2012.03.12

Stephen Stich

Collected Papers, Volume 1: Mind and Language 1972-2010

Stephen Stich, Collected Papers, Volume 1: Mind and Language 1972-2010, Oxford University Press, 361pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199734108.

Reviewed by José Luis Bermúdez, Texas A&M University


Stephen Stich has been a central figure in the philosophy of mind and philosophy of psychology since the 1970s. His influential publications include several books (most prominently, From Folk Psychology to Cognitive Science: The Case Against Belief (1983) and The Fragmentation of Reason: Preface to a Pragmatic Theory of Cognitive Evaluation (1990)) and a number of widely read, highly cited, and frequently reprinted articles. Many of those articles, together with a 10-page Introduction, are reprinted in this collection, the first of an anticipated two volumes of collected papers. Strikingly, of the 17 papers collected here, 12 are jointly authored, with the last single-authored paper coming in 1991. This reflects the strength of Stich's many ongoing collaborations with students and others. It also reflects a cultural move in this branch of the discipline away from a more humanities-based model of solitary scholarship -- a move that Stich himself has done much to promote.

Prominent in almost all of the essays is an ongoing engagement with research in the cognitive sciences. The character of this engagement changes as the essays progress (they are reprinted in chronological order). In early papers, such as 'Grammar, Psychology, and Indeterminacy', 'The Idea of Innateness', and 'Beliefs and Subdoxastic States', the lines between philosophy and cognitive science seem firmly drawn, with Stich engaged in an activity not too far from conceptual analysis (e.g., exploring the contrasts between the concept of belief and the quasi-psychological concepts appealed to in various areas of the cognitive sciences). In 'Connectionism, Eliminativism, and the Future of Folk Psychology' (co-authored in 1990 with Bill Ramsey and Joseph Garon) the lines become more blurred. The paper famously argues that the viability of connectionist modeling supports eliminativism about folk psychology. In their 1992 paper 'Folk Psychology: Simulation or Theory?', Stich and Shaun Nichols actively support the so-called theory-theory position in debates about the nature of mindreading. (This is the only paper representing Stich and Nichols's lengthy collaboration in this area.)

Many of the subsequent papers take a more nuanced view of the interface between philosophy and the cognitive sciences. For example, 'Connectionism and Three Levels of Nativism', co-authored with Bill Ramsey, "deconstructs" the apparent tension between nativism and the power of connectionist learning algorithms. A similar project is undertaken in 'Intentionality and Naturalism' (co-auhored with Stephen Laurence), where the authors seek, but fail to find, a robust sense of 'naturalism' on which it is plausible both that intentionality cannot be naturalized and that such a failure would be a prima facie reason for irrealism about intentionality. Another theme is the tacit presuppositions about reference that underlie discussions of the philosophical relevance of empirical discoveries (including, of course, his own earlier discussion of connectionism and eliminativism). This is developed most explicitly in 'The Flight to Reference, or How Not to make Progress in the Philosophy of Science', coauthored with Mike Bishop, but also runs through some of the discussions of folk psychology.

A further characteristic of Stich's evolution is his willingness to launch out into areas that bear a fairly tenuous connection with philosophy as traditionally construed. Evolutionary psychology is the topic of two papers. 'Darwin in the Madhouse: Evolutionary Psychology and the Classification of Mental Disorders', jointly written with Dominic Murphy, criticizes the dominant DSM paradigm for classifying mental disorders and draws on evolutionary psychology for an alternative approach to the taxonomy, diagnosis, and explanation of mental disorders. Preoccupations with different ways of thinking about reference resurface in 'The Odd Couple: The Compatibility of Social Construction and Evolutionary Psychology'. Here Stich and Ron Mallon argue that the apparent tension between the traditional anthropological emphasis on cross-cultural differences in emotions, on the one hand, and evolutionary psychology's postulation of universal emotions subserved by adaptive modules, on the other, dissolves when we appreciate that the two different approaches each adopt a different account of the meaning and reference of emotion-words.

The ultimate expression (or, as some would doubtless say, the reductio ad absurdum) of Stich's sustained exploration of the interface between philosophy and the cognitive sciences is the experimental philosophy movement, which he was instrumental in launching. All areas of philosophy, not just traditional conceptual analysis, have relied upon intuitions and gut reactions to thought experiments, problem cases, and the like. Experimental philosophers propose replacing autobiographical (and, no doubt, culturally bound) appeals to intuition with more systematic, experimental studies across and within cultures. 'Semantics, Cross-cultural Style', written with Edouard Machery, Mallon, and Nichols, explores the linguistic intuitions appealed to in Kripke's well-known attack on descriptivist theories of reference, identifying significant cross-cultural divergence in responses to Kripke's thought experiment about the discoverer of the incompleteness theorems turning out to be the mythical Schmidt, rather than Kurt Gödel. The same team draws the eponymous, more general lesson in 'Against Arguments from Reference'. Of course, one might apply the lesson even more generally. As experimental evidence mounts that intuitions are highly variable and context-bound, perhaps they will slowly disappear from philosophical argument. I personally would be very happy with that. But I imagine that the growing industry of experimental philosophers would not appreciate being part of the ladder as it is kicked away!

