2011.12.27

Michael L. Frazer

The Enlightenment of Sympathy: Justice and the Moral Sentiments in the Eighteenth Century and Today

Michael L. Frazer, The Enlightenment of Sympathy: Justice and the Moral Sentiments in the Eighteenth Century and Today, Oxford University Press, 2010, 237pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195390667.

Reviewed by Sam Fleischacker, University of Illinois-Chicago


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At the beginning of this semester, a graduate student in my Hume seminar asked me if I knew of any good overall introduction to moral sentimentalist thought in the eighteenth century. This turned out to be a surprisingly hard question. I could think of many good books on individual figures who promoted an ethic of sentiment over an ethic of reason, but almost nothing on the relationships among these figures, or the general current of thought in which they participated. Having now read Michael Frazer's The Enlightenment of Sympathy, I would no longer be at such a loss. Frazer provides an excellent introduction to eighteenth-century moral sentimentalism. Beginning with Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, and Butler, he takes us on a well-informed tour of Hume and Smith, stopping along the way to note the advantages of Smith's conception of justice over Hume's, and concludes with Kant and Herder, stressing the former's early moral views and arguing that the latter really was closer to his Scottish contemporaries than to either Kant or Kant's idealist and romantic successors. In addition, Frazer's writing is crisp and clear, his readings fair and accurate, he covers his subject comprehensively, and, despite that, puts everything together in a concise package that can readily be assigned to undergraduates.

This is more a work of synthetic scholarship than an exploration of new territory, but Frazer also defends some controversial theses about the figures he discusses. Above all, he argues that the sentimentalists should not be understood as locating moral judgment purely in our feelings. Rather, the position Frazer attributes to them is one on which our moral sentiments are "the product . . . of an entire mind in harmony with itself, the faculty of reason included." (40) Even for Hume, he says, reason -- in the form of the calm passions -- plays a role in moral judgment, and Shaftesbury, Butler, Smith, the early Kant, and Herder emphatically endorse a "reflective sentimentalism," as Frazer calls it, in which our feelings are filtered through or combined with our reason.

This position is hardly new -- it indeed represents the current consensus of scholarly opinion on these figures -- but Frazer helps make it more plausible with some intriguing close readings. One of these notes the degree to which Kant himself builds an active use of reason into what he calls "passions" and urges, against Kant's own explicit claims, that passions should therefore be capable of being good as well as evil (129-31). This is a bit of a stretch, since Kant clearly sees passions as conditions in which we choose to endorse our feelings in defiance of our reason -- in which we choose to blind ourselves to everything but the object of our passion (Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View, Ak 7:266). This way of proceeding must be evil, on any view that makes autonomy a condition for good action. But Frazer is right that there is a more complex relationship between reason and feeling to be found in Kant than is sometimes supposed.

More problematic is Frazer's preference for the early, sentimentalist Kant over the later Kant who gave reason firm priority over sentiment. "Surely the view of the younger Kant is more intuitively attractive for those who value emotion as well as reason as integral to a well-balanced human mind," says Frazer (138). But there are important moral advantages to the views of the later, rationalist Kant that this endorsement fails to consider. It is, for one thing, the sentimentalist Kant who enthusiastically took on board Hume's racism, while in his later, rationalist period, Kant at least arguably established a standard for moral judgment that allows us to transcend the biases, including the racist biases, to which our emotions incline us, and a standard for moral worth that gives equal worth to all human beings. Some race theorists argue that Kant never himself overcame his own racism, but that need not affect the advantages of the theoretical tools he offers us in his mature writings, and in any case it is notable that the open, emphatic racism of his writings in the 1760s and 1770s is absent from his published works from the time of his 1785 Groundwork onwards. Like Frazer, I prefer reflective sentimentalism to the pure rationalism for which Kant is famous, but Frazer passes too easily, here and elsewhere, over the strong potential challenges, on moral grounds, that sentimentalism can face.

Perhaps he does this because reflective sentimentalism, as he construes it, is such a capacious category that even the late, Critical-period Kant might have little to lose by adopting it. This capaciousness, however, raises other problems -- above all, whether the category, thus construed, retains enough content to distinguish moral theories usefully. Consider, for instance, Frazer's recruitment of Herder into the fold. Acknowledging that Herder has never hitherto been regarded as a sentimentalist (139), and that he dismissed debates over the foundation of morality "as 'empty quarrels'" (149), Frazer says that he nevertheless "clearly placed himself in the sentimentalist camp." (149) But what Herder clearly does, in the passages that Frazer himself quotes just before making this claim, is refuse to countenance any distinction between cognition and feeling. Is that the same as opting for sentimentalism? Perhaps, if "reflective sentimentalism" is just the same as "psychological holism," as Frazer sometimes implies (149). But then we may wonder whether there is anyone who fails to belong to this expansive camp. Is there anyone in the history of moral philosophy who does not approve of our bringing our entire mind, in some fashion, to our moral judgments, of our reconciling our reason and our feelings? Some might do this, like Plato and Kant and the Stoics, by calling on us to shape or direct our feelings so that they yield to reason's guidance, while others urge us to put our reason at the service of our passions (as Hume seems to do, and Nietzsche surely does), but if holism is understood broadly enough, every moral philosopher will be a holist. According to Frazer, both arch-rationalists like Kant and arch-sentimentalists like Hume can be brought into the holist tent. But this surely suggests that the tent is too big -- and in any case should be characterized as Herder describes it: as a rejection of the distinction between reason and sentiment, not as "the sentimentalist camp."

