Malcolm Bull


Malcolm Bull, Anti-Nietzsche, Verso, 2011, 212pp., $26.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781859845745.

Reviewed by James Rodwell, University of Essex

Readers prompted by the title of Malcolm Bull's book to expect an all-out attack on Nietzsche's philosophy will find themselves surprised. Though Anti-Nietzsche critically engages with some of the most notorious aspects of Nietzsche's thought, Bull has no interest in defending democracy, liberalism, socialism etc. against the charge that the social arrangements recommended by these traditions necessitate leveling down and loss of value. That is, Bull neither endeavours to discredit the critical side of Nietzsche's philosophy nor does he offer anything like a traditional challenge to Nietzsche's own positive philosophical position. Instead, Bull seeks to develop Nietzsche's work towards conclusions that would be utterly anathema to the latter. The project of Anti-Nietzsche is to explore the possibility of critical opposition to Nietzsche from within a thoroughly Nietzschean framework. Bull aims to be one of the 'few post-Nietzschean anti-Nietzscheans -- critics whose response is designed not to prevent us from getting to Nietzsche, but to enable us to get over him.' (30) Bull presents his case for a critical post-Nietzscheanism both through a close-reading of Nietzsche's texts and by bringing Nietzsche into dialogue with a broad range of thinkers found commonly and uncommonly in association with the latter -- Heidegger, Vattimo, Nancy, Agamben, Parfit and Schopenhauer to name a few. In what follows, I restrict myself to presenting what I take to be the main features of the argument in Anti-Nietzsche, before offering a few critical comments.

Although he wants to present opposition from within Nietzsche's own line of argument, perhaps the most intriguing aspect of Bull's position is his requirement that we radically reshape our habits when it comes to reading Nietzsche. Bull wants to rely upon Nietzschean arguments, but he also wants us to take up a skeptical distance from the rhetorical aspects of Nietzsche's writings. According to Bull, the persuasive power of Nietzsche's work lies in its exploitation of the reader's tendency to 'read for victory'. One might think that Nietzsche's characterisation of his work as intended for a select group, possessed of rare and hard-won capabilities should result in the majority of readers positioning themselves as lying outside this group. However, Bull argues that its actual effect is to the contrary. The majority of readers tend towards identification with the victors. This is partly because of the 'imaginative liberation from all the social, moral and economic constraints' that such identification grants, and partly because 'identification with 'the rest' involves reading one's way through many pages of abuse directed at people like oneself.' (31) Nietzsche presents us with a choice between reading in a manner that offers the feeling of power and satisfaction, and reading in a manner that will instill a feeling of powerlessness and vulnerability.

Bull invites us to take the second path, and to read, as he puts it, 'like losers'. Rather than being exhilarated by participating in the work of the masters, we are to take ourselves as the victims of the text. This does not mean looking to undermine Nietzsche's arguments. 'In order to read like a loser you have to accept the argument, but turn the consequences against yourself.' (37) From such a perspective, those prospects that strike Nietzsche with horror appear attractive. Whereas to those that are seeking mastery and aesthetic distinctiveness the prospect of a society of undifferentiated equals would amount to the lamentable eradication of value, the loser perceives such a vision of the future as 'offering a welcome respite from a cruel predator'. (43) Reading like a loser is, for Bull, a way of evading the charge that one is operating with the 'ressentiment' of the weak. It is not a means to achieve power by subterfuge, but a deliberate effort to divest oneself of power, to grow weaker. As such, reading like a loser is, for Bull, a strategic refusal of the feeling of expansiveness and power that Nietzsche aims to affect in us when we read his texts. More positively, this strategy is recommended in order to push the trajectory of nihilism beyond the point at which Nietzsche seeks to complete it.

On Bull's account Nietzsche's completion of nihilism leads us to what the former labels a 'positive ecology of value'. The history of nihilism, as Bull outlines in chapter three, is the history of the progressive undermining of value (moral, religious etc.) that culminates in the recognition that only valuation is itself of value. The history of nihilism reveals that 'the one irreducible value was therefore the value of valuation.' (45) If the final consequence of nihilism is that the only value is valuation itself, then politics is not to reflect the belief in any particular value; it is a matter of developing the right hierarchical interrelations between groups that would facilitate the flourishing of those capable of positing values. Thus, 'a positive ecology of value is one that provides the conditions for the preservation and enhancement of a new aristocracy'. (71) Of course, under such a view, exploitation is absolutely indispensable. The 'new aristocracy' exploit the undifferentiated mass of others, just as 'the sun-seeking, Javanese climbing plant' uses the oak on which it grows to climb until the point that it 'will be able to unfold its highest crown of foliage and show its happiness in the full, clear light.'[1]

