2012.02.37

Theodor Adorno and Max Horkheimer

Towards a New Manifesto

Theodor Adorno and Max Horkheimer, Towards a New Manifesto, Rodney Livingstone (tr.), Verso, 2011, 113pp., $14.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781844678198.

Reviewed by Martin Jay, University of California, Berkeley


Gretel Adorno was a remarkable woman about whom far too little is known.[1] Although the recent publication of her correspondence with Walter Benjamin has confirmed the impression that she was a formidable intellect in her own right, she remains largely a mystery.[2] What we do know for certain is that she was deeply devoted to her husband Theodor, whom she married in September, l937. Abandoning a career as a chemist to support his work unreservedly, she seems to have been resigned to his extra-marital affairs, and was so despondent after his death in August, l969 that she made a botched suicide attempt. Among the many services she rendered was the dutiful taking of minutes from the intellectual discussions he thought worth recording. Beginning in March of l938, shortly after his emigration to America and full integration into the life of the Institut für Sozialforschung (then resettled in New York), she wrote down a number of conversations he had with the director of the Institute, Max Horkheimer.[3] She continued to play this role well after they all returned to Frankfurt in the early l950s to reestablish the Institute.

One such conversation took place over several days in March and April, l956, when Horkheimer and Adorno sat down to discuss a variety of pressing issues, political, sociological, and philosophical, and Gretel Adorno was there to record the results for posterity, or at least as an aide memoire for later more formal considerations of the same issues. Never intended for publication, the protocols nonetheless appeared in l989 alongside many other drafts and notes as an appendix to the thirteenth volume of Horkheimer's collected works. They were blandly entitled "Diskussion über Theorie und Praxis." Last year, they were translated into English by the venerable Rodney Livingstone for the New Left Review, and shortly thereafter repackaged as a little book with the much more provocative title Towards a New Manifesto.[4]

It is worth remembering Gretel Adorno's role in their preparation, and not only because it reminds us of the asymmetrical gender relations that prevailed at the Institute (which never had a major female presence in its ranks). Without a tape recorder, she was responsible for faithfully putting down a highly abstract conversation developing at breakneck speed -- the editorial foreword rightly calls it "a careening flux of arguments, aphorisms, and asides, in which the trenchant alternates with the reckless, the playful with the ingenuous" -- and it has to be accounted a minor miracle that anything coherent survived at all. If we add the tendentious title introduced by the publishers, which turn a relatively minor moment in the dialogue into its telos, it is clear that we have a text that cannot be understood as the polished reflections of authors who wanted these formulations to represent their considered opinions for public consumption. This is, in other words, a far cry from the finely wrought aphorisms of Horkheimer's Dämmerung or Adorno's Minima Moralia.

Instead, what we have are undigested raw materials, both preliminary formulations and abandoned trial balloons for the more carefully polished texts that ultimately saw the light of day. Some of the ideas and attitudes will be familiar to students of Critical Theory, others less so. Some will illuminate the assumptions that underlay their work, others may add to the confusion. Some will be admired for their lapidary concision and uncensored daring, others will seem in retrospect wrong-headed, over-wrought and histrionic. While a number follow a train of thought, at least for a while, others are blatant non sequiturs. In short, these memoranda cannot legitimately be taken as having the weight of published texts. And yet, however gingerly we have to treat them as hasty and undercooked pronunciamentos, they do provide a fascinating snapshot of the concerns of the major Frankfurt School theoreticians at a critical moment in their development. For this, Gretel Adorno's stenographic skills have to be acknowledged with gratitude.

Among the most interesting topics pursued by Horkheimer and Adorno is that of the ambivalent implications of argumentation for philosophy, an issue that is performatively acted out in the dialogue itself. Both Horkheimer and Adorno recognize that there is something sinister in the undiluted hostility to argument in certain twentieth-century philosophers. "Thinking that renounces argument -- Heidegger -- switches into pure irrationalism," Adorno cautions; "the mistrust of argument is at bottom what has inspired the Husserls and the Heideggers. The diabolical aspect of it is that the abolition of argument means that their writing ends up in tautology and nonsense." (72) There is somehow a vital link, they suggest, between the imperative to argue and the imperative to turn theory into practice.

