2012.02.24

Matthias Baaz et al. (eds.)

Kurt Gödel and the Foundations of Mathematics: Horizons of Truth

Matthias Baaz, Christos H. Papadimitriou, Hilary W. Putnam, Dana S. Scott, Charles L. Harper, Jr. (eds.), Kurt Gödel and the Foundations of Mathematics: Horizons of Truth, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 515pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521761444.

Reviewed by Michael Liston, University of Wisconsin-Milwaukee


This volume collects twenty-one of the invited essays presented at the Vienna Gödel centenary symposium in 2006. The contributors are leading researchers in mathematics, mathematical logic, computer science, philosophy, theology, and history of mathematics. The preface tells us that the interdisciplinary symposium provided new insights into Gödel's life, work, legacy, and their implications for future research. The editors' goal is to create a lasting impact on the academic community by taking advantage of the rich intellectual exchange at the symposium to produce a volume that covers both the technical and the profoundly reflective aspects of Gödel's work and that will interest both specialized and multidisciplinary readers, including graduate students and informed non-specialists. The volume falls short of success in achieving this goal. On the one hand, some of the more technical papers presuppose specialist knowledge that few philosophers and even fewer non-specialists will possess. On the other hand, some of the papers apparently inspired by profound reflections and aimed at a broader readership are highly speculative and hardly meet philosophical standards of clarity and cogency. Moreover, the volume is a mixed bag: some essays are very good; some are not recommendable; some are middling.

The volume has three parts: Part I, "Historical Context: Gödel's Contributions and Accomplishments," contains ten essays; Part II, "A Wider Vision: The Interdisciplinary, Philosophical, and Theological Implications of Gödel's Work," contains six essays; Part III, "New Frontiers: Beyond Gödel's Work in Mathematics and Symbolic Logic," contains five essays. Given some of the editors' goals, one can see the rationale for this organization. Nevertheless, it is not optimal, since positions that directly engage each other are taken in essays in separate parts of the book -- this is especially true of some essays in Parts I and III -- and the editors might have better promoted intellectual exchange by organizing essays according to the questions they address. In any case, this is how I shall proceed as I discuss the essays.

1. Mathematics, Logic, and Set Theory

Several essays devoted to these areas in Parts I and III tackle, either directly or indirectly, the following question: to what extent did (or should) Gödel's work, especially his incompleteness theorems, influence the development of mathematics? Ivor Grattan-Guinness provides a straightforward response, tracing the reception of Gödel's 1931 theorems in the logic and mathematics literature up to the early 1960s. He identifies their significance as follows: the first theorem sank logicism; the second sank Hilbert's Program; Gödel's proof methods contributed to the growth of recursion theory, to the impossibility theorems of Tarski, Turing, and Church, and to the importance of distinguishing theory and metatheory. Grattan-Guinness concludes that the significance of the theorems was quickly appreciated by mathematical logicians but almost entirely ignored by the wider mathematical community until the mid-1950s when American authors, especially James Roy Newman, popularized and disseminated them.

Other essays show that Grattan-Guinness's analysis becomes quickly complicated. Both Angus Macintyre and Georg Kreisel reply to our question: "very little, and properly so". Macintyre and Kreisel aim to resist "the cult of impotence" that persists in popular and philosophical literature devoted to interpretations of Gödel's work. Macintyre argues that a sober appraisal that resists philosophical interpretations and confines itself exclusively to Gödel's impact on pure mathematics indicates that: the logical work of many of Gödel's contemporaries proved to be more mathematically fertile than Gödel's work on unprovability; number theorists have made sensational progress, acknowledging undecidability yet treating it as irrelevant to most of their problems because there is generally little connection between logical form (whose structural properties Gödel relied upon) and mathematical relevance (which depends on hidden geometric and analytic structure); set theory, as a new branch of advanced mathematics, will not have any significant influence on other vigorous parts of mathematics. Macintyre provides numerous examples to support his claims and conjectures (in a long appendix) that the modularity theorem Wiles used to prove Fermat's Last Theorem is arithmetical and can be proven without set theory.

