2012.01.27

Cynthia Townley

A Defense of Ignorance: Its Value for Knowers and Roles in Feminist and Social Epistemologies

Cynthia Townley, A Defense of Ignorance: Its Value for Knowers and Roles in Feminist and Social Epistemologies, Lexington Books, 2011, 126pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739151051.

Reviewed by Marianne Janack, Hamilton College


Cynthia Townley's book brings together virtue epistemology and social epistemology to argue that epistemic virtues are not adequately understood if we take epistemic individualism and the maximization of true belief to be the starting points for a discussion of epistemic practice and value. This book continues an important discussion of epistemic injustice initiated primarily by Miranda Fricker (2007) and is an interesting and thought-provoking contribution to that discussion. Townley's discussion of the role of trust in testimony is very interesting and constitutes an important contribution to theories of trust, and the ways she combines the insights she gleans from social epistemology, virtue epistemology, and feminist epistemology are quite fruitful, making the book well worth reading for those of us interested in these areas.

Townley argues that traditional approaches to virtue epistemology have focused too narrowly on knowledge acquisition and transmission as the goals of epistemic life. Given the fact of epistemic interdependence (the methodological starting point for social epistemologies), Townley claims that virtue epistemologies need to attend to the ways in which some exercises of epistemic agency are good in and of themselves, and that some aspects of a virtuous epistemic community mean that the goal of acquiring or transmitting true beliefs must be traded off against other kinds of goals. Townley's examples of the kinds of epistemic virtues that might take priority over the goal of truth-seeking include the maintenance of relationships that are based on trust, and the goal of allowing knowers in a community the full exercise of their epistemic agency. The maintenance of responsible epistemic relationships and the nurturance of epistemic agency are two epistemic values that do not reduce to, and may in fact come into conflict with, the value of increased knowledge, understood as justified true belief.

If, for instance, I have access to a wide range of interesting and important truths, but cannot myself be taken to be an authority, or cannot be acknowledged by others as an epistemic agent, then no increase in the true beliefs I can know will make up for what has been denied me; to be able to act as an authority, to be taken seriously, and to be treated as a trustworthy knower are all goods in their own right, and their value cannot be captured if we focus too narrowly on the idea that epistemic virtues are virtues because they are truth- or knowledge-conducive. The full exercise of an agent's epistemic powers is itself an epistemic good that, if denied, cannot be replaced by an increase in her store of justified true beliefs.

Similarly, if some group of knowers is systematically excluded from some realm of epistemic activity, then their exclusion is an epistemic harm -- not just a social or political harm -- even if their inclusion in the epistemic realm from which they are excluded would not necessarily mean that the community of knowers who constitute that realm would know more truths about their target of study. Townley says that this non-instrumental view of epistemic relationships leads to a need to attend to ignorance and inter-agent virtues, such as trust.

There are four chapters in the book, in addition to the introduction and a short conclusion: (1) "Epistemic Dependence: Beyond Facts;" (2) "Ignorance and the Interdependence of Epistemic Agents;" (3) "Institutional Epistemic Dependence;" and (4) "Ignorance, Arrogance, and Pluralism." The part of the argument that defends the strong claim that ignorance has value is to be found primarily in Townley's discussion of trust in chapter 2, while the other chapters generally defend a weaker claim -- that ignorance has been ignored (sorry, I couldn't resist) because of the "epistemophilia"[1] that characterizes traditional epistemology. Epistemophilia and its ally -- veritism -- are acceptable within appropriate bounds, Townley argues, but taken to excess they tend to deform analyses of epistemic practice, making it difficult to see how epistemic practice might intersect with, support, or undermine ethical practice, political practice, and social practice. Similarly, epistemophilia distorts the kinds of virtuous relationships that need to exist in virtuous epistemic communities. Townley's corrective for epistemophilia is an explicit focus on ignorance and a bracketing of the assumption that all ignorance is bad. The value that epistemology should attribute to knowledge and to ignorance should be responsive to context, Townley argues: knowledge is not always good, and ignorance is not always to be avoided. Taking this view of ignorance shows that virtuous epistemic traits need not be truth-conducive.

