2012.01.01

Charles Taylor

Dilemmas and Connections: Selected Essays

Charles Taylor, Dilemmas and Connections: Selected Essays, Harvard University Press, 2011, 424pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674055322.

Reviewed by Alan Thomas, Tilburg University


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This volume collects sixteen recent papers by one of the most distinguished of contemporary philosophers, Charles Taylor. It is made up of three parts: The first, entitled 'Allies and Interlocutors', presents Taylor's engagements with the work of others: Iris Murdoch, Hans-Georg Gadamer, Robert B. Brandom and Paul Celan; the second groups together his recent work in political philosophy, notably on nationalism; and the final part expands the arguments of his most recent major monograph, A Secular Age.[1] The volume covers a very wide range of themes and I will be selective in my treatment of what I take to be its most important lines of argument.

I have the least to say about Taylor's engagement with his allies and interlocutors. Taylor is a person of broad sympathies -- there are few recent philosophers even in a position to discuss such a disparate group of influences -- and he is always lucid and insightful in his treatment of the ideas of others. That said, these chapters are mainly worth reading for the insight they give into Taylor's philosophy, as many of his distinctive concerns are present in these appreciations of others. These concerns include the claim that the distinction between fact and value is not itself a "fact". It is, rather, the expression of an underlying set of evaluative commitments that remain unacknowledged. The very outlook that motivates this distinction is forced into inarticulacy about its own moral sources. Taylor's attempt to address this intellectual bad faith invokes distinctive claims in the philosophy of language: one important thesis defended in this part of the book is that Brandom's holistic expressivism does not go far enough in its rejection of representationalism. The domain of practical-factual norms presupposes the use of language to disclose and to articulate. Taylor puts this understanding of language to use in his account of Iris Murdoch's work; it also connects naturally with his discussion of Celan.

The second part of the book consists of four papers in political philosophy. Taken together they represent Taylor's latest thoughts on the prospects for liberalism in societies characterized by cultural or ethnic diversity. Quebec's place in Canada is the example closest to Taylor's own concerns and is a touchstone throughout these discussions. These papers develop a theme that runs through the whole volume: a protest against a polemical and misguided use of the term "modernity" as a rhetorical device. In this part of the book, this conception of modernity features in the rhetoric of critics of nationalism. It forms part of an opposition to developments in our conception of political identity that Taylor views as historically inevitable. These critics find any form of nationalistic expression inherently irrational, or an outburst of atavistic feelings, an irruption into a modern political order of a phenomenon that we thought had become obsolete.

Taylor, however, shows how there are tensions internal to our modern conception of political legitimacy that make contestation of any given political identity inevitable. Since legitimate authority is an expression of "we, the people", there is an inherent pressure to democratic inclusion. However, various functional requirements threaten to make this inclusion a homogenizing process in a way that threatens particular identifications. Unable to accommodate hierarchies of different groups, owing to its constitutive egalitarianism of status, the modern democratic state works essentially by a forced inclusion. This leads, at its limit, to ethnic cleansing in cases where, as Michael Mann puts it, "demos" is identified with "ethnos". Drawing on the work of Anderson, Calhoun, Gellner and Liah Greenfeld, Taylor argues convincingly that no explanation of nationalism can be wholly state focused: a deeper account needs to examine the underlying changes in our collective social imaginaries that make it possible for a society to conceive of itself as a society of equals, acting freely in secular time, where each citizen stands in a direct and unmediated relationship to the state. If the modern conception of political legitimacy requires collective deliberation on the part of all, then any denial of expression to a minority group is bound to generate a nationalistic counter-pressure.

For those interested in the last smouldering embers of the liberal versus communitarian debate, Taylor now takes the irenic line that the kinds of plural identities that are the focus of his concern are special cases. They are, in turn, dependent on particular historical circumstances. In this book Taylor comes close to endorsing Rawls's "strictly political" conception of justice as fairness as an idea that is foundational for us. His quarrel is not with that idea, but with the separate idea that any act of constitutional founding could, once and for all, solve the issue of political identity. If such identity is an inherent part of our modern conception of democracy, then I think Taylor is right that any workable solution to the problem of identity is going to require what he calls a "shared identity space". This shared space is necessary in order to accommodate the special claims that arise in certain circumstances, such as the place of a miniature nation state like Quebec in an immigrant society, or the place of first-nations people in a nation state. These are, notably, two features of the Canadian situation, but it was not clear to me how far these cases generalize to pose a problem for liberalism per se.

