2012.05.16

Robert F. Almeder

Truth and Skepticism

Robert F. Almeder, Truth and Skepticism, Rowman and Littlefield, 2010, 249pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781442205130.

Reviewed by John Capps, Rochester Institute of Technology


Robert Almeder's Truth and Skepticism is a heroic book. Almeder tackles two of the largest, most fundamental, most perennial problems in epistemology: how best to understand truth and how to avoid skepticism. Arguing that these problems are related, he offers an unorthodox solution based on a full-bore defense of an epistemic theory of truth.

Epistemic theories of truth, roughly speaking, account for truth in terms of some epistemic property such as justification or warranted assertibility. These theories hold that a belief (proposition, statement, etc.) is true if and only if it is, in some sense, well-supported. Epistemic theories of truth are generally viewed as pretty far out of the mainstream, despite having had some prominent defenders over the years (including, depending on one's interpretation, C.S. Peirce, Michael Dummett, Hilary Putnam, and Crispin Wright).[1]

As Stewart Shapiro has noted, contemporary theories of truth tend to go in one of two distinct directions. On the one hand, there are theories that take a formal approach to the question of truth. These theories -- the axiomatic theory of Halbach and others is a good example -- place a premium on avoiding the well-known paradoxes, such as the liar paradox, that have embarrassed attempts to define truth without self-contradiction. Unfortunately, these technical theories often leave us with a picture of truth that is a lot more complex than the relatively transparent property that we use -- and, for the most part, seem to use pretty well -- every day. On the other hand, as a result, there are theories that begin by trying to capture how we actually use the concept of truth in our everyday lives and conversations. These theories, which include old friends such as the correspondence, coherence, pragmatic, and even deflationary theories, can get quite complex, too. However, they generally don't depend so much on technical brilliance as on appeals to what is intuitively plausible given how we use and understand the concept of truth. While this may oversimplify the contemporary debate, it does go to show how there is no consensus on the best way of approaching the concept of truth. One could make a similar point with regard to the problem of skepticism, where some epistemologists aim to refute skepticism while others try to change the topic, shift the burden of proof, or even concede the force of skeptical arguments. In the case of both truth and skepticism, as a result, there are competing intuitions and it isn't always clear how to choose among these. I'll return to this point later.

But on to Almeder. As I mentioned earlier, Almeder proposes and defends an epistemic theory of truth. So, what is an epistemic theory of truth? Surprisingly, this is not a question Almeder addresses in much detail, though there are hints here and there. Very early he writes that "we can find persuasive reasons to abandon our common conception of truth and settle instead for some suitably characterized epistemic conception explicated in terms of robust confirmability or full warranted assertibility" (2, emphasis added). And later he says this:

For the epistemic theories, however, what is necessary and sufficient for the truth of "P" is that the belief that P be established in a certain way that provides maximum evidence for accepting P as true in our ordinary non-epistemic sense of 'true'. (49)

So Almeder's claim is that P is true if, and only if, there is "maximum evidence" that establishes it "in a certain way." But he does not have much to say about this "certain way," what constitutes "maximum evidence," or how we can tell when the evidence is, in fact, maximal.

But perhaps these quibbles can be set aside. Almeder's argument is primarily an attack on non-epistemic theories of truth. If his argument is successful, then an epistemic theory -- whatever exactly that amounts to -- will be the only remaining game in town. His argument against non-epistemic theories of truth rests on two conditions: what he calls the "Non-vacuity Principle" and the "Reliability Principle." These are worth quoting in full:

[Non-vacuity Principle:] any minimally adequate theory of truth should provide a non-vacuous explication, characterization, or definition of truth, and thereby allow us, at least sometimes, under some minimally reliable procedure, to decide or determine, justifiably which propositions (beliefs or statements) about the world are in fact true, as the theory defines or characterizes truth. (7)

[Reliability Principle:] To say, moreover, that a method or procedure for determining the truth value of propositions (or assertions or beliefs) is minimally acceptable or reliable is to say that, at least on some occasions, one either does, or can, succeed, via the use of such a method or procedure, in justifiably picking out which assertions or beliefs are in fact true under one's proposed explication, characterization, or definition, of truth. (7)

These two principles play crucial roles in Almeder's argument against non-epistemic theories of truth. Here is the argument, with the correspondence theory of truth as an example:

P1. There is no adequate method, procedure, or criterion for determining reliably which among our robustly confirmed (or confirmable) or very probable beliefs are in fact true under the correspondence construal of truth; and it is not conceivable that there ever will be.

