2012.04.09

Paul M. Livingston

The Politics of Logic: Badiou, Wittgenstein, and the Consequences of Formalism

Paul M. Livingston, The Politics of Logic: Badiou, Wittgenstein, and the Consequences of Formalism, Routledge, 2012, 394pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415891912.

Reviewed by Levi R. Bryant, Collin College


"Logic", "formalism", and "politics" are not terms ordinarily associated with one another. Often politics is treated as the domain of the historical -- of contingency -- and of contested social relations; while logic and formalism are understood as the domain of the necessary and eternal. Within this framework, given that politics revolves around singular historical and social circumstances and the antagonisms that emerge around distributions of power, what could logic possibly teach us about politics? However, despite the startling effect of this constellation of terms, Livingston's remarkable book admirably demonstrates why considerations of formalism and logic are absolutely central to our understanding of politics.

Prospective readers of The Politics of Logic will find this book to be of great importance and interest for three reasons. First, those interested in the Continental/Analytic divide will be impressed by how Livingston deftly weaves together the work of thinkers as diverse as Deleuze, Derrida, Lacan, Badiou, Gödel, Wittgenstein, Russell, Turing, Quine, and Carnap, demonstrating both how Continental thinkers have a great deal to teach us about logic and formalism, and how Analytic thinkers have a great deal to teach us about politics. Throughout this book, Livingston shows an astonishing grasp of both traditions, as well as a solid and profound grasp of issues in logic and of Gödel's incompleteness theorems. Where our tendency might be to think that Analytic thought is largely apolitical, Livingston shows how Analytic thought's meditations on the nature of language have profound political implications. Likewise, where the tendency might be to think of Continental thought as focused on politics -- especially in its post-structuralist variants -- he shows how these political conclusions are based on considerations of formalism. In other words, Livingston shows how both traditions are parallel developments of a common theme. In doing so, Livingston points the way towards a way of doing philosophy that is neither Continental nor Analytic: Post-divide philosophy.

Second, for those situated in the French Continental tradition such as myself, Livingston brings into relief a common thematic, present in highly diverse thinkers, and demonstrates the political implications that follow from this theme. Increasingly, Continental thought has become occupied with issues of sovereignty and what I call "logics of exception". These themes can be traced in thinkers as diverse as Lacan in his graphs of sexuation, Derrida in his meditations on incompleteness, Badiou in his reflections on events and truth-procedures, Žižek in his reflections on the Real and the Act, Agamben in his work on sovereignty and homo sacer, and many others. Again and again we find demonstrations of the paradoxical and illusory nature of sovereignty, discussions of how totalities are held together by a point of exception, and investigations of how the constitutively incomplete and/or inconsistent nature of social assemblages opens the possibility of both political critique and transformation. What often goes unremarked, however -- though it has become increasingly apparent with Badiou -- is the formal nature of this thematic. Drawing on the resources of Analytic thought and formal logic, Livingston is able to disclose the formal structure that unites these debates and the political import and critical implications of this structure.

Third, and most importantly, through his meditations on formalism and logic, Livingston is able to open new vistas for critique and resistance. In doing so, he generates hope that resistance and change are indeed possible -- and that they are possible for necessary structural reasons, not contingent historical reasons -- thereby contributing to the revitalization of political engagement. If there is one lesson to draw from Livingston's book, it is that there are always and necessarily resources available for resistance: change is necessarily possible. For some time now a fog of pessimism has descended upon Continental political theory. Beginning perhaps with Adorno, there was a growing sense that power, ideology, and the culture industry are so pervasive, so complete, that there is no position from which critique and resistance might be possible. Whatever point of leverage we might occupy -- the story seemed to go -- we were doomed to both reinforce the system of oppression and to unconsciously reproduce its own axioms. Something similar seems to occur in Foucault. Despite the fact that he argues that counter-power always responds to power, one nonetheless got the sense -- as Habermas argued in The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity -- that there is no escape from the pervasive tendrils of power. What Livingston so compellingly demonstrates is that there is no system of society, language, or power so complete, so totalizing, that resistance and critique are impossible.

How, then, does Livingston go about showing this? The first point of importance is that reflections on society and politics are 1) reflections on parts, wholes, and totalities, and therefore 2) are amenable to considerations of formal logic regarding parts and wholes. Here it's as if one side of social assemblages and the politics that emerges within them will be historical and contingent in nature, referring always to singular circumstances, while another side will necessarily face considerations of formality pertaining to the constraints governing relations between parts and whole and the logic of parts and wholes. To think the social and political is to think relations between parts and whole, forms of organization, and the relations organizing these assemblages. When, in our pessimistic moments, we say that political transformation and resistance are impossible we are, in fact, making a formal claim. We are saying that societies are wholes that form totalities so complete that there is no point from which resistance and critique are possible. Rather, because society, under this thesis, manages to totalize its parts -- because the whole exhausts its parts and completely integrates them -- any resistance will merely reproduce the ideology of the whole and any resistance will merely reproduce the distribution of power organizing the totality. Escape is impossible.