Contrary to Macintyre, Harvey Friedman argues, also largely by example, that Gödel's work has a substantial and extensive potential impact on mathematics. Part of his essay is devoted to showing that Gödel's work has had numerous concrete applications: to the unsolvability of Hilbert's Tenth Problem of effectively finding rational integer solutions to Diophantine equations; to better proofs of the second incompleteness theorem that provide a direct formalization (that doesn't proceed through the indirect method of Gödel-numbering) of Con(T), the sentence expressing the theory's consistency; to open questions regarding bounds of computational and proof complexity; to the investigation of constructive proof techniques based on Gödel's negative interpretation of Peano Arithmetic in Heyting Arithmetic and his Dialectica interpretation of intuitionistic number theory in his theory T; to proof mining in analysis by Kohlenbach and others; and to open questions in set theory. The rest of the essay is devoted to Friedman's own work extending incompleteness in new directions (well quasi-order theory, Borel selection theory, Boolean relation theory, the search for explicit Π-0-1 sentences that are both concrete and require large cardinals to prove).

As a counterweight to Macintyre, Friedman's argument seems stretched. Macintyre seems right about the historical development of mathematics over the past eighty years: Gödel's influence, though powerful, is quite restricted to mathematical logic and set theory. Most, though not all, of Friedman's examples stay within those areas, an impact Macintyre acknowledges but finds peripheral to mainstream mathematics. Friedman himself acknowledges that his "development of the incompleteness phenomena has a long way to go before it realizes its potential to dramatically penetrate core mathematics", but he attributes this to the lack of time and resources devoted to extending and deepening Gödel's work. That said, however, the deeper dispute concerns two mathematically informed visions of mathematics: Macintyre sees Gödel's work as relatively unimportant for the resolution of important mathematical problems, while Friedman believes that incompleteness phenomena are everywhere and infect every interesting substantial mathematical theorem. Resolution of this deeper dispute may require that far more work be done both mathematically (to ascertain, for example, the extent to which solutions of core problems indispensably require expressive and proof resources that go beyond Peano arithmetic) and philosophically (to characterize more precisely, for example, mathematical importance and relevance). Otherwise, it may be premature to make overly confident pronouncements about the future of mathematics or the extent to which Gödel's work should influence developments.

Continuing Macintyre's resistance to the cult of impotence, Kreisel questions the context in which Gödel's theorems are epistemologically interpreted, a context which started with "the airy-fairy project of logical foundations" by Frege, Russell, and Wittgenstein, a project that "did not arise within professional mathematical experience, of which these three authors had precious little". According to Kreisel, Hilbert (the working mathematician) originally proposed the ideal of consistency to attract mathematicians to the potential of proof theory for dealing with ordinary mathematical worries. The aging Hilbert, however, transformed ordinary concerns into the dramatic foundationalist challenge of securing mathematics by means of finitary consistency proofs. Most philosophers take it that Gödel's second incompleteness theorem definitively dashed the hopes of Hilbert's Program, by showing that any sufficiently rich consistent formal system cannot prove the formalization of the claim that the system is consistent. Gödel himself, Kreisel argues, initially paid little attention to Hilbert's Program and only later (around 1938) came to see some great epistemological value in it (and its unrealizability as a result of his theorem). Kreisel thinks we should follow Gödel's and Hilbert's initial course. In contrast to foundationalists, working mathematicians deal with standard threats arising from their experience and practice by less dramatic but no less rigorous methods. They search for principles and conjectures that will supply cross-checks and tests (to ameliorate inconsistency worries) and new information (to determine completions and the constructive limits of proofs).

Juliette Kennedy's and Solomon Feferman's essays provide reasons to doubt Kreisel's account of foundations. Kennedy explores Gödel's early views of the relationship between different notions of consistency, categoricity, completeness, and unsolvability and the distinction between first- and second-order logic in paragraphs of his 1929 thesis proving the completeness of first-order logic that were later dropped in the 1930 published version. She argues that Gödel had already anticipated his first incompleteness theorem in 1929, and, though her thoughtful discussion is inconclusive about Gödel's relation to Hilbert's program, her analysis of Gödel's remarks about the thesis that consistency implies existence and of the role played by Brouwer and Carnap in his thought suggests, contrary to Kreisel, that Gödel was pre-occupied with philosophical and foundational questions from the get-go.