Taylor notes that societies change their moral outlook through time and through large-scale migration, but these facts alone do not seem to place every liberal settlement in the situation of Canada. Taylor calls arguments that make one's role as citizen primary over one's other attachments a form of "Jacobinism". That is because he associates them with France's over-reaction to the wearing of the Muslim veil in public spaces such as schools. He quite reasonably protests at this confusion between state neutrality and state enforced secularism (particularly when the latter is enforced in an inconsistent way). However, given that Taylor takes state neutrality to be even more important in diverse societies than in monocultural ones, it is not clear why he objects to an association between the prioritizing of citizenship over one's other identities and an appropriate form of neutrality that does not confuse neutality with secularism. (Taylor's only argument here is that any such idea will founder on the rapidly evolving social reality that it confronts.)

The third and final part of the volume develops the themes of Taylor's recent work on the place of religious belief in a modern society. Again, his particular target is the polemical use of the term "modernity", a theme central to the most important chapter of the book entitled 'A Catholic Modernity?' Tempting though it is to see the decline of religious belief in contemporary societies as the triumph of modernity, construed as the triumph of a scientific worldview over an age of naïve religious belief that reflected our collective intellectual immaturity, a truthful narrative of these transitions is more nuanced. According to Taylor, religion is not undermined by science; instead, at a deeper level, the values of what Taylor calls the "mainline Enlightenment story" and the values of the transcendent are perceived to be morally incompatible.

These essays see Taylor working in two registers: one, as he puts it in 'A Catholic Modernity?', addresses "honest thinkers of any and all metaphysical or theological commitments", whereas the other addresses those of a wider Christian faith. The diagnosis is the same for both groups: there is no convincing narrative that contrasts a past age of Christian belief with liberation into a modern age of unbelief. However, if this message is understood as a vindication of an unbroken tradition of Christian belief that continues unchanged into modernity, that is to misconstrue Taylor's purpose. The process that was represented by the false picture of the relation between belief and modernity as a rupture, a negation of belief by unbelief, actually has a different and more subtle logic. It should come as news to both Christians and secularists that "modern culture, in breaking with the structures and beliefs of Christendom, also carried certain facets of Christian life further than they were ever taken or could have been taken within Christendom". (p. 170) The misleading appearance that we live in an age of unbelief is, in fact, a development in the understanding of the possibilities of Christian faith that I (if not Taylor) am inclined to call "dialectically necessary". For Taylor, our distinctively modern concern with the primacy of life stems from Christian roots, but it needed to break with Christianity in order to affirm such modern ideas as those of unconditional human rights. As Taylor puts it, the Christian looks on with "humility and unease", both humbled by seeing that a break with Christianity was necessary for these moral developments and uneasy at the loss of the transcendent given that the moral sources underpinning these developments were ostensibly those of a view that Taylor labels "exclusive humanism".

Taylor openly welcomes this historical development. The aim of a pre-modern Christian society was "the attempt to marry the faith with a form of culture and a mode of society". Taylor believes that any aim of this kind carries inherent political dangers. This precedent Christian culture was freed from those dangers by the unconditional guarantee of universal rights in modern liberalism. Thus this project was saved from itself: "there can never be a total fusion of the faith and any particular society, and the attempt to achieve it is dangerous for the faith". (p. 170)

This sets the scene for Taylor's most complete description of the competing currents in modern culture as "the scene of a three cornered, perhaps four cornered, battle". (p. 180) The main axis of this debate is between exclusive humanism and those who are residually drawn to the appeal of the transcendent. This tradition is clearly Taylor's own. (It is a Catholic outlook that he sees as directly paralleled by central themes in Buddhism.) This tradition has to give its own account of the affirmation of ordinary life and human flourishing, both of which are understood in self-sufficient terms by the secular humanist. The latter humanistic tradition originated in a Protestant critique of "monkish pride", but it expanded to become a wholly secular ethical debunking of religious aspiration to the transcendent. This ethical critique understands such aspiration as the misleading guise taken by the vices of pride, elitism and a desire to dominate others (along with "fear and timidity"). This tradition takes a certain understanding of religion as something to be overcome, both by secularists and believers alike, if the primacy of life is rightly to be our orienting value. That produces what Taylor takes to be our recent hyper-sensitivity to any mention of the transcendent. Any such appeal is viewed as a retrograde step to an older conception where the goal of Christian renunciation worked to undermine the primacy of life in the name of higher spiritual goals. (I will return to Taylor's attempt to resolve this particular deadlock.)

