2012.06.11

Donald R. Morrison (ed.)

The Cambridge Companion to Socrates

Donald R. Morrison (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Socrates, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 413pp., $30.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521541039.

Reviewed by Alan Kim, Dartmouth College


Though The Cambridge Companion to Socrates strives for an intellectual portrait of "the first real philosopher", the nature of the man it seeks to accompany gives him as usual the last laugh. It contains fifteen valuable treatments of various Socratic themes: Socrates on politics or religion; his intellectual climate, students and legacy; the Socratic method, self-examination, ignorance, irony, psychology, happiness. For a student desiring a sense of the Stand der Forschung, each essay individually makes a good starting point. Yet as the editor, Donald R. Morrison, says in his Preface, "the deepest problem facing the editor of a general volume is the lack of a single subject-matter. Socrates is essentially contested territory" (xiv). I take it he does not (only) mean that there are competing interpretations of Socrates' thought, but also that there is little agreement on what we are talking about when we talk about "Socrates". While I doubt this is a problem for editors of general volumes generally, it is in this case an insoluble one, closely connected to the "Socratic problem" Louis-André Dorion tries so forcefully to exorcise. Perhaps inevitably and even fittingly, this volume never brings Socrates into clear focus. He remains our spectral ancestor.

The essays fall into two groups: one on the historical context of the historical Socrates (e.g., Chs. 2, 5, 7, 15, and to some extent 3 and 4); and one on the philosophy of Socrates himself (6, 8-14). Since relatively plentiful external evidence exists for the former, it rests on more solid ground. Socrates having written nothing, however, we have no direct evidence regarding his views or teachings. Thus, those writing on his philosophy claim neutrality on the Socratic problem, or say that "Socrates" names the figure of Socrates in Plato's dialogues. Only three or four of these essays are about Socrates (though not his "philosophy"), while the rest do concern philosophy, but that of a fictionalized thinker named "Socrates". Morrison's response to Socrates' elusiveness is to let his contributors "define the Socrates who is the subject of their individual chapters differently" (xiv). As a result, the essays vary in usefulness to the non-specialist for whom Cambridge Companions are intended, though the specialist will find groundbreaking technical work on Plato's Socrates.

The quality of the writing is uneven. Melissa Lane's and Charles Griswold's essays are models of brevity and clarity. By contrast, Terry Penner's and Christopher Bobonich's chapters, though compelling, are too long and technical for the inexpert, just as the chapters by Dorion and Klaus Döring[1] are intimidatingly philological, at least as opening essays. Unlike, say, The Cambridge Companion to Aristotle, this book lacks an introductory survey of the main ideas associated with the name "Socrates", of Socrates' position in ancient thought generally, or his importance for modern thinkers such as Montaigne, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, or even Gandhi (who rendered the Apology in Gujarati). Such an orientation would have been helpful for those meeting this enigmatic figure for the first time.

In this review, I focus on some of the most challenging contributions, by Dorion, Josiah Ober, Richard Bett, Penner and Bobonich. In light of the insuperable problems of reconstructing Socrates' thought, Dorion demarcates a future hermeneutics more sensitive to the fictional and inter-textual dimensions of Socratic literature. Ober's essay makes important contributions to our understanding of the historical context of Socrates' trial, but also in my view shows the danger historicism poses to the interpretation of Plato's necessarily anachronistic (or timeless) idealism. Bett's nuanced treatment of the central problem of Socratic ignorance reveals the difficulty simply in establishing what (Plato's) Socrates said, not to mention what he meant. Finally, Penner's and Bobonich's chapters are perhaps the most dense and difficult in this rich volume, and deal with the central Socratic question of how to be happy.