Feferman's paper, a careful, textually grounded tracing of the development of Gödel's views about the limits of Hilbert's finitism from 1931 through 1972, convincingly demonstrates this point. In 1931 Gödel publicly conceded that his second incompleteness theorem did not contradict Hilbert's program (since there could be finitary proofs not expressible in the formalism of Principia), yet he privately questioned the addition of Hilbert's ω-rule as finitarily acceptable. By 1933 he was arguing that the problem of giving foundations for mathematics reduced to that of justifying the axioms of set theory, principles that presupposed (because of a non-constructive notion of existence, impredicative concepts, and AC) a Platonism that "cannot satisfy any critical mind" or "produce the conviction that they are consistent"; only a constructive proof of consistency would suffice to secure them. In 1933 Gödel laid out conditions on the lowest level of constructive mathematics in a system A, known by his second theorem to be inadequate to prove the consistency of classical number theory, never mind set theory. From then until 1972 he frequently revisited the question whether there is a constructively acceptable strengthening of A or a precise characterization of finitary proof that would succeed in securing foundations (even for PA) and questioned or rejected all candidates: Heyting's intuitionistic system (because of unbounded quantification over the totality of intuitionistic proofs); various versions of proofs of Con(PA) by transfinite induction up to ε0(Gentzen's because of worries about transfinite induction; Kalmár-Ackermann-Bernays' because of worries about doubly nested recursion; Kreisel's ε0-bounded ordinal logic because of lack of convincing elaboration).

Feferman closes with a discussion of the stability over time of Gödel's views about the nature of finitism and of the coherence of his constructivist/finitist concerns with his long-held Platonism. He answers the former question negatively, contrary to Tait, and he rejects various answers to the latter question offered by Kreisel and others in favor of a psychological explanation: Gödel, though a Platonist, "simply found it galling all through his life that he never received the recognition from Hilbert that he deserved" and thus was driven to go beyond Hilbert's program.

Two further essays devoted to these areas in Part III -- by Ulrich Kohlenbach and W. Hugh Woodin -- simply get on with showing how Gödel's work helped to shape later mathematical developments. Without explicitly drawing conclusions about its proper interpretation, they unmistakably display Gödel's influence. Kohlenbach focuses on developments in proof mining shaped by Gödel's 1930s functional or Dialectica interpretations (of Peano arithmetic in Heyting arithmetic, intuitionistic propositional logic in S4modal propositional logic, and Heyting arithmetic in T, a quantifier-free calculus of Hilbert's primitive recursive functions of finite type). Common to these proof interpretations is the treatment of constructive reasoning from a classical standpoint: classical proofs can be transformed into constructive proofs in ways that permit relative consistency and conservation results to be obtained. Though originally designed for foundational purposes, Kohlenbach (himself a main contributor to later developments) explains how these techniques were later applied to concrete mathematical proofs by Kreisel's unwinding proofs program in the 1950s and systematically used since the 1990s in numerical analysis, functional analysis, metric fixed-point theory, and geodesic geometry.

Woodin focuses on developments in set theory shaped by Gödel's method of inner models. The standard axioms for set theory, ZFC, leave undecided many conjectures expressible in the language, most famously CH as a result of Gödel's and Cohen's independence results. Moreover, some extensions of ZFC settle some of these statements one way, while others settle them another way. The skeptical response to this predicament is to deny that statements-undecided-relative-to-ZFC have a truth value: we must settle for set-theoretic fictionalism or for relativism (p is true in system ZFC + X if ZFC + X proves p, and this is compatible with p's falsity in another system and with p's undecidability in ZFC). The anti-skeptical response, initiated by Gödel himself, claims that the failure of ZFC to decide independent propositions merely points to the need for extra axioms which, when adjoined to ZFC, will settle the answers.