And yet, they also acknowledge that there is something problematic in relying on discursive argument alone. We are not entirely in this conversation on the territory of Habermas' communicative rationality or Wilfred Sellars' "space of reasons." "There is really something bad about advocacy," Adorno asserts, "arguing means applying the rules of thinking to the matters under discussion. You really mean to say that if you find yourself in the situation of having to explain why something is bad, you are already lost." Horkheimer adds with a touch of scorn, "The USA is the country of argument," which Adorno then trumps by pronouncing -- without arguing for it -- that "argument is consistently bourgeois." (73)

What is the alternative to argumentation? They struggle to come up with a way of suggesting it without regressing back into the irrationalism they distrust in phenomenology. Real intelligence, Adorno avers, includes a moment of intuition into the concrete object that supplements the formal capacity to reason. If your thought does something justice, Adorno suggests, then "you cannot really assert the opposite. The mark of authenticity of a thought is that it negates the immediate presence of one's own interests. True thought is thought that has no wish to insist on being in the right." But then Horkheimer responds by defending the moment of subjective self-assertion: "to plead on behalf of a specific cause is not necessarily a bad thing. You feel deeply that your own interests are at stake." (71-72)

All of this recalls the distinction advanced by the classical Greeks between noetic and dianoetic thought, the former a kind of intuitive, esoteric wisdom into the nature of things, tacitly possessed only by an elite, the latter a discursive process of coming to a conclusion by logic, argumentation and demonstration open to general critique by anyone. In his contribution to the conference in Frankfurt marking what would have been Adorno's eightieth birthday, Herbert Schnädelbach noted the domination of noetic thought in Husserl and Heidegger, but added that it was also apparent in Adorno as well. He was, Schnädelbach wrote, a "noetic of the non-identical. He always stressed, above all in his remarks on formal logic, that the goal of dianoetic operations was noetic."[5] But Adorno did not claim that the latter could be reached directly through the senses or via some sort of eidetic intuition in the manner of Husserl. Instead, an unsublated dialectic between noetic and dianoetic thought was necessary.

The former is manifest in the conversation in a number of bold assertions that admit of no nuance, instances, if you are convinced by them, of Adorno's celebrated assertion inMinima Moralia, that in psychoanalysis "only the exaggerations are true." To take one example, in contemporary sociological theory, Horkheimer avers, "what we see today is a doubling of the world," (2) in which all utopian possibility of radical difference is banished. To take another, Adorno complains that work is fetishized today as a way to give meaning to our lives, but "concentration camps are a key to all these things. In the society we live in all work is like the work in the camps." (13) Or a third: "animals could teach us what happiness is" (Adorno), and "to achieve the condition of an animal at the level of reflection -- that is freedom. Freedom means not having to work" (Horkheimer, 16).

All of these may be suggestive and thought-provoking claims, but there is scarcely any evidence or sustained argumentation to back them up. This deficiency is, to be sure, assured by the shorthand form of a recorded brainstorming session, but it also reflects the brainstormers' impatience with a cautious dianoetic style. What, however, helps overcome the latent authoritarianism in noetic intuitions is the dialogic nature of the conversation between the two friends, which is by no means without its tensions. Thus, for example, we hear Adorno assert in the face of the world becoming a closed totality, "the idea of 'otherness' is one whose time has come. We might almost say that the dialectic, which always contains an element of freedom, has come to a full stop today because nothing remains outside it." (84) To which Horkheimer responds: "my objection is that everything we adduce to define 'the other' has something ideological about it." (86) When Adorno asserts the continuing importance of utopian fantasizing, Horkheimer responds, "what use is a theory that does not tell us how to behave towards the Russians or the United States? Reality should be measured against criteria whose capacity for fulfillment can be demonstrated in a number of already existing, concrete developments in historical reality." (88) Adorno claims that "the concept of self-determination has nothing to do with freedom" (25) because "freedom truly consists only in the realization of humanity as such," (50) but Horkheimer later reminds him that "freedom is being allowed to do as you wish." (80)

If there is one overwhelming impression left behind by the conversation, it is that of candid political confusion. Not only do the two friends tie themselves into knots trying to arrive at a plausible relation between theory and practice, terms which Adorno wants to salvage while Horkheimer calls them "obsolete," but they also agonize over their debts to the Marxist tradition out of which Critical Theory emerged. Although distancing themselves from the Soviet Union, which is "half way to fascism," and recalling with distaste partisan disputes within the Institute over its fate in the l930s, they nonetheless claim that Russian bureaucrats "stand for a greater right as opposed to Western culture. It is the fault of the West that the Russian Revolution went the way it did (Horkheimer, 36)." Despite their suspicions about Marx's identification of emancipation and happiness with unalienated labor, they try to strike a delicate balance in relying on Marx's legacy: "Discussion should at all costs avoid a debased form of Marxism," Adorno warns; "on the other hand, we must not abandon Marxist terminology." (37) Concurring, Horkheimer adds "we have nothing else. But I am not sure how far we must retain it. Is the political question still relevant at a time when you cannot act politically?" (38) They both distinguish themselves from Marx on the issue of individual subjectivity, which they refuse to subordinate to absolute equality: Marx, Adorno speculates, "probably assumed naively that human beings are essentially identical and they remain so. And that once the evil second nature was removed, all would be well. He did not concern himself with subjectivity." (111) Earlier in the conversation, however, Horkheimer had argued that "when I speak, I postulate my subject as the universal. By speaking, I eliminate the particularity of the subject." (7)