In any event, moving from methodological emphasis to thematic focus, the dominant theme in this collection is Stich's continued and ongoing engagement with the nature and significance of commonsense thinking about the mind, which is the explicit topic of 10 of the 17 papers and important to most of the others. Here too Stich's thinking evolves significantly. In some of his earlier (and best known) papers he is highly skeptical about folk psychology (his preferred term). This skepticism is primarily supported by two lines of argument.

The first line of argument, already mentioned earlier, is the tension between connectionist modeling and certain basic assumptions that he claims to be built into folk psychology -- the assumptions, in particular, that beliefs, desires, and other propositional attitudes are (1) functionally discrete, (2) causally efficacious, and (3) semantically evaluable. This argument, of course, is a conditional -- if some form of connectionism turns out to be the correct approach to modeling the mind, then we would have good reasons for thinking that nothing satisfies (1) through (3), and hence for being eliminativists about the mental.

The second line of argument appears initially in the frequently reprinted 'Autonomous Psychology and the Belief-Desire Thesis', first published in 1978. Stich argues that there is a drastic tension between the belief-desire thesis (that a viable scientific psychology will make ineliminable reference to beliefs, desires, and other propositional attitudes) and the principle of psychological autonomy (that successful psychological theories can advert only to internal, physical properties of the subject). The tension is generated because it appears that many types of belief-desire explanations are not autonomous in the required sense. Stich focused in particular on explanations appealing to self-referential beliefs, beliefs about spatio-temporal location, beliefs about other minds, and beliefs involving natural kind predicates. Well-known theories of indexicality and semantic externalism are of course in the background here.

In 'Narrow Content Meets Fat Syntax' (1991) Stich responds to a natural objection to his second eliminativist argument -- the strategy of trying to carve out a notion of narrow content that is both explanatorily respectable and respects the principle of psychological autonomy. Stich's response in essence is that narrow content cannot be explanatorily respectable within a computational model of the mind. On the computational picture the mind is a syntactic engine and the relevant notion of syntax is what he calls fat syntax -- fat syntactic properties are functional properties whose causal role includes interaction with stimuli and behavior. But, he argues, narrow content does not map onto fat syntax (or, for that matter, thin syntax, where functional role is a function solely of interactions between syntactic states). Fat syntax is finer-grained than narrow content, so that two states with different syntactic profiles can have the same narrow content. Moreover, he argues, narrow content is context-sensitive and ill-behaved in ways that syntactic states are not.

As he relates in the Introduction, Stich backed away from his early eliminativism. He explicitly identifies semantic considerations as prompting his retreat, particularly Bill Lycan's observation that the eliminativist argument tacitly depends on some version of descriptivism about reference (and loses force on the causal-historical theory of reference). The interplay between eliminativist arguments and theories of reference is explored in several of the essays in the collection, as noted above. Another significant factor was a more nuanced understanding of folk psychology. According to the simulation theory, for example, folk psychology is a skill rather than a body of knowledge, and so not really truth-apt at all. Stich is not a full-blooded simulationist, and he ends up with a hybrid position combining elements of simulationism and elements of the theory-theory. But his engagement with the mindreading literature was surely an important element in moving him away from the view of folk psychology that underpinned his 1978 argument.

There is no puzzle then about why Stich lost confidence in the first of the two eliminativist arguments. But there is no indication in this collection (or anywhere else that I know) of why he is no longer convinced by the second line of argument. If the mind really is a syntactic engine and if syntactic properties (whether fat or skinny) do not map onto content properties (whether narrow or broad), then it is most unclear what role there can be for commonsense psychological concepts in cognitive science. This issue here is far more pressing than familiar debates about the causal efficacy of content. Those debates assume, as does almost every version of the computational picture of mind, that syntactic objects have semantic properties -- the issue, so to speak, is whether those semantic properties can do any causal work. But if Stich's argument is sound, syntactic properties cannot have semantic properties. When the problem is put in these terms, it is plainly independent of the principle of psychological autonomy and any dependence upon semantic externalism or other controversial issues in the philosophy of language/mind. One of the principal benefits of putting the papers in this collection together is allowing us to see that this major strand in Stich's early eliminativism remains an unmet challenge (since, as far as I know, nobody has developed, or tried to develop, an account of syntax that addresses Stich's concerns).

Readers will certainly quibble with some features of this volume. There is a fair amount of overlap across papers and it is not clear that the entry on Folk psychology from the Blackwell Companion to Philosophy of Mind should really have been included. I personally would have welcomed a much longer Introduction, particularly after having read his insightful replies to his critics in Stich and His Critics. But these are minor defects far outweighed by the benefits of having this rich body of material gathered together. Stich has been, and no doubt will continue to be, a hugely influential figure in the philosophy of mind and its interface with the cognitive sciences. This volume is a fitting record of his considerable achievements and ongoing contribution.