* * * * * * *

The decision to place Dorion's piece on "The Rise and Fall of the Socratic Problem" at the head of the Companion -- not to mention the thesis of the chapter itself -- haunts the entire collection, for the "Socratic problem" is this: how "to reconstruct the philosophical doctrines of the historical Socrates" -- just what one may expect to find in a "Companion to Socrates" (1). Dorion gives an excellent discussion of the historical roots of the problem in Schleiermacher, who holds that Xenophon not only was unqualified to render Socrates' thought philosophically, but also that he sanitized him: Xenophon's Socrates is so bland and banal that there must have been more to the man. Thus we are forced to turn to Plato, but only insofar as he harmonizes with Xenophon's description of Socrates' character and practical advice (4). Dorion's immanent critique of this "method" notwithstanding, Schleiermacher's denigration of Xenophon led over the course of the nineteenth century to the "full rejection of Xenophon's account" and the consensus that "the historical Socrates completely correspond[s] to Plato's Socrates" (5). Though this view is now considered extreme, "twentieth-century scholarship has . . . endorsed [it] by ostracizing Xenophon's Socrates and by deeming Plato's Socrates the only one worthy of any interest" (5) (as many chapters of this book evidence).

But the rejection of Xenophon did not solve the Socratic Problem, due to disagreement over the reliability of our three other sources: Aristophanes, Plato, and Aristotle. While Aristophanes was set aside for obvious reasons[2], Plato's dialogues proved too diverse to support a consensus. The issue was crystallized in Karl Joël's discovery of the "fictional nature of the logoi sôkratikoi" (7).[3] According to Dorion, the Socratic Problem rests on the false assumption that Xenophon and Plato intended to give a faithful portrait of Socrates' ideas, when in fact the Sôkratikos logos as a literary genre allowed for "a certain degree of fiction and a great freedom of invention" (7). Hence, though the logoi might preserve an "incidentally" authentic trait, "it would certainly be more prudent to renounce any hope of finding the 'true' Socrates in these writings" (8-9).

The Sôkratikoi logoi were sites of contestation from the first generation of "Socratics" onwards. This has two hermeneutical consequences: first, no one interpretation may be favored, for what would the historical basis for such preference be? Second, any attempt to harmonize the various logoi turns out to be impossible or superficial. Impossible: there are insoluble contradictions between Plato and Xenophon, e.g., the fact that Xenophon's Socrates "hardly ever practices the elenchus, never acknowledges his ignorance regarding the most important questions, and in contrast to Plato's Socrates, never identifies a philosophical mission" (9-10); superficial: apparent agreement may "mask more fundamental discrepancies" (10). Nevertheless, Dorion criticizes Joël's hope that Aristotle's account of Socrates -- because it is not aSôkratikos logos -- might be used to solve the problem, for that account is neither objective nor disinterested, has an "extremely narrow scope", and is silent on thedaimonionenkrateia, piety, elenchus, political engagement, the gnôthi seauton, and the lex talionis (11).

So what remains? What can we believe about Socrates? Dorion offers two things: (a) facts about Socrates' biography and appearance; (b) a strong likelihood that the common themes in Xenophon and Plato represent Socratic themes, despite the fact that we cannot reconstruct the arguments for the positions we may attribute to him. Dorion's essay takes a puzzling turn here. In speaking of Eugène Dupréel and Olaf Gigon's rejection of the Socratic problem, he praises the latter's work as a "stimulating illustration of another type of research into Socrates and the Socratic tradition" (12). Since Socratic literature "always involves an irreducible element of fiction, invention, and creativity (Dichtung [if not Erdichtung]), then it must be studied in and of itself as such" (12). This seems not only an attractive idea but also our only option. Yet now Dorion says: "In other words, we should be attentive to the variations that we can find among the different versions of a single Socratic theme in order to throw light on the significance and the scope of the variations [for] the philosophy and the representation of Socrates" (12). Is this then what Joël, Dupréel, and Gigon recommend -- a kind of eidetic variation on Socratic themes leading to an intuition of "the philosophy of Socrates"? How does that differ from Schleiermacher's method that Dorion earlier criticized? Schleiermacher tried to isolate the Socratic essence by testing Plato's texts on a Xenophontic touchstone. The point of Joël's insight into the Sôkratikoi logoi is that both of these fictional accounts are inappropriate bases for historical reconstructions -- so how could they now be used, as Dorion seems to wish, to throw light "on the philosophy of Socrates"? He seems still to grasp at a straw of Socratic truth, which he previously prudently rejected. In his last section on the future of Socratic studies, Dorion seems to correct himself, saying that a comparative approach freed from the hobble of the Socratic problem, will (merely) "enrich our understanding of thereception of Socratism" (19; emphasis added; cf. 20).