P2. If P1 then we have no reliable method or decision procedure for deciding which propositions in our language are true under the correspondence definition of truth.

P3. If the Non-vacuity Principle is strongly justified and if the Reliability Principle is strongly justified, then if P1 and P2 are acceptable, then the correspondence theory of truth is irreparably defective for any nonskeptical minimally adequate theory of truth.

P4. The Non-vacuity Principle is strongly justified, the Reliability Principle is strongly justified, and P1 along with P2 are acceptable.

Therefore: The Correspondence Theory of Truth is irreparably defective for any nonskeptical minimally adequate theory of truth. (18-19)

Even though Almeder frames this argument against a correspondence theory of truth, his point is much larger: he claims that any theory of truth that accepts the T-schema ("'p' is true iff p") draws a distinction between truth and justification that runs afoul of the Non-vacuity Principle. As a result, he intends this argument to apply not just to the correspondence theory, but also to disquotational, deflationary, and minimalist theories, plus everything in between.

The obvious question, given its importance to his argument, is whether to grant the Non-vacuity Principle. Almeder offers a couple of reasons why we should accept it. The first reason is general: it's plausible to think that a good theory of X must be able to tell Xs from non-Xs. If a theory can't do that, he claims, then it simply isn't a very good theory. The second reason is more specific: if our theory of truth cannot distinguish true beliefs from false beliefs, then this leads to a "debilitating skepticism" (4-5).

With regard to Almeder's first claim -- an acceptable theory of truth must be able to distinguish true beliefs from false beliefs -- one obvious response is to draw the standard distinction between theories of truth and theories of justification. Traditionally, epistemologists have proposed theories of justification to help distinguish true from false beliefs, and have put forward theories of truth to give an account, in some narrower sense, of what truth really is. One might, for example, combine a correspondence theory of truth with a foundationalist theory of justification. The latter tells us which of our beliefs are justified and thus likely true in the sense specified by the former.

But Almeder cannot accept this division of labor and, as a result, draws a distinction between a theory and a definition of truth:

Should not a minimally adequate theory of truth, in contradistinction to a minimally adequate definition, characterization, or explication of the concept of truth, serve the end of allowing us under some method or procedure to pick out, at least occasionally, which beliefs, propositions, or statements in our language are in fact true under the definition of truth provided in the theory? (9, emphasis in original)

Almeder's point seems to be this: a non-epistemic theory may provide a perfectly adequate definition of truth while failing to distinguish true from false beliefs in the way that an adequate theory should. However, defenders of non-epistemic theories are likely to see this as a bit of terminological sleight-of-hand. Whether you call it a "theory" or a "definition" they would argue that what Almeder requires for a theory of truth goes well beyond what is necessary and in fact belongs to another part of epistemology. All we really need from a theory of truth, they can argue, is an account of what truth is or what "true" means; other issues can be addressed elsewhere. So, whether you call it a "definition" or a "theory," an account of truth need not supply a method for distinguishing true and false beliefs -- just as an account of basketball (the rule-book?) need not supply a method for distinguishing it from bowling. Identifying such a method is, of course, a worthwhile project, but it is quite distinct from the core question of what truth is.

Almeder's second reason in support of the Non-vacuity Principle is that it provides, for any theory that satisfies it, a built-in response to skepticism. An epistemic theory of truth satisfies the Non-vacuity Principle almost by definition: if true beliefs are those that are robustly confirmable, then there's no worry about having the well-justified but possibly false beliefs that motivate skeptical thought experiments. Thus, if it is robustly confirmable that I have two hands then, according to the epistemic theory of truth, it is true that I have two hands. From this it also follows that I'm not a handless brain-in-a-vat, and the case for skepticism never gets off the ground. I agree with Almeder that defeating skepticism is a Good Thing but, again, it isn't clear that this is a necessary feature of a theory of truth as opposed to a theory of justification or knowledge. That Almeder's account of truth has this feature is a bit like coming across a kitchen gadget that's both a juicer and a coffee-maker. One is impressed by the ingenuity but must wonder if a more specialized tool would do the job better.