For the purposes of his argument, Bull largely accepts, though expands upon, Nietzsche's analysis of nihilism and the requirement to think ecologically about value. However, Bull departs from Nietzsche in claiming that the value of such a positive ecology is itself open to question. 'Although value might ultimately be ecological, it does not follow that its ecology is valuable.' (47) Bull's anti-Nietzscheanism might be summarized as the rejection of the view that a positive ecology is valuable. Succinctly put, Bull invites us to accept Nietzsche's analysis and simply to go the other way. Why not embrace the conditions under which valuation is minimized? Here we can see the 'countermove' to Nietzsche emerge.

Rather than a positive ecology of value, which creates the possibility for conditions of valuation, there might be a negative ecology -- an ecology that minimizes the possibilities for the positing of value and so reduces the quantum of value still further. (47)

Such a move is anti-Nietzschean because although a positive ecology demands that some belong to the mass of those incapable of value creation, it also requires that the number of those belonging to that mass should not exceed the numbers required to serve the 'supermen-aesthetes'. (47) Bull's proposal is that we might endorse a negative ecology that aims at extending, without limit, the mass of those incapable of valuation.

As Bull acknowledges, by pursuing this possibility, he is effectively arguing that Nietzsche does not complete nihilism in arriving at a positive ecology of value. Nietzsche overlooks the possibility of a continuation of nihilism, at the ecological level, as the progressive undermining of the capacity for valuation itself. But if valuation is, for Nietzsche, a distinctively human capacity (even if it is unequally distributed), Bull's project amounts to a call to 'subhumanism'. Indeed, Bull invites us to consider the 'new possibilities' opened up by a turn towards 'subhuman sociality' (43). Furthermore, becoming subhuman means becoming a philistine, entirely unreceptive to aesthetic value. Here we see why Bull's thesis is counter-cultural, not just anti-Nietzschean. As argued throughout the book, our intellectual culture shares in Nietzsche's belief in the value of the aesthetic. The latter persists as the one domain of value that has been spared from the 'history of negation'. That this is the case is evidenced, for Bull, by the absence of self-identified philistines. Though the term 'philistine' exists as a term of abuse (as, for example, 'atheism' once did) there are few, if any, self-professed philistines. This shows that 'the aesthetic is assumed to be a shared social value and that being a philistine remains a potential embarrassment.' (13) What Bull proposes is nothing short of our taking the final step in the history of negation by self-consciously taking up the standpoint of the philistine.

No doubt Bull's Anti-Nietzsche does present an arresting possibility for consideration as well as providing a helpful study of some the most difficult and notorious aspects of Nietzsche's thought. Bull's treatment of Nietzsche on nihilism, value and weakness of will are particularly worthy of commendation. The breadth and depth of Bull's scholarship are also incredibly impressive. In expanding his argument, Bull marshals an astounding array of figures from across the humanities and social sciences.

I offer just a few critical remarks. To begin with, Bull could do more to motivate his chosen critical strategy. For example, Bull provides only a very short treatment of alternative lines of opposition to Nietzsche. Bull claims that Nietzsche's opponents have typically thought that 'reestablishing that Nietzsche was an amoral, irrationalist, antiegalitarian who had no respect for basic human rights suffices as a means of disposing of his arguments.' (30) This may be true, but Bull does little to support this claim and so, somewhat ironically, it takes on the appearance of a casual dismissal. Such an omission might not present much of a problem were it not so hard to see what 'subhumanism' and a 'negative ecology of value' are supposed to have going for them. Admittedly, there may be problems with any quick arguments here, as such arguments would most likely involve appeal to values, the diminution of which is precisely what 'negative ecology' is all about. Nevertheless, as noted above, Bull does invite us to consider the 'new possibilities' of a 'subhuman society'. If Bull is to undermine the Nietzschean view that such a subhuman society is blatantly unpalatable, then more needs to be said about what these 'new possibilities' might be and why they are even worth our consideration.

[1] Nietzsche, F., Beyond Good and Evil, R. Horstmann and J. Norman (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002, §258.