This concern aside, Frazer's treatment of Herder is very good -- the most illuminating in the book, I think. Frazer rightly stresses the fact that Herder, far more than any other eighteenth-century sentimentalist, not only recognized that an ethic of sentiment might have to allow for variation in different cultural settings -- our emotions, more than our reason, being highly shaped by the social world in which we live -- but took this as a positive advantage of such an ethic. Hume and Smith had already recognized that some degree of cultural variation was likely to go along with the ethical position they favored, but they tended to play this down, emphasizing instead the general uniformity of human nature and excusing, rather than valorizing, cultural pluralism in ethics. As Frazer acknowledges (143-6, 154), one should not make this gap between Herder and his predecessors too wide. Hume speaks of "the great force of custom and education" in shaping our characters, even in the middle of his most famous discussion of uniformity of human nature, and comes very close to celebrating the differences to which custom and education give rise in "A Dialogue." Smith (in a passage Frazer does not cite) indicates that standards of politeness and frugality not only vary but rightly vary in the different social circumstances of Russia and France, or Poland and Holland, and sees "civilized" and "barbarous" nations as having different but equally admirable sets of virtues (Theory of Moral Sentiments V.2.7-9). There are thus strong intimations in Hume and Smith (and stronger ones yet in Leibniz and Lessing) of the cultural pluralism that Herder would come to espouse. But it is fair to say that Herder was the first champion of cultural pluralism, the first to present it as a clear moral good, from which we can all gain. And Frazer does a marvelous job of showing how Herder urges us to use a process much like Smithian sympathy to "feel our way into" the conceptions and attitudes of other cultures.

Frazer makes another interesting and useful point about Herder: that for all his pluralism, he believed there were certain central virtues, prominently including a sense of fairness or justice, that all human beings can share (160-7). By way of an ideal Herder called "humanity" (Humanität), which itself is more properly felt than judged of, we can come to develop common standards for right conduct across widely different nations or cultures. Simply appealing to reciprocity -- simply asking "What if that happened to me?" and noting how we then feel -- will help us grasp quickly what we should not do to others, and why others might be rightly angered by things we have done. (166) Herder thinks that this kind of shared feeling can lead us to replace our tendency to see members of other nations as enemies with an understanding of how much we all have in common and eventually bring us to "a shared commitment to a single conception of justice." (166) In this way, a sentimentalist ethic, even one that celebrates cultural diversity, has far more room for justice, with its universal demands, than one might suppose.

Throughout his book, Frazer is particularly good about the importance of justice. He rightly points out that Smith rejects the utilitarian conventionalism about justice proposed by Hume and instead derives "a liberal concern for fairness to individuals" (88) directly from our sentiments about what we owe others. This point is once again not new, but Frazer adds a nice twist to it by showing how all Hume's defenses of the rules of justice fall prey to the problem that it can come into sharp conflict with our other moral feelings. If the point of rules of justice is that, when practiced regularly, they are beneficial to society, then in many individual cases we may find that violating those rules, if we can do so without harming their general observance, is not only to our selfish benefit but to the good of other people we respect or care for. Not just the "sensible knave" but the "sensible utilitarian" and "sensible humanitarian," says Frazer, may have good reason to violate rules of justice, if they are merely conventions whose general observance helps society (80-88). Only a sentimentalism of the sort Smith came to espouse, in which our feelings can underwrite the rights of individuals directly, can account for the way we understand justice in ordinary life and maintain in us a robust sense that we ought to maintain just practices strictly, not carve out exceptions to it in the name of what seem to us the demands of humanitarianism.

I share Frazer's preference for Smith's conception of justice over Hume's, but am less confident that this preference is a rational one. On the descriptive level, at least, there is something very plausible about conventionalism as regards rules of justice: the rules we regard as expressing this virtue do vary enormously across places and times, for all that people in each society tend to be confident that their own set is the right one. And it is very difficult to come up with any set of rules of justice -- of property and contract, of a fair trial, of the rights that all states should guarantee -- to which people everywhere are likely to agree. So as much as we might all like to develop one correct conception of justice out of our sentiments about what every individual deserves, as Smith (and, it seems, Herder) advocates, this project may be a chimera, and Hume, more realistic than most of us in this as in practically everything else, might in the end be correct about the way in which, and degree to which, we can ever agree on systems of justice.

Still, Frazer is surely right that what we aspire to normatively looks more like what Smith proposes. And he is right as well to show how moral sentimentalism, and not just moral rationalism, can give rise to the individualist conception of justice that liberals generally want to hold. In this as in many other respects, Frazer demonstrates the degree to which the sentimentalist strand of the Enlightenment remains alive and useful to us today. His survey of the main representatives of this way of thinking is also erudite and lively, and will lead any reader, I think, to want to investigate the texts he discusses more closely. He thereby contributes both to the history and to the current practice of moral and political thought. He helps us resist the caricature of the Enlightenment that still too often circulates in the halls of academia, and shows us where to go if we want to mine the still rich resources that the period has to offer us, as we pursue our own reflections on how to live.