In general, Adorno seems less beaten down -- "our disagreement is about whether history can succeed or not" -- to which Horkheimer gloomily answers "we can expect nothing more from mankind than a more or less-worn out version of the American system. The difference between us is that Teddie still retains a certain penchant for theology." (20-21) And later he adds, "today we have to declare ourselves defeatists . . . there is nothing we can do." (90) Against the backdrop of this pessimism, the brief paroxysm of enthusiasm for "an appeal for the re-establishment of a socialist party" (Horkheimer) "with a strictly Leninist manifesto" (Adorno, 94) quickly passes. There is, they admit, now no concrete social addressee comparable to those mid-nineteenth-century workers of the world Marx had urged to unite: "we do not live in a revolutionary situation, and actually things are worse than ever . . . Any appeal to form a left-wing socialist party is not on the agenda" (Adorno, 107). They mock Herbert Marcuse for believing that "a Bonaparte will emerge in Russia who will conquer the whole of Europe, and in 500 years everything will be just fine." (59) With the apocalyptic pathos that characterized Critical Theory in its darkest moods, Horkheimer can only suggest that "we could perhaps indicate that people are not yet fully aware that they are heading for a situation compared to which Nazism was a relatively modest affair." (57)

For the most part, Horkheimer and Adorno's political speculations hover at this very abstract level, descending only occasionally to the specific politics of their day. Horkheimer himself complains that "everything we are discussing is too abstract for my liking," but then himself adds to the vagueness by asking "what view, for example, are we to take of America?" to which Adorno lamely replies, "we have to add that we believe that things can come right in the end." (61) Only occasionally do they hazard a concrete opinion. Horkheimer seems to have been especially dismayed by a Time magazine report that the Chinese Communists had murdered twenty million people, and Adorno predicts Eisenhower would never pick Nixon as his vice-presidential running mate for fear of unleashing preventive war. Admitting that "we know nothing of Asia," Adorno nonetheless worries that "under the banner of Marxism, the East might overtake Western civilization. . . . Marxism is being adopted in Asia in much the same way as Christianity was taken up in Mexico at one time. Europe too will probably be swallowed up at some point in the future." (35) There is no evidence in the record of any foresight concerning the momentous events that later occurred in l956: the public disclosure of Khrushchev's Twentieth Party Congress secret denunciation of Stalin, the Hungarian Revolution, or the fiasco of the British-French attack on Suez and the acceleration of de-colonialization. Politics remains, in fact, only a vague abstraction in their conversations. "We are not proposing any particular course of action," Adorno admits. "What we want is for people who read what we write to feel the scales falling from their eyes." (55)

Collective political action is impossible at the present time, they conclude, and so are personal relations that try to avoid the gravitational pull of the bourgeois order. Even women's desire to "acquire the right to dispose of their own bodies" is tied up with the idea that "human beings become their own property." (28) The belief that love is a viable refuge or meaningful alternative is therefore sadly mistaken: "Love probably contains the false negation of bourgeois society," Horkheimer avers. And Adorno responds, "it negates it in an impotent fashion, perpetuating it through its negation." (28) What, we might wonder in conclusion, was Gretel Adorno thinking as she recorded these sour thoughts?


[1] See Staci von Boeckmann, "Trachodon und Teddie: ┼░ber Gretel Adorno, " in Adorno Portraits, ed. Stefan Müller-Doohm (Frankfurt, 2007). See also her dissertation "The Life and Work of Gretel Karplus/Adorno" (University of Oklahoma, 2004).

[2] Gretel Adorno and Walter Benjamin, Correspondence, 1930-1940. For a theatrical imagined version of her relationship with Adorno and Benjamin, see Foreplay: Hannah Arendt, the Two Adornos, and Walter Benjamin, by Carl Djerassi (Madison, Wisconsin, 2011).

[3] The first of these focused on the methodological issues raised by Adorno's participation in the Radio Research Project led by Paul Lazarsfeld. See Max Horkheimer,Gesammelte Schriften, vol. 12, Nachgelassene Schriften 1931-1949, ed. Gunzelin Schmid Noerr (Frankfurt, l985), p. 431-435.

[4] Let me acknowledge with gratitude the fact that Livingstone has spent forty years making many works by Lukács, Adorno, Benjamin and others available in English. In 2009, he won the Ungar German Translation Prize of the American Translators' Association for his rendering of Detlev Claussen's biography of Adorno, Theodor W. Adorno: One Last Genius.

[5] Herbert Schnädelbach, "Dialektik als Vernunftkritik Zur Konstruktion des Rationalen bei Adorno," in Adorno-Konferenz 1983, eds. Ludwig von Friedeburg and Jürgen Habermas (Frankfurt, 1983), p. 75.