The unclarity in Dorion's view is the more mystifying in view of the rest of his essay, a powerful critique of Gregory Vlastos and Charles Kahn, both of whom, while accepting the fictional nature of the Sôkratikoi logoi, nevertheless try to salvage something of the real Socrates. Yet, as Dorion shows, Vlastos "grossly overestimated the agreement between Xenophon and Plato" on which he pinned his hopes, while Kahn illegitimately holds the Apology exempt from the otherwise acknowledged fictionalism. Dorion's essay is a useful précis of the leading edge of Socratic hermeneutics: reject the illusory idea of "the philosophy of a noumenal Socrates" altogether, and instead organize interpretation around the "diffracted" phenomenon of a Socratic theme. Since Morrison himself seems to agree (cf. 20), it is strange how Dorion's fundamental critique is largely ignored in the rest of the volume.

* * * * * * *

Ober's "Socrates and Democratic Athens" is the main historical contribution, addressing a host of questions surrounding his trial and execution. Why was he charged and convicted? Was he guilty? Why didn't he leave, and where did his loyalties lie? "Most pressing: how did a democratic community, committed to . . . free speech and public debate, come to convict and execute its most famous philosopher-citizen?" (138). It opens with a valuable "Legal Narrative" on relevant law and procedure, making the key point that there was no "strong normative consensus" regarding the substance of "impiety" -- one of the charges leveled against Socrates (140). Hence, the question whether Socrates was "actually guilty" of impiety is "unanswerable" (141). The philosophically tempting question would be why the Athenians thought it "better to condemn" him, as Socrates puts it at Phaedo 98e, yet Ober is scrupulous about what can and cannot be asserted about Socrates and his trial, despite this event being "the best-documented" in his life (138). He therefore merely asks: "'How and why did the early Socratic tradition seek to prove Socrates innocent -- in respect to absolute justice and in the eyes of a "reasonable" Athenian judge?'" (141). Ober admits that the actual arguments of the trial are an "interpretive dead end" (142), and that one can only "guess" at "Meletus's rhetorical exposition" (143) and try to reconstruct the "legal and historical" context of the trial (144). I want to stress the implications of Ober's hermeneutical modesty for the Companion as a whole: although Socrates' trial and execution are the events in his life about which we are best informed, we are even here condemned to guesswork. There is nothing solid upon which to base any reconstructions of Socrates' defense, not to mention his "philosophy".

Turning to the social, cultural, political and legal contexts, Ober argues that the Crito shows that the consideration of harm to the laws is decisive for Socrates (148). Given the trial's legality and observance of "due process", as well as the absence of any official avenue of appeal or redress, escape would "constitute a substantive harm to the edifice of Athenian law" (148-9). There are, however, two difficulties in describing Socrates' deliberations as involving a "weigh[ing] [of] the assumed injustice of the conviction against the potential harm [of escape] to the polis's laws" (149; emphasis in original): first, it is not clear that Socrates in fact considers the conviction unjust; second, he does not "weigh" harm against harm. Rather, he deduces from first principles the practical conclusion that escape would be wrong, and this deduction holds irrespective of the conviction's "wrongness".[4]

