2012.05.26

James J. DiCenso

Kant, Religion, and Politics

James J. DiCenso, Kant, Religion, and Politics, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 294pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107009332.

Reviewed by Jacqueline Mariña, Purdue University


This book aims to provide a comprehensive analysis of Kant's views on the role of religion in political contexts. DiCenso provides in-depth analyses not only of Kant's ethical and religious writings, but also of the place of the first Critique in Kant's critical understanding of the role of religion in the public sphere. He focuses the whole of Kant's project through the lens of the idea that if religion is not understood critically, it can function to support ethical heteronomy and political domination. DiCenso ingeniously frames Kant's views on religion by contextualizing them in light of his larger, and perhaps much more significant, project reconstructing Kant: he aims to show how the whole of Kant's philosophy is geared towards an Enlightenment critique of traditions and institutions having an impact on moral judgment. As such, he moves away from interpretations of Kantian ethics that tend to focus on the individual alone. Instead, he strives to demonstrate Kant's awareness of the role of social, political, and institutional contexts in shaping possibilities for ethical conduct. Traditions, cultural and imaginative productions, and institutions can function to either facilitate or impede our understanding of the standpoint of others, and hence how our maxims will affect them. Such an understanding of the standpoint of the other is key to moral judgment, since without it we cannot really gauge the impact of our maxims on them.

But our access to such a standpoint is in many regards shaped by factors beyond our immediate control, namely, the social, political, and institutional contexts in which we find ourselves. These contexts play several important roles. First, they shape the contours of rights and duties of persons in socio-political frameworks. These have a determinative role in informing the way that persons relate to one another in the public sphere. Second, these relations, along with the upsurge of cultural productions, in turn shape the moral imagination, that is, how we envision both ourselves and others. This envisioning is key to moral judgment, since it determines the way in which abstract moral principles are applied. In this way they have a determinative influence in how conflicting needs can be adequately prioritized and harmonized. Both factors play key roles in our ability to judge properly. DiCenso reads Kant's project as a critique of social, political, and cultural institutions: reforming these will help bring "our subjective maxims and dispositions into greater concord with ethical principles" (216).

Now, religions are constituted both by a narrative tradition and by institutions supporting a way of life based on these narratives, and as such religion has a potent influence on how we understand ourselves, our role in the world, and our relationship to others. It is part of what DiCenso (citing Stephen Englund) calls le politique, "non-governmental cultural forces that can directly influence a population" (4). Religion thereby plays a key role in shaping moral judgment. DiCenso contextualizes Kant's critical understanding of religion in terms of the role it plays in shaping the social and political sphere, and thereby the way it informs our possibilities for ethical judgment. This way of presenting Kant's understanding of religion is quite fruitful.

However, DiCenso makes two other claims in the book that warrant questioning. First, he too often presents Kant as understanding religion as mere symbolism that must be re-interpreted through practical reason so as to further human moral endeavors. Now, it is no doubt true that Kant emphatically notes that religious symbols, their objects, and the institutions surrounding them must be critically understood and reformed in accordance with the demands of practical reason. DiCenso is right to highlight Kant's arguments that if religion is not understood critically it can degenerate into an ideological support system for heteronomy and political domination. But such a critical understanding of religion does not demand that we think of God as a mere idea, and too often this is the way that DiCenso presents Kant's arguments. Second, DiCenso presents Kant as arguing that religion must be re-envisioned in such a way that "the hope that we invest in supersensible worlds and in the authorities who proclaim them should be redirected toward critically transforming the political worlds in which we live" (161). This idea, no doubt, already contains proto-Marxist strands, and one is lead to wonder just how much DiCenso reads Kant in light of post-Kantian developments. In what follows I will address these two issues.

The Place of God's Existence

DiCenso is correct to underscore the value of Kant's epistemological clearing in the first Critique: rationalist and dogmatist conclusions regarding the existence of God and the soul "rationalize the difficulties and conflicts of existence while offering a comprehensive orientation for life" (p. 125). The problem with such an uncritical standpoint is that it offers easy, comforting answers that too often function ideologically to support political hegemony. Theoretical reason misleads itself into thinking it has arrived at a metaphysical proof for such objects, objects which can then be interpreted in such a way as to bolster those in power and the status quo. According to DiCenso, the clearing away of such "firm points of reference" makes way for Kant's advocacy for "engaging multiple standpoints in our ethical thinking and practice" (125). Dogmatism, he notes, can feed illusion and enthusiasm; he rightly points out that some of the most significant results of the first Critique bear in important ways on ethics and religion.