Townley begins by distinguishing simple ignorance from other forms of ignorance, including entrenched or interested ignorance (discussed by Frye (1983), Mills (1997) and in a special issue of Hypatia dedicated to epistemologies of ignorance edited by Shannon Sullivan and Nancy Tuana (vol. 21, no. 3)). Her discussion of ignorance focuses on simple ignorance, which she defines as a lack of knowledge that could be acquired relatively simply (x). While later sections of the book do address issues that have to do with entrenched, interested ignorance (and this kind of ignorance is a form that she does not defend), Townley focuses on simple ignorance because it has been given less attention in feminist and social epistemologies and has been fairly explicitly rejected as a possible epistemic virtue.

The next distinction that Townley draws, which is essential to her argument, is the difference between trust and reliance. Townley's discussion of testimony, and its role in virtue and social epistemologies, turns on the difference between epistemic dependence understood as a reliance on other knowers for information and epistemic dependence understood as trusting other knowers. Insofar as we treat other knowers and their testimony as giving us information, we rely on them for that information. But in this respect, other knowers are no different to us than reliable instruments upon which we rely for information: there is, from this perspective, no difference between an accurate thermometer and an accurate or reliable informant. Townley argues that our relationships with other knowers are deeper than this -- that we do not (and should not) simply treat other knowers as means to getting more and better information. Rather, we come to be members of the community of reasoners by coming to see other knowers as subjects, and in this sense we do not merely rely on them; some knowers are people we trust, and we recognize them as epistemic agents in their own right. Reliance and trust are two distinguishable aspects of epistemic dependence, and this distinction allows Townley to argue that inter-agent virtues are as important as the epistemic virtues that an individual possesses. This distinction also provides us with a more sophisticated and deeper understanding of epistemic dependence.

Townley argues that respect for other agents -- taking them to be more than mere sources of information -- can override the value of acquiring true beliefs in some instances, and this is particularly true when it comes to the virtue of preserving trusting relationships. She maintains that the maintenance of trusting relationships involves the willingness to forgo acquiring certain beliefs, because when we trust another epistemic agent, we implicitly agree to refrain from verifying independently what she tells us. Were we to seek out independent verification, we would be undermining the trust relationship, since the trusted person takes the trustor to have committed herself to not seeking independent verification. Townley's analysis of the multiple layers of interdependence that characterize and in fact give rise to epistemic agency help us see why this complex interdependence changes the contours of epistemic virtue theory.

Townley also discusses two important objections to her account of trust. One objection comes from the attitudinist: that trust is not a commitment, but is instead an affective attitude, as Karen Jones (1996) has argued. Townley says that the affective attitude analysis of trust focuses exclusively on the trustor and not on how the trustee is able to recognize and respond to that trust. The second objection comes from an account of epistemic virtue offered by Elizabeth Fricker (1994). This objection is that the trust a hearer puts in the reliability or sincerity of a particular testifier can be justified by other beliefs one has about the testifier. If this is so, then one can independently verify the trustworthiness of a testifier, and so only the gullible extend trust presumptively. Drawing on this argument, Townley considers the possibility that epistemic virtue might require that a hearer take a critical attitude toward testimony. She concludes that if we accept the distinction between reliance, in which I take a person to be a reliable source of information, just as I would my outdoor thermometer, and trust, then this objection loses its force.

Townley argues that epistemic virtue does not require complete gullibility, but it does not require a critical stance in the face of testimony either. Suspicion or an overly critical attitude can undermine epistemic relationships, and so trust (and, by extension, ignorance) can be an ally of epistemic virtue.

