2012.02.26

James Garvey (ed.)

The Continuum Companion to Philosophy of Mind

James Garvey (ed.), The Continuum Companion to Philosophy of Mind, Continuum, 2011, 386pp., $190.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826431882

Reviewed by Amy Kind, Claremont McKenna College


In this volume, editor James Garvey has assembled eleven contributions on key topics in philosophy of mind (e.g., consciousness, physicalism, mental causation) from leading researchers in the field. These topical contributions are bookended by an opening piece by Ian Ravenscroft that offers a brisk but comprehensive survey of the basic themes motivating contemporary research in philosophy of mind, and a closing piece by Paul Noordhof that reflects on the current state of the field and offers predictions for its future. The book also contains a glossary, a chronology of philosophy of mind from 800 BCE to 1950, and a list of print and electronic research resources in philosophy of mind and related areas.

As always with a volume like this, a reader might quibble about the choice of topics included and omitted. But, as Garvey reasonably notes in his introduction, "Editorial decisions are almost always painful judgements -- one thing ruled in and twelve perfectly respectable and interesting and important things ruled out." So, while I personally would have welcomed a chapter devoted to qualia, and also one devoted specifically to the theory of representationalism (as Noordhof notes in his closing essay, we might reasonably locate this theory at the center of gravity in current discussions about phenomenal consciousness), suffice it to say that all eleven chapters cover topics that are central to discussions in philosophy of mind and all seem clearly fitting for a companion volume of this sort. A reader might also quibble about the amount of repetition across the contributions, of which there is a fair amount. To give just a couple of examples, Barry Smith's essay on "Folk Psychology and Scientific Psychology" and Neil Campbell's essay on "Mental Causation" both deal extensively with Davidson's anomalous monism, a topic that is also discussed in Ravenscroft's opening piece. Likewise, Margaret Boden's essay on "The Philosophies of Cognitive Science" discusses at some length issues relating to cognitive extension and embodiment, topics that are covered in their own right in Michael Wheeler's "Embodied Cognition and the Extended Mind." But given the natural intersections among the different topics in a field, some amount of repetition seems inevitable for a topically organized companion.

The articles are all of high quality, and each has something of interest to offer potential readers. But which readers? Consistent with the general aim of the Continuum Companion series to produce volumes aimed at "postgraduate students, scholars, and libraries" (as a blurb puts it), all of the contributions -- even the opening and closing survey articles -- are pitched at a high level. As a result, most of these papers will likely not be suitable for undergraduate students. One notable exception is Barbara Montero's excellent chapter on physicalism. Though it is easy enough to characterize physicalism with the slogan that "everything is physical," Montero deftly notes that all three words in this slogan need clarification, and the ensuing discussion works through the issues that arise in settling on how these words can be most plausibly understood. Throughout, her arguments are presented in such a way as to be accessible to non-specialists without sacrificing interest to specialists in the field, and I could easily imagine using it in my (advanced) undergraduate philosophy of mind course.

Another possible exception is E.J. Lowe's chapter on personal identity, though his heavy use of logical notation would undoubtedly be problematic for beginning philosophy students. Lowe opens the article with a useful attempt to situate the problem of personal identity in its larger philosophical context, after which he turns to an extended discussion of the neo-Lockean approach. Ultimately, having argued that the worries about circularity that have long plagued this kind of approach cannot be overcome, he concludes with some brief remarks suggesting that personal identity is simply primitive. While the shortcomings of neo-Lockeanism discussed will be familiar to specialists, Lowe's discussion crystallizes the issues in a particularly useful and accessible way.

On the whole, however, the companion's target audience is clearly meant to be those working in professional philosophy (or those in training for such work). But which among those? Is the book meant for specialists working in the field, or is it meant to be primarily of use to professional philosophers working in other areas who need an overview of the field? I found myself repeatedly puzzling over this question as I worked my way through the various contributions. My best guess is that the intention was to split the difference between the two. In his discussion of "How to Use This Book," Garvey notes that the authors of the eleven topical chapters not only provide overviews of large sub-topics in the philosophy of mind but also "take a stand and argue for their own positions." In his view, "It's this combination which makes the essays of interest to researchers at different levels." (xv)

Ultimately, while I agree that the book does indeed offer much to a wide range of researchers, I think that's largely because some of the contributions will primarily be of interest to beginners/non-specialists while others will primarily be of interest to specialists working in philosophy of mind. Very few of the articles seem to be genuinely able to cross the divide between these two different target audiences. Setting aside the chapters by Montero and Lowe, the one that to my mind most successfully straddles this divide is Sarah Sawyer's "Internalism and Externalism in Mind." In this comprehensive overview, Sawyer not only provides a roadmap of the relevant terrain in a way that should be useful to non-specialists, but she also manages to make perspicuous the key issues in a way that proves enlightening for specialists. My only hesitation in recommending the piece to non-specialists is Sawyer's reliance on some central machinery in philosophy of language; much of this is introduced without explanation. But that aside, the piece strikes me as the kind of argumentative overview that is well suited for a Companion volume of this sort.