Woodin is a leading figure in a group of set theorists pursuing this latter response via the inner model program. Gödel's method of inner models and axiom of constructibility, V = L, provide the guiding idea behind these efforts. Although L captures some structural features of V, most set theorists reject V = L because it seems to be too restrictive and is inconsistent with large cardinal axioms. Though these large cardinal axioms are independent of ZFC, proponents of the inner model program have faith in their potential for reflecting the structure of V when adjoined with ZFC as generalizations of L: beginning with L as stronger cardinal axioms are added, new inner models are constructed that provide an analysis of all weaker large cardinal axioms.

There has been remarkable progress -- large cardinals yield new theorems of number theory, appear to be linearly ordered, and enable the comparison of consistency strength and degree of unsolvability of theories and problems with conceptually disparate origins -- leading inner model theorists to believe they have good extrinsic reasons for holding that the hierarchy of large cardinal axioms captures intrinsic features of our conception of the set-theoretic universe, progressively revealing increasingly better approximations ofV. There also have been problems -- the inner model program because of its inductive methods seems unable to draw the boundary between possible and impossible large cardinals and current methods cannot work for large cardinals beyond supercompact cardinals. Woodin's essay describes the progress and problems of developing and extending the inner model response, focusing especially on the state of the art going beyond inner models over the past twenty years. It ends with the conjecture that if there is a supercompact cardinal there is an ultimate version LΩ of such that V = LΩ is compatible with all large cardinal axioms consistent with AC and whose construction promises to settle every known undecided question.

Most of these eight essays are interesting and thought-provoking; some more so than others. Kreisel's contribution is an exception, since it is less an essay than a hodge-podge of reminders, remarks, disclaimers, anecdotes, endnotes, and idiosyncratic acronyms, whose overall effect is likely to put off readers and make them wish editorial responsibility had been better exercised. The essays by Friedman, Kohlenbach, Macintyre, and Woodin are technically demanding and presuppose advanced knowledge of mathematical logic, proof theory, set theory, or (for Macintyre) mathematics; most readers will find them tough reading -- this reviewer did. Feferman's essay is excellent, and philosophers interested in the history of twentieth-century logic and mathematics should read it.

2. Computation and Computer Science

Christos Papadimitriou, Avi Wigderson, and B. Jack Copeland contribute essays in these areas. Papadimitriou traces the influence of Gödel's first incompleteness result on the development of theoretical computation. Given that first-order (FO) logic is complete and assuming mathematics is semantically complete, if mathematics were first-order axiomatizable, then a machine could, for any given mathematical sentence, effectively find a proof of it or its negation (by a brute search through all possible proofs in order of increasing length). Gödel's first incompleteness result dashed this route to decidability but left open various decidability questions such as whether a machine could decide FO-validity (the Entscheidungsproblem). The impossibility proofs providing negative answers required mathematically precise definitions of "machine" and correlative notions provided by Turing, Church, Kleene, and Post. The essay closes with remarks on Gödel's influence on contemporary game theory and contemporary theoretical computation (via approaches to the P versus NP problem).

This latter problem is the subject of Wigderson's essay. Informally, P is the class of problems answers to which are computable quickly (= in polynomial time (as a function of input size)) by some algorithm; NP is the class of problems positive answers to which are verifiable quickly by some algorithm. Clearly P is included in NP (since the verification of a short proof, e.g., will be short). But it is an open question whether NP: most experts conjecture that the answer is "no", but it may be unknowable relative to current mathematics (a possibility the author considers). Moreover, it is a question with important consequences not only for practical and theoretical computation but also, Wigderson argues, for our understanding of mathematical understanding: if P = NP, then every proof or solution that a mathematician can "quickly" verify, she (considered as an automated prover or solver) can "quickly" generate and the creative element in discovery can in principle be automated. Wigderson begins by showing how Gödel, in a short letter to Von Neumann in 1956, anticipated and identified the central technical concepts that were later (in the 1960s and 1970s) independently identified and developed into the modern theory of computational complexity. The remainder of his essay explains the evolution of the theory from then to now providing: technical definitions and examples of the classes PNP, and coNP (the complement of NP); implications and explanations of various conjectures (e.g., ≠ NP, P ≠ coNP); a definition and examples of the important class of NP-complete problems (NP problems to which any NP problem can be reduced in polynomial time) and an explanation of the ordering of complexity it enables; and the development of algorithms, lower bounds, and approaches to P = NP in different settings (proof complexity and circuit complexity).