Townley takes a bold stance in the first two chapters, and they are the heart of the argument for the positive value of ignorance; the last two chapters offer a more qualified account of the value of ignorance. These chapters do not argue for the value of ignorance itself, but for the value of making room for ignorance in an account of epistemic practices and epistemic virtues. Chapter three argues that the lack of attention to ignorance leads to an insufficiently thin notion of epistemic responsibility and expertise. If we understand epistemic responsibility as the obligation to know more or to share information we miss the fact that it sometimes involves holding back certain information so that a non-expert audience can better understand. The responsible exercise of expertise cannot be understood on the model of epistemology that treats the primary epistemic good as the maximization of true beliefs because the power relationships that characterize the interactions between expert and non-expert knowers require an analysis that recognizes the ways that power and authority structure epistemic relationships. Cooperation among members of an epistemic community is often best served by "trust, selectivity, and discretion" (60), all of which are virtues that may compete with the idea of maximizing the number of true beliefs epistemic agents hold or share with other knowers.

Chapter four argues that some ways of collecting knowledge are both morally and epistemically irresponsible. Townley uses practices involved with bioprospecting to illustrate this claim. Bioprospecting involves the search for biological samples that have pharmaceutical or other kinds of potential uses. It is often initiated by large multi-national corporations based in industrialized nations, with a view to producing patentable products. Townley argues that the sustenance of epistemic agency and epistemic relationships should take priority over the goal of simply collecting information, and that an important part of epistemic responsibility in these cases is the recognition, on the part of researchers, of the ways in which indigenous medical practices and practitioners are situated in their own complex relationships. Furthermore, she argues that these interactions are susceptible to a particular kind of epistemic harm: that of a failure to give appropriate credit, which she argues is a form of epistemic injustice. Another and related form of epistemic injustice she examines in this chapter is the problem of arrogance, in which "an arrogant agent can over-claim authority by dogmatism, dismissing challenges, ignoring alternative views or requests for justification, or discrediting another epistemic agent's claims" (102). This form of epistemic injustice need not occur across ethnic, racial, or class divides, but can be a temptation in our everyday encounters with people we live with.

Townley's focus on ignorance is a way of recognizing that other agents are more than just sources of information, but have their own ways of relating to their beliefs and their epistemic character that must be honored in our interactions with them. So, Townley argues, an epistemological approach that does not assume that ignorance is to be remedied, or that ignorance is always an epistemic weakness, is better able to balance the different epistemic virtues that epistemic interdependence and cooperation call for.

This seems like a recommendation worth taking. However, I might quibble with her definition of simple ignorance as the refusal to seek out knowledge when one could easily do so. For instance, it seems to me that ignorance is, prima facie, a vice, and that refusing to seek out knowledge that we could easily get is something different. That description is not, I think, an adequate definition of what we mean by ignorance. Refusing to seek out knowledge is a more neutral state of affairs, a form of inaction that we cannot avoid to some extent given the real constraints on our time and attention, and thus not so much an epistemic vice as an epistemic limit. I think that Townley could have taken the less contentious position that ignorance is prima facie a vice, that its perniciousness (which she recognizes in chapters three and four) shades into neutrality in some instances, and that its exclusion from the realm of epistemology has deformed our understanding of epistemic virtue and epistemic communities. This more moderate approach would not, I think, undermine her argument. Nevertheless, my objection aside, I think the book provides a sophisticated analysis of epistemic interdependence and contributes significantly to the literature on epistemic virtue and epistemic injustice.

Works cited

Fricker, Elizabeth (1994) "Against Gullibility" in Knowing from Words, edited by B.K. Matilal and A. Chakrabarti, Dordrecht: Kluwer. p. 125-62.

Fricker, Miranda (2007) Epistemic Injustice: Power and the Ethics of Knowing, New York, New York: Oxford University Press.

Frye, Marilyn (1983) The Politics of Reality: Essays in Feminist Theory. Trumansburg, NY: The Crossing Press.

Jones, Karen (1996) "Trust as an Affective Attitude" Ethics, 107: 4-25.

Mills, Charles (1997) The Racial Contract. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.


[1] Townley credits this term to Lorraine Code.