The very simple question that Livingston raises is "Is this true?" Or, put differently, are totalities such as this possible? Drawing on the formal resources of Cantor, Russell, and above all Gödel, Livingston shows that in fact totalities of this sort are not formally or structurally possible. Cantor's paradox demonstrated that a genuine whole that would be complete, fully enumerating and accounting for its parts, is not possible because the subsets of a set are always greater in number and possible arrangement than the set from which they are drawn. As a consequence, every social totality -- which is itself a set -- will necessarily have an uncontrollable excess rumbling beneath it. Russell's paradox showed that it is not possible to form a set of all sets that are not members of themselves, thereby demonstrating that totalities are riven by paradox. Finally, Gödel demonstrated that every formal system is either necessarily incomplete or inconsistent. It is these formal discoveries that provide the means of comprehending both the possibility of critique and resistance.

Developing these formal considerations pertaining to parts, wholes, and totalities, Livingston rereads debates in Continental political theory in terms of these paradoxes. He distinguishes between sovereign orientations and post-Cantorian orientations. Sovereign orientations are those that claim that completeness and consistency are possible. Among these we find criteriological/constructivist orientations and Onto-Theological orientations. The former argue that it is possible to completely formalize the rules structuring the social world in a consistent way from the standpoint of a theorist who stands outside that social world and surveys it. Here we might think of Carnap's logical positivist project, but perhaps also the project of Adorno with his decoding of culture and the so-called social constructivists in sociology. Their thesis is that the social world and language form complete and consistent totalities without remainder. The sovereignty of this position is to be found in both the completeness and consistency of these totalities, as well as the position of the theorist somehow outside these systems that articulates their rules. Onto-Theological orientations, by contrast, hold that the completeness and consistency of the world are guaranteed by a mysterious being that can never be known by the human mind but that nonetheless structures the world and society. It will be noted that both of these positions very precisely mirror the masculine side of the graphs of sexuation, where it is argued that masculine frameworks establish a complete and consistent totality by dint of an exception that stands outside the system. Here critique is largely impossible because language and social systems form a complete totality.

Under Livingston's account we are able to refer to sovereign orientations as obfuscatory (though he doesn't use the term) insofar as they veil the paradoxical nature of every totality. By contrast, post-Cantorian orientations disclose the fundamentally paradoxical nature of every totality, thereby locating those sites where resistance and critique might be possible. Like sovereign orientations, post-Cantorian orientations divide into two strategies, both following the implications of Gödel's theorems though without necessarily knowing it. Livingston refers to the first of these strategies as "paradoxico-critical". The paradoxico-critical orientation holds that language does indeed form a complete system, that there is nothing that language cannot articulate, but that inconsistency is an ineradicable, structural, necessary feature of this system arising from the reflexive properties of language. The inconsistencies of language -- a favorite theme of both Derrida and Žižek, but also Deleuze -- coupled with the reflexivity of language provide the critical purchase for challenging those social totalities that would purport to be entirely consistent. As a consequence, it is always possible to introduce alternatives and resist reigning social systems.

By contrast, the second orientation, typified by Badiou and which Livingston refers to as "generic", argues that language and social systems are consistent but necessarily incomplete. Every language and social system will contain elements that cannot be accounted for by the system and language, such that language and the social system are incomplete. As a consequence of this constitutive incompleteness it is possible for something new to be introduced into the social system and it is possible to critique any social system from a position outside the rules, norms, and power that govern the system.

Based on this sorting of positions, Livingston is able to resituate a number of debates in contemporary Continental theory. For example, we often hear social constructivists talk about incommensurability between different cultures. If systems of rules form complete totalities and all communications are governed by these rules, how is it possible for two cultures to communicate with one another or for one culture to change another? If Livingston is right, however, this is the wrong sort of question. If it is true that every social system is either incomplete or inconsistent, then social systems are incommensurable with themselves. From the standpoint of paradoxico-criticism, there is no social system that is so consistent that it manages to achieve perfect identity with itself. And it is for this reason that it is possible for social systems to change. Incommensurability is already at the heart of each social system.

This is only one example of how Livingston is able to shed new light on ongoing debates through his reflections on formalism and logic. I have not done nearly enough justice to this rich book. Livingston beautifully brings a series of themes animating Continental and Analytic thought into relief and, in doing so, opens new possibilities for debate and discussion. It is likely that this book will be a key reference in discussions surrounding Continental theory for years to come. With any luck it will help to shift these discussions out of well-worn grooves and in new directions. Written in a clear and accessible style, Livingston is able to convey the discoveries of formal logic in ways that will not cause those ignorant of symbolic logic to flee (and here it's important to note that there's almost no symbolic formalization in the book). My only complaint is that the book is currently so expensive. Routledge needs to release this text in an inexpensive paperback version as soon as possible so that it might intervene in contemporary debates in the way both the book and these debates deserve. If you wish to understand the central issues in Continental political theory over the last few decades, Livingston's book is the one to read.