However, DiCenso too often runs together Kant's arguments in the first and second Critiques, ignoring significant nuances in Kant's position. For instance, he never significantly moves beyond Kant's claim in the first Critique concerning the legitimate reach of theoretical reason: "reason does not presuppose the existence of a being conforming to the ideal, but only the idea of such a being" (A577-78/B605-06). For DiCenso, the ideas are merely foci of the imagination (p. 132). So he too often glosses over Kant's stress on the difference between the limits of theoretical reason in establishing the existence of the objects of metaphysics and theology, and the demands of practical reason. While theoretical reason cannot legitimately prove God's existence, Kant nevertheless insists on the primacy of practical reason, and here, Kant maintains, the moral agent must hope and act as if God exists. It cannot be stressed enough that this hope is not directed to a mere imaginary object; one hopes that God really does exist. While one cannot know that God exists, moral commitments demand that we make a decision and act as if God exists. This is rational faith and the true meaning of moral hope. DiCenso, however, does not really take this into account. In fact, he cites elements of Kant's discussion in section VII of the Dialectic of the second Critique in order to show that for Kant ideas of reason (such as God) function merely regulatively, and that we need not assume their objects (p. 215). But this citation is out of context, as Kant is here really discussing the limits of speculative thought; these speculative limitations are, in an important sense, overridden through the primacy of the practical allowing us to legitimately think of God as having objective reality.

Because DiCenso interprets Kant as claiming that the idea of God is a useful fiction, he misses important connections between the results of the first Critique, establishing God as a merely possible object, and the results of the second Critique, insisting that the moral agent must be committed to the existence of God. Kant insists that genuine morality demands our speculative ignorance of God's existence. For were we to know of God's existence through theoretical proofs in advance of the moral endeavor, "God and eternity would stand unceasingly before our eyes," making impossible the "conflict which now the moral disposition has to wage with inclinations and in which . . . moral strength of mind may be gradually won" (CPrR, 5:147). In other words, if we knew that God existed and we were absolutely certain that good would be rewarded and evil punished, the possibility of the pure motive of doing the good for its own sake would be compromised. For the possibility of this pure motive demands that in our decision to act in accordance with the good we risk both our existence and ultimate happiness. This risk is only possible if we are not certain at the outset that the conditions in which we act will ultimately uphold our moral action and the possibility of our final happiness. On the other hand, the staking of the whole of our existence on the good, made possible by this initial uncertainly, leads us to hope that God indeed exists. This affirmation of the existence of God in hope follows, and does not precede, the moral endeavor.

For Kant the possibility of autonomous action and genuine religion hinges, not on taking the idea of God as a mere useful fiction, but rather in place of the affirmation of the existence of God in the moral life. If we begin with the idea of God, and then attempt to derive morality from it, we either proceed in a circle (where God is already conceived of in moral terms) or, failing this, are left only with the ideas of terrifying divine power and might. In an important passage in the Groundwork, Kant notes that the ontological concept of God as a perfect being "cannot avoid covertly presupposing the morality it ought to explain" and is for this reason unsuitable as an explanatory ground of morality. However, if we do not resort to such a "crude circle in explanation" but yet insist on deriving our ethics from our theology, what results is an understanding of the divine will in which the "attributes for glory and domination, bound up with frightful representations of power and vengeance" ground a system of morals "directly opposed to morality" (G, 4:443). The upshot of this is that we cannot expect religion, or indeed anything else lying outside pure practical reason, to be our initial compass in our moral endeavors. Instead, the moral law within must be our guide. In the second Critique Kant argues that it is only after the individual has committed herself to action in accordance with the moral law that she is in position to have faith in the existence of God. Only when this order is preserved can the dangers that religion poses to morality be successfully avoided, for first, here morality is not derived from religion, and second, here faith follows on a moral commitment that itself defines the contours of the God whose existence is hoped for.

DiCenso comments on this important passage from the Groundwork, using it to demonstrate Kant's awareness of how theological voluntarism impedes genuine morality and "diverts us from practical reasoning to heteronomous reference points" (172). If, through such a voluntarism, our moral system is corrupted at its root through the idea that we must slavishly obey a divine might in virtue of its awesome power, it is then all too easy to subjugate populations through an ideology based on a servile obedience to authority. Moreover, such a system does nothing to undergird the worth of all persons as ends in themselves and the consequent demand that their finite perspectives and interests be taken into account. Yet while DiCenso rightly points to this dimension of Kant's thought, he also argues that it demonstrates Kant's argument against "an objectified God-image, augmented by the authority of ecclesiastical institutions" (172). But the problem Kant grapples with in this passage is not that of the objectification of God, but rather the derivation of morality from theological concepts and the consequent resulting heteronomy. To the degree that DiCenso's analysis fails to highlight this important problem, it falls short of a faithful exposition of Kant's thought. Furthermore, once Kant's argument is recognized for what it is, the way is open for a moral faith that banks on the existence of God.

What Can It Mean to Have Faith in God's Existence?

