2012.03.28

Rosi Braidotti (ed.)

After Poststructuralism: Transitions and Transformations

Rosi Braidotti (ed.), After Poststructuralism: Transitions and Transformations, 398pp., vol. 7 of Alan D. Schrift (ed.), The History of Continental Philosophy (8 vols.), University of Chicago Press, 2010, 2700pp., $800.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226740461.

Reviewed by Constantin V. Boundas, Trent University


Histories of Continental philosophy abound in the market (Boundas's, Critchley's, Cutrofello's, Glendinning's, Kearney's, Leiter and Rosen's, Solomon and Sherman's) but no one, to my knowledge, focuses with such a discerning and critical eye, as this volume does, on the philosophical output of only fifteen years (1980-95) of intense research, vigorous debate and trailblazing publications. The responsibility for this, of course, goes to the vision of Alan Schrift, the general editor of the eight-volume series of which this one is the penultimate. Collective efforts always include essays of different ambitions and strengths; but none, in this case, falls below the threshold of contributing seamlessly to the aggregate strength of the whole. And for this, Rosi Braidotti, the editor of the volume, herself a witness to, and a participant in, the philosophical concerns and achievements of the 1980-95 time-period, must be congratulated for the strong team of scholars that she invited to participate; for her decision to encourage and, for the most part, to succeed in substituting the usual encyclopedic style of writing for the discursive; for commissioning fourteen chapters that attempt to capture processes rather than peruse canonic texts; for not severing philosophical concepts from their cultural, social and political secretions; and for lavishing upon the reader endnotes and bibliographical references that will satisfy the most discerning of researchers.

The volume consists of fourteen independent chapters, each one of which aspires to its distinctive theme. Many chapters are endowed with exceptionally rich documentation and well-chosen references, while all are composed with the intention of painting the most vivid image possible of the respective philosophers' labor in the chosen time-frame. In what follows, I register briefly the contents of these chapters.

Simon Malpas's essay on postmodernism, for being the opening chapter of the volume, may raise a few (and not only French) eyebrows, on the ground that this particular '-ism' has neither explanatory value nor reliable genealogical pedigree. I suggest, though, that we read the chapter with Braidotti's introductory warning in mind, not to read the volume as if it were made of one linear narrative. In this case, the fact that the chapter revolves around Jameson's assessment of the postmodern as the 'cultural logic of late capitalism,' Baudrillard's equation of the postmodern with simulation, seduction and hyperreality, and Lyotard's discussion of the erosion of institutions through the differend and the unrepresentable, will be appreciated for the information only it provides and the place the chapter is given would no longer surprise. 'Postmodernism,' after all, was discussed endlessly in the 1980s and the 1990s.

Dieter Thomä's chapter on German philosophy after 1980 is a panoramic (despite its disclaimers) display of 'themes out of school.' Without wishing to sound ungrateful to its author (indeed, reading his chapter regaled me with a wealth of information about who was who and who was speaking from which standpoint in Germany in the 1980s and 1990s), I must say that I found it to contain too much information for the space it commands. I also thought that the author's intention to hold the themes presented 'out of school' ended up in a crisscrossing narrative that was incapable of keeping the promise that its erudition issued.

The strength of Patrice Maniglier's 'The Structuralist Legacy' lies in its convincing demonstration that structuralism did not die in the 1970s -- as is often thought. On the contrary, its legacy made possible in the 1980s and '90s the best works of Badiou, Jacques-Alain Miller, and Jean-Claude Milner, surrounding the questions of whether or not structuralism needs or is able to support the subject. The efforts of Lecourt, Balibar and Pêcheux to construct a theory of ideology and the ingenious discussion of Petitot regarding an ontology of signs are very helpful segments of the chapter.

Silvia Benso and Brian Schroeder's chapter on Italian philosophy is among the best in the volume. It shows that a rich output (Catholic, laicist, Marxist) can be discussed within a limited space, with some sacrifices naturally, but without losing sight of the multidimensionality of the prevailing, at the time, philosophical thought. The abundant use of footnotes, with the invaluable mass of bibliographical and biographical information they contain, contributes splendidly to this essay's success. I wish that all the chapters of the volume had followed the pattern of rich documentation that Benso and Schroeder, and later on Braidotti and Butler, exhibit.