Taylor is clearly identified in this book with the ongoing tradition that appeals to the transcendent: a general sense that life "is not the whole story" and that the cessation of life is not a mere negation. (This is not, then, the idea that life simply goes on beyond death.) Life as a whole has an ultimate ground that gives it point. One way to articulate this idea further is that "aiming beyond life" is to be open to a "change of identity", an openness to the transformative possibilities of faith. (p. 174)

The second axis of the debate is between exclusive humanism and a threat from within it, a reaction against the primacy of life as spiritually unfulfilling. Nietzsche and neo-Nietzscheans occupy this place in Taylor's narrative. These anti-humanists claim that the demands of life can be expressed in the form of cruelty, domination and exclusion. Moreover, the demands of life can take these forms "in [life's] moments of most exuberant affirmation". It represents another spiritual dissatisfaction with the affirmation of the primacy of life, an ironic mirror of a strand of Christian faith that seeks purity through renunciation. Anti-humanism does not go beyond life, but it does cultivate a fascination with the negation of life, namely, death and suffering.

Why is there a fourth party to this dispute? Taylor's explanation is that "acknowledgers of transcendence" are themselves divided: one party in this tradition thinks that secular humanism is an error through and through. Taylor dissents because of his belief that "the practical primacy of life has been a great gain for humankind" and that great gain could not have been achieved solely by Christianity. He adds: "we might even be tempted to say that modern unbelief is providential, but that might be too provocative a way of putting it". (p. 181)

Taylor wants to go beyond diagnosis and to resolve positively these contrasting arguments over the ultimate goods that can sustain our ethical commitments (about which he takes there to be a high degree of consensus).[2] He puts his arguments in terms of risks: if you deny transcendence, as exclusive humanism does, you put in danger the gains of this entire historical shift, namely, "the primacy of rights and the affirmation of life". This is the further articulation of the arguments of Sources of the Self that the exclusive humanist is living beyond his or her means morally speaking.[3] The risk of this stance is its vulnerability to Nietzschean debunking. If the humanist cannot explain her allegiance to the hypergoods that underpin these modern commitments, the anti-humanist is waiting to debunk this entire set of moral gains.

How convincing are these arguments? Those committed to "exclusive humanism" will note that in Taylor's diagnosis we are living with insufficient moral sources only because of how Taylor construes the task allotted to them. To continue the metaphor, they have to fund living up to the ethical demands of a secular transposition of Christian ideals. The modern moral development within the ethical that most impresses Taylor is that which Peter Singer called the "expanding circle" of moral concern. It is sensitive to all forms of suffering and is universalistic. It is clear that some reductive traditions of post-Enlightenment theorizing -- such as foundationalist forms of utilitarianism -- are going to be poorly placed to explain why these moral sources have their hold on us.

However, just as from Taylor's Catholic perspective a break with Christianity was a dialectically necessary moral development in our understanding of the demands of agape, so secular humanism is burdened by having inherited its tasks from what is (from its perspective) a temporally prior Christian age. The diagnosis that its moral sources are "insufficient" comes not from its perspective, but from Taylor's. That is only because of his conception of what those sources need to sustain. It is certainly true that there are issues in current moral philosophy that clearly exhibit the general pattern of Taylor's diagnosis: the problem of moral demandingness in the form in which we have inherited it is a good example. It is less clear to me than to Taylor why the exclusive humanist cannot resist the terms of the problem: precisely those terms, in fact, inherited from its Christian sources.

My response to these complex and subtle arguments is that Taylor is not identifying actualities, but risks. Nor are these risks run by exclusive humanism somehow fated to become actualities. The assessment of the risks that this outlook faces comes from Taylor's understanding of what the moral demands are that exclusive humanism needs to sustain: the demands of the ethical are pitched very high. Furthermore, Taylor is not in the business of issuing "guarantees" as he puts it, even from a Catholic perspective. It is an issue of faith that he takes his understanding of the unconditionality of Christian agape (or Buddhist karuna) to offer a more robust source for our modern commitments than exclusive humanism.

This entire discussion takes place at a level of sophistication that reflects the depth of Taylor's scholarship and the acuity of his judgement. The argument is taking place precisely where it should: within a moral philosophy informed by an historical understanding where one set of moral considerations is set against others. The only way forward here, as Taylor puts it, is to ask "who can make more sense of the life all of us are living?" (p. 178)

As Taylor has just celebrated his eightieth birthday it is an opportune moment to look back on a nearly fifty-year career that began with the publication of The Explanation of Behaviour in 1964. It has been a career in philosophy -- and as this book shows it is by no means over -- distinguished by an unmatched breadth of scholarship, intellectual optimism, and philosophical intelligence. The essays in this collection exemplify all these qualities: for formulating vitally important issues for us in this way we are all very much in Taylor's debt.


[1] Charles Taylor, A Secular Age, Harvard University Press (2007).

[2] For a more circumspect diagnosis see Charles Larmore's review of A Secular Age, 'How Much Can We Stand?' in The New Republic, April 9, 2008, pp. 39-44, esp. pp. 43-44.

[3] Charles Taylor, Sources of the Self: the Making of the Modern Identity, Cambridge University Press (1992).