Given the critical philosophy, what can it mean to believe in the existence of God? After all, as supersensible, God is not an object of possible experience. DiCenso stresses that a focus on the existence of supersensible objects can too easily distract us from ethical and autonomous action in this world, namely the empowering of others through the reformation of social and political contexts. Instead, religion can lead to the projection of all value and the hope of happiness to otherworldly contexts, debilitating focus and strength from what needs to be done in the here and now. DiCenso claims that for Kant, "To function in support of practical reason, ideas must be liberated from any pretense to ontological claims" (162). Ideas such as God, the soul, and immortality are mere representational aids: "Postulates and other representational aids guide our autonomous ethical practice in this world; they do not divert our focus to some other putative reality" (215). They are cultural fictions focusing the imagination and influencing our ways of thinking: "The idea of grace, as a correlative to the idea of God, is introduced as a widespread culturally formed symbol which can influence our ways of thinking and prioritizing" (240). According to DiCenso, only when existence claims are eliminated can such ideas fulfill their proper regulative function, which is to guide our action in this world: "Ideas of reason are both regulative and constitutive in this sense alone: they provide the rules and guidelines for our autonomous practice according to moral laws, and are directed toward constituting the realm of ends in the phenomenal world" (216).

But why should robbing religious objects of their existence and taking them as mere regulative cultural fictions do the trick of empowering ethical action in the phenomenal realm? Not only are DiCenso's arguments for this claim weak, at best, they also run directly counter to Kant's aims in both the second Critique and his Religion within the Bounds. For Kant clearly held that belief in God's existence must be presupposed as a condition of the furtherance of the highest good; in his Critique of Practical Reason Kant famously claims that "it is morally necessary to assume the existence of God" (CPrR, 5:125). Now Kant's arguments in support of this claim are undoubtedly difficult and contentious, but DiCenso hardly dwells on them at all. DiCenso is no doubt correct to insist that Kant's principal focus is on autonomous ethical action in this world. But Kant also held that the furtherance of this-worldly moral projects involves action into conditions beyond our control. Such actions thereby require an implicit faith that those conditions are not inimical to the moral endeavor. Moreover, the morally reflective agent must hope that those conditions in fact abet it, even if we are totally ignorant as to how. But, Kant argues, these conditions can be assumed to further morality only if we also assume that the world was created in accordance with the idea of a moral author of nature. In other words, moral action requires certain assumptions regarding the world into which we act, and these can only be guaranteed if the world is not "atoms in the void," or mindless matter in motion, but has instead been constituted in accordance with a moral idea.

Kant believed that this way of understanding nature further implied a moral author of it, and that for this reason moral commitment requires faith in the existence of God. In this way, Kant argued, the claim that God exists has direct relevance to what is to be achieved in this life. While God is not an object of possible experience, insofar as God is posited as the rational ground conditioning the moral intelligibility of all existence God's existence has direct relevance to human life. These are key arguments of the Dialectic of Kant's second Critique. They are, unfortunately, ignored by DiCenso, who throughout portrays a Kant for whom God remains a mere regulative idea.

Moral Hope and Religious Symbols

While DiCenso is too quick to dismiss Kant's arguments concerning the relevance of the existence of a moral author of the universe for ethical life, he does important work in developing a theme not often covered in commentaries on Kant's religion: Kant's stress on the need for a moral hermeneutic in interpreting of religious traditions. Given the narrative and symbolic character of much that is found in religion, religions can be interpreted in different ways, either promoting autonomy or furthering heteronomy. Autonomous ways of understanding religion and the function of religious institutions can have an important role in both guiding ethical conduct and furthering a culture advancing just social and political institutions. When religious symbols are interpreted through such a moral hermeneutic, they are especially helpful in the shaping of the moral imagination, key to the proper implementation of moral judgment. On the other hand, if the object of religion is simply that of a divine power and might in the face of which humans are encouraged to remain passive and grovel, this can have only the most deleterious effects on the culture and social and political institutions of a people. DiCenso is correct to point out that when Kant speaks of religious representations and how they are to be handled, he is not "literally embracing dogmatic theological claims." This is a useful corrective to some recent work on Kant's religion going too far in the other direction (for instance, the work of Firestone and Jacobs, which tends to read Kant in terms of a scholastic theology [244, n. 45]).

My own position is that Kant was fully aware that even though morality requires the rational hope that existence is indeed structured in accordance with moral principles, the rational conditions that must be presupposed for this to be the case are quite rudimentary. Religious representations, on the other hand, while legitimately pointing to these conditions, are also quite rich -- they are products of the imagination, and contain much more than these basic forms. It is therefore of the utmost importance that they be interpreted through a moral hermeneutic. DiCenso quite rightly emphasizes Kant's words regarding Scriptural interpretation in the Conflict of the Faculties: "Only a moral interpretation, moreover, is really an authentic one -- one that is given by the God within us" (CF, 7:48) (257). As a consequence, a rigorous moral interpretation of religious symbolic forms recognizes them as religious representations; it is thereby tolerant of different religions, for different symbolic systems may in fact point to the same hoped for character of existence undergirding moral action.

In conclusion, while DiCenso bypasses important aspects of Kant's argument regarding moral hope, its structure, and its implications, there is much that is of value in his book. The connections between Kant's writings on religion and their relation to the social and political sphere are important ones, and DiCenso does a nice job of showing how all of Kant's writings can be understood as directed towards these questions. His book will be an excellent resource for those interested in either Kant's work on religion or his social and political thought.