Josef Fulka's essay on the Czech philosophy in the 1980s and '90s showcases the continuing effort of Czech philosophers to follow in the steps of Jan Patočka's phenomenology and the attempts made to link up Czech structuralism and French post-structuralism. The inclusion of the chapter seems to be the fulfillment of the promise made in Braidotti's introduction to visit territories that were opened up as a result of the 1989 crumbling of the wall(s). But the choice of this and only this former Communist territory prompts the question -- was nothing of philosophical significance happening in Bulgaria, Romania, Poland, or Russia during this period?

Amy Allen's chapter on the third generation of critical theorists reviews the criticisms brought against Habermas's excessive rationalism, proceduralism and formalism, his inadequate conceptualization of power, and his unfortunate downcasting of Hegelian and Foucaultian themes and concerns. The ensuing discussion of Benhabib, Honneth and Fraser renders the chapter very helpful to those who appreciate a few well-aimed pointers at the strengths and the weaknesses of theories in dialogue with one another.

Simon Duffy's chapter on French and Italian Spinozism is, of course, an indispensable component of the volume, given the continuing centrality of Spinoza in Continental philosophy. It is also very informative, given the brief but accurate presentations of Guéroult's, Alquié's, Althusser's, Mathéron's, Deleuze's, Balibar's, Macherey's, Moreau's and Negri's work on the philosopher of immanence. It is nonetheless open to some criticism since, with the exception of Negri, none of the other thinkers belong to the fifteen years that the volume made its own. This criticism could be deflected if the continuing resonance of the legacy of these thinkers were to be made more conspicuous. It is also a pity that François Zourabichvili's important work on Spinoza has been omitted.

Lasse Thomassen's chapter on radical democracy expands upon one more promissory note included in Braidotti's introduction: that the ethical and political struggles should be shown as the relays of theoretical formulations and those, in turn, as the relays of the ethical and political praxis of the period under discussion. Situating itself beyond the quest for essentialist foundations, radical democracy can offer only provisional answers: its emancipatory interest is possible only by being impossible. Despite its skepticism about consensus, the theory of the period does not abandon the idea of community (be it of those who have nothing in common). In the hagiographic archives of the times, the author of the chapter gives a place of honor to Negri and Hardt for ascribing radical democratic potential, immanently, to the multitudes; and to Laclau and Mouffe for theorizing radical democracy from the vantage point of transcendence. The chapter discusses briefly Connolly's and Žižek's concerns that radical democracy has made too many untenable concessions to liberalism. For me, the weakness of this chapter lies in the author's attempt to maintain that the pseudo-messianic Derridean à-venir, with its possible/impossible alternation, is equivalent to the defensible claim that the answers of radical democrats are bound to remain always already provisional.

Iain Chambers's chapter on cultural and postcolonial studies, just like the chapter on Spinoza, is bound to raise a few questions about its time frame. Stuart Hall, Frantz Fannon, Octave Manoni, and Albert Memmi should have found their place as background information, unless an argument were to be made for their continuing relevance. Spivak, Vattimo, Rovatti and Homi Bhabba fit in of course without much trouble. At any rate, the author has successfully argued for the synergy of cultural studies and colonial studies in 'the undoing . . . of the legislative authority of the West as the unique Subject of History.'

Robert Eaglestone's chapter on the ethical turn of the times includes a critique of the Marxism that failed, which, in my opinion, is unnecessarily one-sided and provocative. It then focuses, with more promise, on Levinas and to a lesser extent on Blanchot, Jankelevitch, and the critique of Levinas mounted by the likes of G. Rose, Badiou, Meillassoux and Žižek. Levinas experts will likely find unconvincing the author's presentation of their subject as well as the strength of criticisms addressed to Levinas. As a result, therefore, they will be reticent to accept his conclusion that Levinas's value lies (only) in his having 'offered a way to discuss ethics and politics where no others were available.' Finally, the absence of Paul Ricoeur from the chapter is puzzling. His inclusion would have done more justice to the years 1980-1995, helping them appear much more fertile than the author has allowed them to be.