In the book's second part Almeder offers an extensive defense of the epistemic theory of truth. This section is admirably rich and detailed. It also makes clear just how sweeping his proposal actually is. For example, Almeder takes up the criticism (raised by Alston and myriad others) that, contra the epistemic theory of truth, it is easy to imagine, first, how robustly confirmed beliefs could be false while, second, true beliefs could fail to be robustly confirmed. Almeder responds by accusing Alston et al. of begging the question:

We can imagine a proposition being true but not completely justifiable . . . only if we assume at the outset the correspondence or alethic conception of truth as the correct concept of truth. (70, emphasis in original)

He then claims that the epistemic theory of truth is not "an explication or definition of our common or ordinary concept of truth" (71). Rather he is:

stipulatively constructing a replacement concept of truth adequate for an ideal epistemology consistent with a basic commitment to the view that we know something about this world, and that it makes no sense to say one knows that "P" and "P" is, or may be, false. (71, emphasis in original)

Thus, in response to Alston's and similar critiques of epistemic theories of truth, Almeder stresses that an epistemic theory is not designed to capture what we ordinarily mean by "true." Rather, it is designed to bypass the "debilitating" skepticism referred to earlier. This move comes with benefits -- who doesn't want a response to skepticism? -- but just as clearly with significant costs: by distancing the epistemic concept of truth from "our common or ordinary concept of truth" Almeder is no longer talking about truth as we typically use and understand this concept. In that case we may well wonder if the benefit of avoiding skepticism is worth the cost of casting doubt on our everyday ways of using and thinking about truth -- especially when there may be other, less costly, ways of avoiding skepticism.

As I mentioned earlier, epistemologists have different ways of approaching the concept of truth. Some have the goal of avoiding problems such as the liar paradox. Others have the goal of preserving and clarifying our ordinary ways of using truth. Going a bit farther, some theories aim to provide a criterion of truth (pragmatic theories may fall in this category), some aim to explain how we use the concept of truth (disquotational and deflationary theories), and some aim to explain what makes a belief true (correspondence theories). In contrast, Almeder's goal is to rebut skepticism. That is a fine goal, but because he then rejects our "common or ordinary concept of truth," he must sacrifice some deeply held intuitions about truth and its relation to justification.

Because the sacrifices are significant, one naturally wonders if Almeder can achieve his anti-skeptical goal by another means. One might even wonder if his goal needs to be achieved at all: if the choice is between skepticism or an epistemic theory of truth, perhaps one is better off accepting skepticism than rejecting our "ordinary concept of truth."

For this reason Almeder titles the third section of his book "Defeating Skepticism." He focuses primarily on contextualist responses to skepticism that, as proposed by Keith DeRose and others, claim we legitimately attribute knowledge in skeptic-free contexts while withholding knowledge attributions in contexts where the standards are raised to the skeptic's levels. Almeder disagrees, arguing that contextualism offers at best a Pyrrhic victory over skepticism because it grants the fundamental correctness of the skeptic's standards. Almeder argues, against the contextualist, that we are not entitled to attribute knowledge just because the skeptic has stepped out of the room.[2]

Rather, Almeder argues that we know we are not brains-in-vats because, in order to have knowledge, it is not necessary that we rule out alternatives that are only logically possible. Focusing on the skeptical "argument-from-ignorance" ("I don't know I'm not a brain-in-a-vat; if I don't know I'm not a brain-in-a-vat then I don't know I have two hands; therefore, I don't know I have two hands") Almeder argues that it "begs the question against its opponents by assuming without proof that the only legitimate sense of 'knows' is one that requires for its instantiation freedom from the logical possibility of error" (150).

One can certainly hope that Almeder is right that skepticism can, somehow, be rebutted and is not, therefore, a real alternative to the epistemic theory of truth. But even so it's not clear why a theory of truth should have a built-in response to skepticism. Consider that Almeder seems to be defending a relevant alternatives approach to skepticism, a respectable line of thought that is independent of any particular theory of truth. If, as he argues, this is an adequate response to skepticism, then it's hard to see why one wouldn't accept that conclusion, consider skepticism defeated, and go back to a non-epistemic theory of truth. Doing so would allow us to maintain common, ordinary conceptions of both truth and knowledge. Of course, this would divorce the problem of skepticism from the problem of defining truth but, as we've seen, that's a plausible separation.