Copeland aims to sketch a history of the developments that led to the modern electronic all-purpose stored-program computer that is more accurate than the standard potted account that traces it to von Neumann's group's work at Princeton on the ENIAC (1945) and EDVAC (1952) computers. Copeland's account instead traces it to the work of a cadre of British mathematicians (notably Turing and Newman) and engineers (notably Flowers) who first conceived and built Colossus to perform German code-breaking at Bletchley Park and then, after the war, conceived and built the Turing-inspired Automatic Computing Engine (ACE), the fastest computer of its day and the direct precursor of the first PC. Although the pilot model of ACE did not run until 1950, Copeland suggests that, but for poor policy and management decisions and lack of committed resources in Britain, ACE might have been the first electronic stored-program computer to function.

Wigderson's essay stands out in this group. Though not an easy read, it is a worthwhile read, and Wigderson is to be commended on the care he took to make technical details accessible. Apart from its epilogue (discussed below in §4), Copeland's essay contains little of philosophical interest, though it provides a fascinating account of the history, including some of the code-cracking tricks used at Bletchley.

3. Cosmology and Physics

Wolfgang Rindler, John Barrow, and Karl Svozil contribute essays on cosmology or physics. Rindler provides a careful exposition of Gödel's solution to the field equations for general relativity that he contributed to the 1949 Festschrift for Einstein. The exposition includes: the genesis of Gödel's ideas, beginning with a simple Newtonian rotating universe from which Gödel built up his general relativistic analogue; the paradoxical features of Gödel's universe (a rigidly rotating universe in which local inertial fields are independent, contrary to Mach's principle, of the distribution of matter in the universe; closed temporal loops along which a traveler (at subluminal velocity) could arrive back at an earlier local time than when he departed having traveled for a long time by his clock; closed causal loops since the returned traveler could trigger a series of events leading to his not embarking on his trip or even to his non-existence, a possibility Gödel himself took to argue against any objective view of time); and historical precursors.

Barrow's central question is the extent to which it follows from Gödel's first incompleteness theorem that physics will contain undiscoverable truths. Among those who think that physical incompleteness follows from mathematical incompleteness, optimists like Dyson argue that the implication ensures that science will go on forever without coming to a self-satisfied end, while pessimists like Jaki, Lucas, and Penrose argue that it shows that humans cannot hope to know all (maybe even most) of nature's secrets. Barrow sensibly urges caution with respect to the implication, since there are many ways in which mathematical physics may not require the conditions (e.g., finite axiomatizability and expressibility of arithmetic) needed to prove incompleteness and there is no reason to expect that Gödelian incompleteness implies limits on the search for laws of nature that govern simple, fundamental symmetries. Barrow acknowledges, however, that there are many physical problems whose outcomes are not computable (due to symmetry breaking of underlying laws). The essay closes with a discussion of supertasks provoked by Gödel's cosmological model.

Svozil's essay also discusses physical unknowables. The central idea seems to be to show that various problems in epistemology (e.g., the problem of induction) and theoretical physics (e.g., symbolic dynamical systems' variants of the n-body problem) are provably unsolvable by reducing them to problems in computational theory that are known to be recursively unsolvable.

Rindler's essay is by far the best in this group. Though primarily expository, readers interested in the informal features of Gödel's solution or in the technical details of its development will find it rewarding. Svozil's essay is a difficult to digest, overly rich mélange, which speedily proceeds through classical Laplacian determinism, classical chaotic unpredictability, quantum indeterminism, and a range of algorithmic complexity and undecidability results. Some of its conclusions (e.g., that the problem of induction is undecidable; that it's provably impossible to formally prove physical determinism or indeterminism), though perhaps nifty, seem hardly worth the effort since we are already morally certain such problems are neither formally nor informally solvable. Barrow's essay, though better organized and more measured and digestible than Svozil's, similarly covers too much ground too quickly.