Written by Braidotti, the chapter on feminist philosophy exceeds the expectations of the reader. Loaded with information about the 'second feminist wave,' it focuses on the prominence given to the concept 'difference' by the members of 'the intermediate generation,' the sharpening of questions of sex, race, and age, the stress on immanence and materialism, the quest for a 'robust notion of objectivity that avoids universalism and relativism,' the foregrounding of 'relationality,' and the exploration of sexuality beyond gender, 'capable of destabilizing gender identity.' Braidotti's essay acknowledges the French philosophy of the second half of the twentieth century as the 'inspirational force that propelled the most innovative theoretical developments for the feminist philosophers of the period,' as well as the timely preoccupation with Spinoza that ushered in a political ontology different from the Hegelian-Marxist paradigm dominant at the time.

If one overlooks its annoying 'dryness,' Bruce Ellis Benson's 'Continental Philosophy of Religion' fits the volume, summarizing in a non-controversial way the appointed time's contributions to the field. The chapter spends some time discussing Levinas and pits Derrida's critique as well as Janicaud's Husserl against him. Michel Henry's 'manifestation of manifestation' is also explained with due fidelity to Husserl's principles in mind. Marion's attempt to move beyond metaphysics phenomenologically is also debated, in an effort to arrive at a givenness that would not be at the mercy of consciousness. Derrida's 'messianic without the Messiah' is predictably present, and the chapter concludes with a brief meditation on Chretien's 'call that wounds.' After all this, the author sums up his discussion with the verdict that 'phenomenology [during this time period] both goes in a distinctly theological direction and undergoes a startling phenomenological reversal.' From among all the chapters in the volume, this one muffles the most the voice of its author and settles for a straightforward 'reportage.'

The inclusion of José Medina's 'The Performative Turn' was a very good idea. It throws a bridge over the 'continental' and the 'analytic,' highlighting the common concerns but also the different imperatives that shape the two 'schools.' By appealing to Wittgenstein, Dewey, Davidson, J.L. Austin and the speech act theorists that followed him, Sellars, Brandom, Rorty and Putnam, but also to Adriana Cavarero, Judith Butler and Naomi Schemann, the author elucidates how action and performance are responsible for rendering 'epistemic issues concerning human understanding [into] social, political and historical issues.' Instructively, in this chapter, the charge of the 'evasion of identity' is brought against analytic philosophy, for the facility with which this 'school' segregates conceptual from empirical issues. 'Evasion of identity,' writes the author, 'occurs when subjectivities are not socially differentiated and do not become corporealized in historically concrete idealities that are culturally specific and genderized, sexualized, ethicized and racialized.' The chapter concludes with Schemann's call to arms: 'We have to take responsibility for marginalized or excluded possibilities'. To which the author adds that 'discursive agency should be conceived first and foremost as a process of negotiation . . . as a kind of 'speaking from elsewhere.'

The last chapter, jointly written by Braidotti and Butler, is a real jewel. Two leading participants in and witnesses to the 1980-1995 explosion of 'philosophy outside its bounds' testify to the glories and the miseries of the time period. The documentation, along with the ample bibliographical information placed in footnotes, is superb. The choice by the two authors of inserting biographical testimonies gives the chapter the powers to inform and to charm.

The weaknesses of the book are not many. I mentioned already the inclusion of Czech theoretical developments in the absence of similar ventures in other former communist Eastern European countries. The pages of the Russian Studies in Philosophy, or, as a mere sample of what is available, the entire issue of Signs 29: 3 (Spring 2004) dedicated to "Feminism in Eastern Europe" should have chastened the editor against unjustified gaps. The glaring absence of Spain comes too as a surprise. Surely, the contributions of Fernando Savater Martin, Eduardo Subirets and Eugenio Trias command our attention. The fact that they are not discussed invites the conclusion that the volume repeats the very view that it itself was set to challenge, namely that Continental European Philosophy goes as far only as Franco-Italian and German philosophies do. Finally, one could decide to mind the absence of thinkers of the caliber of Bruno Latour, François Laruelle, Jacques Rancière, and Clément Rosset, but here the answer may be that no volume can ever encompass the entire universe and that Schrift's master vision may have created room for (some of) them in one of the series's other seven volumes.

This is a volume with a guaranteed wide use as a general reference and also for the discursive and critical strength of the essays included. Philosophers, cultural and gender studies specialists, feminists, sociologists and political scientists would form its most ardent readership. Instructors of graduate and upper year undergraduate courses should be recommending it to students of the humanities in general. The educated public, with an interest in the theoretical trends that shaped up the twentieth century, will not fail to be attracted by this book. In my opinion, it is one of the strongest links in the eight volume- chain of Schrift's History of Continental Philosophy.