The argumentative overview provided by Fred Adams and Steve Beighley in their discussion of "The Mark of the Mental" will likely also be of interest to both specialist and non-specialist readers. Their article opens with an excellent introduction to the issue at hand, and they motivate its importance in a way that should prove illuminating to non-specialists. They then survey, and reject, the three most prominent traditional theories about the mark of the mental (i.e., incorrigibility, intentionality, and consciousness) before arguing for their own view of the mark of the mental, what they call a single system view -- "there is a single set of properties that all minds must have, but not every state that is part of the system must possess these properties themselves." (56) Their discussion and defense of this view will undoubtedly prove interesting to specialists. I would, however, caution non-specialists reading this article that most philosophers working in this area at present probably see more promise in the traditional views (particularly the intentionality view) than do the authors of this piece.

The other contributions to the volume -- which, as I said above, are nonetheless uniformly excellent -- strike me as considerably less likely to serve both specialist and non-specialist audiences. For example, Boden's "The Philosophies of Cognitive Science" provides a thematically arranged survey of work in cognitive science dating back to the 1940s that will undoubtedly serve as a useful orientation for philosophers working in other fields but will be familiar territory for most philosophers who work in philosophy of mind. Likewise, Daniel Hutto's chapter on consciousness, Georges Rey's chapter on representation, and Smith's chapter on "Folk Psychology and Scientific Psychology" seem best understood as aiming principally to provide the non-specialist with an overview of work on these topics (and all three succeed). Although none of these three articles adopts an entirely neutral tone, the authors are not concerned with laying out an argument or staking out any new ground that will be of particular interest to specialists.

In this respect, these articles stand in sharp contrast with, for example, those by Campbell and T. J. Mawson. In his chapter on substance dualism, Mawson is concerned to show that, at least from within a metaphysical framework that divides things up into substances and properties, there's a strong case to be made for substance dualism. In his view, once we assume that there is physical stuff, the only good reason to reject substance dualism stems from considerations of ontological economy. However, as he argues, this reason must be weighed against the fact that only substance dualism can adequately account for several deeply held assumptions about our nature (assumptions having to do with personal identity, freedom of the will, and consciousness). While I found his argument interesting, given the widespread (though not universal) rejection of substance dualism among contemporary philosophers of mind, non-specialists hoping to become acquainted with the state of current research in this area will not be best served by this discussion.

Likewise, Campbell's article on mental causation seems best addressed to specialists who are already familiar with the literature in the area, and particularly with the literature on what's generally known as the causal exclusion argument. This argument, owing primarily to the work of Jaegwon Kim, aims to show that we cannot adequately account for the causal efficacy of mental properties if such properties are irreducible to physical properties. Although Campbell begins with an overview of this argument (and related considerations, stemming largely from the work of Donald Davidson, about the anomalism of the mental), his primary aim is to show that the argument relies on what he sees as questionable metaphysical assumptions. In short, he believes Kim's argument against nonreductive physicalism requires a theory of event individuation that itself presupposes the falsity of nonreductive physicalism. While specialists will likely find much of interest in this sophisticated discussion, it is unlikely to meet the needs of someone primarily seeking an overview of this topic.

To a large extent, the worries that I've expressed about the book's target audience may be mooted by its outrageously high list price. At a cost of $190, I don't expect that many philosophers -- either specialists or non-specialists -- will be rushing out to purchase it for their own use. Rather, they will undoubtedly come to this book (that is, to the library's copy of this book) to research a particular topic, rather than reading straight through all the contributions as I did. But this just raises a larger question. Publishers these days seem increasingly to be promoting various series -- current debates, new waves, hot topics -- that aim to straddle the divide between specialists and non-specialists. Given that this kind of writing is an incredibly hard task for authors to pull off successfully, the resulting volumes -- instead of being useful for everyone -- run the risk of being useful for no one. Fortunately, Garvey has put together a collection that avoids that outcome. But it's hard to believe that such series are the best direction for philosophy publishing to go in, and even harder to believe that they best serve the aim of philosophical research.