4. Mind, God, and Philosophy

Part II contains essays on these topics. Hilary Putnam and Roger Penrose contribute articles on Gödel and the human mind, repeating arguments for which each is well known, though the current essays are intended to improve on them. Let S be a computer programmed to write number-theoretical sentences forever and acceptable in the sense that its list includes a subset of the Peano axioms, is consistent, and is closed under first-order deduction from finitely many sentences on the list. From Gödel and Turing, we know that there is a sentence of number theory such that neither it nor its negation is on the list outputted by S. Following Putnam's set-up, if we think of the sentences listed as proved by the computer, there is a procedure by which, for any acceptable S, a human mathematician can write down a sentence that S can neither prove nor disprove. The central question is whether this shows that the human mind surpasses the capability of any such S and therefore of any Turing machine.

As Penrose (and Copeland) point out, Gödel himself was cautious about drawing consequences about human understanding from his theorems because there could exist unbeknownst to us an empirically discoverable theorem-proving machine which is in fact equivalent to human mathematical understanding but could not be proved to be so or even to yield only correct theorems of finitary number theory.

Penrose rejects this cautious stance and offers a logical argument against the hypothesis that we could be theorem-proving Turing machines, which runs roughly as follows. Suppose I am, unbeknownst to me, a Turing machine, S, such that my output theorems are exactly the truths that are demonstrable by human understanding. Let S* = + {'I amS'}. Given the hypothesis that I am S, I know that S* is sound (if S is), and I know that there is a sentence G(S*) that is true but not provable by S* (by Gödel-Turing). I therefore know something that S* doesn't know, so I am not S*, and so I am not S. Thus I can deduce that I am not S. Not content to leave matters there, Penrose speculates that the mystery of the extra something that minds have but Turing machines lack is not to be found in any special mind-stuff but in physics, at the interface of quantum mechanics and general relativity where the mysteries of quantum measurement, the effectiveness of mathematics, and the non-computational processes of mind and consciousness will all be resolved in one unified theory. While he acknowledges that this position is highly speculative, this does little to temper the zeal with which he presents it.

Putnam follows Gödel in urging caution. He offers a proof (again relying on S having an associated Gödel-sentence) that if I am a Turing machine, S, that is "scientifically" competent such that my output theorems are exactly the truths that are justified by my total evidence at a time, then either I am not S or, if I am, then I am not justified in believing I am. Moreover, Putnam criticizes the fundamental question Penrose, Lucas, and their opponents ask: whether the set of theorems a human can prove could be generated by a Turing machine is not a well-defined question because the set of theorems a human can prove, unlike the set of theorems a specified Turning machine can generate, is not a well-defined set; it is a vague, finite collection of sentences that flesh-and-blood mathematicians can see to be correct by methods they find normatively compelling. I don't think this precludes sensible approaches to AI/non-AI debates -- mathematicians and mathematical physicists are good at taming vague objects and seeming-to-be-correct beliefs about them -- but it reminds us of the precise conditions governing Gödel's and Turing's proofs and serves as a useful dampener on overly zealous interpretations of their consequences.

While still on this topic, points made by Wigderson and Copeland are noteworthy. Wigderson suggests that mathematical and algorithmic understanding go hand in hand and we should quantify mathematical understanding using a computational yardstick: better mathematical understanding comes with better algorithms for obtaining that understanding. Copeland provides (in the abovementioned epilogue) textual evidence that Gödel incorrectly took Turing to argue that mental procedures cannot go beyond mechanical procedures and criticized Turing for disregarding the fact that mind is not static but constantly developing. But Turing distinguished between the mind as a fixed machine and the mind as various machines allowing different sets of proofs, so that choice of a suitable machine allows one to approximate truth by provability and approximate it as well as one pleases, with the choice involving intuition. Copeland takes this to mean that for Turing "mathematicians achieve progressive approximations to truth via a nonmechanical process involving intuition". If so, Gödel and Turing were closer than is usually supposed, and we seem to have added support for Wigderson's proposal that mathematical understanding is not all-or-nothing but comes in degrees.

