon's works and a useful analytic index.

In conclusion, the collection as a whole sets forth one of the most advanced and systematic developments of a Millian perspective on singular thought. It is an absolute must for philosophers of language, philosophers of mind and epistemologists alike, and very warmly recommended to any philosopher with an interest in its topics. I've learnt much from studying the papers included in it, and I'm sure that many other readers will do so as well.[1]


Chisholm, R. [1981], The First Person, University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis.

Donnellan, K. [1966], 'Reference and Definite Descriptions', The Philosophical Review 75, pp. 281--304.

Evans, G. [1977], 'Pronouns, Quantifiers, and Relative Clauses (I)', Canadian Journal of Philosophy 7, pp. 467--536.

Geach, P. [1962], Reference and Generality, Cornell University Press, Ithaca NY.

Kaplan, D. [1986], 'Opacity', in L. Hahn, P. Schilpp (eds.), The Philosophy of W.V. Quine, Open Court, LaSalle IL, pp. 229--289.

Kaplan, D. [1989], 'Demonstratives', in J. Almog, J. Perry, H. Wettstein (eds.), Themes from Kaplan, Oxford University Press, Oxford, pp. 481--563.

Kripke, S. [1979], 'A Puzzle about Belief', in A. Margalit (ed.), Meaning and Use, Dordrecht, Reidel, pp. 239--283.

Kripke, S. [1980], Naming and Necessity, Blackwell, Oxford.

Lewis, D. [1979], 'Attitudes De Dicto and De Se', The Philosophical Review 88, pp. 513--543.

Neale, S. [1990], 'Descriptive Pronouns and Donkey Anaphora', The Journal of Philosophy 87, pp. 113--150.

Quine, W. [1956], 'Quantifiers and Propositional Attitudes', The Journal of Philosophy 53, pp. 177--187.

Richard, M. [1983], 'Direct Reference and Ascriptions of Belief', Journal of Philosophical Logic 12, pp. 425--452.

Salmon, N. [1986], Frege's Puzzle, Ridgeview, Atascadero CA.

Salmon, N. [2005], Metaphysics, Mathematics, and Meaning: Philosophical Papers I, Oxford University Press, Oxford.

Schiffer, S. [1979], 'Naming and Knowing', in P. French, T. Uehling, H. Wettstein (eds.), Contemporary Perspectives in the Philosophy of Language, University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis, pp. 61--74.

Schiffer, S. [1987], 'The 'Fido'-Fido Theory of Belief', Philosophical Perspectives 1, pp. 455--480.

Schiffer, S. [2006], 'A Problem for a Direct-Reference Theory of Belief Reports', Nous 40, pp. 361--368.

Soames, S. [1985], 'Lost Innocence', Linguistics and Philosophy 8, pp. 59--71.

[1] I would like to thank Walter Pedriali for carefully reading through and commenting on an earlier version of this review, which has been written while benefitting from an AHRC Postdoctoral Research Fellowship.