The arguments for and against Almeder's epistemic theory rely heavily on our intuitions: intuitions about how to investigate the concept of truth, intuitions about the best way of rebutting skepticism, intuitions about the criteria for an adequate theory of truth, and intuitions about the relationship between theories of truth, justification, and knowledge. Conflicting intuitions are notoriously difficult to referee, especially when, to preserve some intuitions, we must sacrifice others. And any proposal that demands such sacrifices faces an additional burden of proof.

For the most part, Almeder shoulders very well the burden of defending his epistemic theory of truth: for instance, he responds to an impressively broad range of counter-arguments. But, in places, he also makes the same question-begging moves he accuses his opponents of making. For example, recall that he accused his opponents of begging the question of whether a belief could be maximally justified but still false: this led to his claim that the epistemic theory of truth provides a replacement concept that we should accept, even though it is not what we ordinarily mean by "true." However, in his argument against skepticism Almeder makes the same question-begging move. Summing up, he writes that:

We only needed to show that, given what we ordinarily mean by 'knows that,' it would not be a necessary condition on propositional knowledge that we eliminate the logical possibility of error as a relevant alternative to any presumptively valid knowledge claim about this world. (175, emphasis added)

Here the tables are turned: Almeder is assuming "what we ordinarily mean by 'knows that'" while the skeptic is proposing a sense of "knows that" which, the skeptic would argue, is a more precise, more consistent replacement for our "common or ordinary" way of talking. It is not clear why an appeal to what we ordinarily mean is appropriate in the case of "knows that" but not in the case of "true" -- unless the overriding concern is to defeat skepticism. But that is certainly question-begging: what is good for the goose is good for the gander.

The epistemic theory of truth is not an easy theory to defend. Because it flies in the face of some deeply held -- and well considered -- intuitions, it must shoulder an extra burden of proof.[3] Moreover, I'm not convinced that hitching it to an argument against skepticism helps much, especially when there are theories of knowledge and justification that can do the job as well or better. Despite these concerns, Truth and Skepticism is a densely argued, wide-ranging exploration of epistemic theories of truth.[4] Reading this book gives one an excellent sense for both the benefits, and the costs, of such theories. And while I suspect that the costs outweigh the benefits, this does not detract from the impressiveness, and even heroism, of the attempt.[5]

References

Alston, William. 1996. A Realist Conception of Truth. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.

Burgess, Alex and Burgess, John P. 2011. Truth. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.

DeRose, Keith. 1995. Solving the Skeptical Problem. The Philosophical Review 104:1-52.

Halbach, Volker. 2011. Axiomatic Theories of Truth. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Hawthorne, John. 2004. Knowledge and Lotteries. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Misak, Cheryl. 2000. Truth, Politics, Morality. London: Routledge.

Shapiro, Stewart. 2009. Review of Truth as One and Many. Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews.

Stanley, Jason. 2005. Knowledge and Practical Interests. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Williams, Michael. 1995. Unnatural Doubts. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.



[1] For example, epistemic theories of truth are barely mentioned in John and Alexis Burgess' recent Truth (2011).

[2] Almeder focuses almost exclusively on DeRose's (1995) contextualist response to skepticism. It would be interesting to see how he would respond to a wider range of theories, such as the invariantism subsequently proposed by Jason Stanley and John Hawthorne, among others, or even the version of contextualism proposed earlier by Michael Williams.

[3] Since Peirce is often mentioned as having an epistemic theory of truth, it's worth mentioning Cheryl Misak's work in bringing Peirce into the twenty-first century. While her updating of Peirce is difficult to pigeon-hole, she does outline a pragmatic alternative to both the deflationary and correspondence theories that Almeder should find congenial.

[4] Speaking of densely argued, I can't help but think that the publisher could have copy-edited this book more carefully. There are too many sentences like this one:

Even so, in the end, for the reasons mentioned above when we examined the first premise of AI, it is difficult to see how the new contextualism will be able to argue successful against Sosa's basic point that when all the dust settles here, the first and proper response to AI is simply that the first premise is false and that a Moorean-like argument (one which undercuts the assumption in BIV to the effect that knowledge requires the preclusion of the logical possibility of error) can show as much. (164)

I don't disagree, but there must be a better way of saying this!

[5] This review emerged from an author-meets-critics panel at the 2011 APA Pacific Division meetings. My thanks to my co-panelists, Catherine Elgin and Michael P. Lynch, and to Bob Almeder for their comments and insights.