Denys Turner and Petr Hájek contribute essays on Gödel and philosophical theology. A modern (post-Kantian) anti-rationalist theological consensus claims that any rational demonstration of God's existence would make God objectionably knowable by placing him in a complete, closed system of reason and thereby displace the role of faith. Turner suggests that the incompleteness theorem undermines that closed conception of reason in its best-case scenario (the demonstrable completeness of arithmetic): since arithmetic is demonstrably incomplete, reason can be shown to be an incomplete, open system. Moreover, Turner argues, this open conception of reason is much closer to a pre-modern conception, held by Aquinas and others, according to which, though God's existence is provable, his nature is unknowable: we can prove that there is a God but the very nature of the proof shows that his nature transcends reason. Ironically, if this is correct, Gödel's own ontological proof fails: any proof of God's existence excludes the knowability of his nature, including any definition (as the most perfect being, e.g.) usable as a premise in any sound deductive argument for God's existence. But is any of it correct? Turner acknowledges that the analogy between arithmetical undecidability and divine unknowability is sketchy (the former but not the latter depends on precise, explicit conditions). This essay will appeal to theologians more than philosophers.

Hájek provides a clear overview of Gödel's ontological proof as presented by Dana Scott and contemporary variants and criticisms of it. Along the way he discusses Gaunilian proofs and proofs that a devil-like being exists, argues that the ontological proof (contrary to reports of Gödel's explicit claims to the contrary) was more than a logical exercise for Gödel, presses the need for an analysis of positive properties by philosophers and theologians, and (like Turner) considers the relationship between philosophical and religious notions of God. As a primer on contemporary ontological proofs the essay appears to be successful and will likely appeal to philosophers interested in these proofs.

Piergiorgio Odifreddi writes on Gödel and the mathematics of philosophy. He argues, based on examples taken from Gödel's work, that philosophy sometimes raises questions and suggests answers that mathematics subsequently makes precise. Gödel placed on a precise footing and improved upon: Leibniz's idea of arithmetically coding syntax; Kant's argument that if reason is complete then it is inconsistent; Aristotle's claim that, though unprovable, excluded middle and non-contradiction are not disprovable either (Gödel's interpretation of intuitionistic logic); Kant's distinction between beings (defined by sets of predicates) and God (definable only by a proper class of predicates) -- the imprecise forerunner of the NGB system's distinction between sets and classes. While these are interesting ideas and there is nothing wrong with using current mathematics to shed light upon intellectual history, this discussion is too brief and sketchy to amount to little more than some speculative remarks; as such it is less than satisfactory.

5. Encounters with Gödel

Several essays provide biographical insights and autobiographical tributes. Karl Sigmund presents a brief account of Gödel's years (1924-1939) in Vienna that includes his early career as a graduate student and dozent, his visits to Princeton in the 1930s during the political confusion before and after the Anschluss, his recurrent mental health problems, and his narrow escape from being conscripted into the Wehrmacht. Paul Cohen's essay, his final published work before his death, sketches Gödel's influence on his mathematical development. Beginning with interests in number theory and analysis and the possibility of answering Hilbert's Tenth problem positively, Cohen gradually became aware of Gödel's work and, to his wonderment, its exclusion of that possibility. Though initially reluctant to embrace Gödel's ideas (which he thought too philosophical) and methods (which he thought too syntactical), he came to see how to use those methods to exploit insights of Skolem and to construct by forcing the models needed for ZF + ¬CH. The essay also describes Gödel's gracious reception of Cohen's proof (a brief foreword by Gaisi Takeuti similarly emphasizes Gödel's graciousness and kindness) and concludes (based on his interactions with Gödel and the lack of evidence in the collected works) that a rumour that Gödel had partial results for the independence of AC is incorrect.[1]


[1] Thanks (with usual disclaimers) to Steve Leeds for feedback on an earlier draft.