Again, in Ober's treatment of the "Personification of the Laws of Athens", he correctly indicates that the "law of Athens" is "as [Socrates] himself has come to understand it" (149). I would not call these laws "imagined", as Ober does, but rather "idealized". Though the relationship between law and citizen described in the Personification to some extent really obtained in Athens (perhaps more than anywhere else), what Socrates describes is an ideal relation of law to citizen, one in which the citizen's duty to obey flows from his freedom to legislate the law to himself, a form of autonomy politically founded in the institutions of "persuasion". Ober by contrast emphasizes the "unequal social positions" of law and citizen (149-50; cf. Cr. 50e), suggesting that it is this asymmetry that underlies the impermissibility of the "retaliatory" act of escaping from prison, rather than any "pure" practical reasoning (150). He also gives an interesting account of the conception of the laws as paternalistic "masters" such that "the citizen is quite literally a product of the laws" (150). Because the citizen is the slave of and even made by the laws, he owes them three things: obedience (151-2); civic participation (152); and contribution of individual excellence (152-3). Ober's social-historical account of these obligations is fascinating, but he misses and omits a crucial dimension of the laws' constitution of the citizen, namely the "persuade or obey doctrine [POD]" laid down by the laws at, e.g., Cr. 51b. This dialectical component is the cornerstone of true political autonomy which, of course, was only inadequately realized in Athens, but which is nevertheless the principle behind Socrates' decision to remain in prison. We owe the state our obedience not because the laws are our "masters" or "super-parents". Indeed, it is just this paternalism that is crucially modified by the POD; moreover, we always have the option in principle of running away from these masters (cf. Ober, 157). Rather, we must obey because this is what we have agreed to; retaliation is unacceptable because we implicitly prohibited ourselves from retaliating, viz., by having agreed to the absolute sovereignty of the good (Cr. 48b).

I fear that the social-political context described here by Ober serves as much to obscure as to clarify. For instance, his discussion of Athens' military obligations leads him to the strange view of Socrates' execution as self-sacrifice akin to a soldier's death in battle. If his death were to be compared to a soldier's at all, it would be by friendly fire -- the result of a mistake, not the considered judgment of the state (as opposed to vindictive and ignorant judges). Again, despite the interest of what Ober calls the citizen's "payment schedule for goods received" (151), and aside from its questionable relevance[5], the "contractual" view assumed here is fundamentally inapposite to the Crito's argumentation. Further, Ober's oversight of the ideal status of the (Athenian) Laws in the Personification obscures the nature of the "common ground" inhabited by Socrates and Athens (158): Socrates always acted as if he were living in an ideal polis, one resting entirely on a rational (dialectically justifiable) basis; thus he was "in line" with the idealized laws, for these are the rational counterparts on the political level of his own principles at the moral level. In a deep sense, therefore, the compatibility of Socrates' actions with the actual statutes is incidental or irrelevant. Short of Athens having been entirely lawless, Socrates' autonomous adherence to ideal laws was bound to involve obeying actual Athenian law. Even if no other polis proved better, his abidance still in no way implies Socrates' full satisfaction with the Athenian system, or that he would not have seen it as falling short of the ideal community of virtue towards which he was incessantly trying to prod it.

In the remaining sections, Ober sometimes slips into the extractive hermeneutics of which he first seemed wary, concluding from the fictional (Platonic) to the historical Socrates. Still, the argument is interesting: while Socrates acknowledged having certain civic duties the fulfillment of which he owed the state, he gave this debt an unconventional interpretation (163), namely playing the role of "critic of the status quo" (164; cf. n.49). On Ober's view, the apparently contradictory aspects of Socrates' role and personality were not as such the cause of his downfall. On the contrary, he "fit within an Athenian culture based on a capacity among the citizenry to embrace contradictions" (166). Therefore, Ober turns to the events of 399 that finally "tipped the balance" between Socrates' "peculiarities of behavior and expression" and his "sincere and convincing self-portrayal as an obedient and participatory citizen" (167).

In his account of Athenian politics following the 404 surrender to Sparta, Ober productively speculates on how Socrates' apparent nonchalance towards the Thirty might have provoked anger in those who had risked their lives to overthrow the oligarchy (169-70) -- an anger "blocked by the Amnesty from employing the law as its legitimate instrument" of revenge.[6] He conjectures that to bypass the Amnesty's prohibition of prosecuting on account of oligarchic connections, Meletus chose impiety as his complaint rather than, say, being "Critias's putative teacher" (170). Because Socrates had committed no obvious acts of impiety, Meletus "expand[ed] the ordinary legal horizon of impiety" to include "failing to recognize the gods recognized by the polis and introducing new gods" (170). This strategy was risky, given the novelty of his interpretation of the law, so Meletus must have "counted on political factors to tilt the decision in his favor", specifically the "'high politics' of normative conceptions of public duty and accountability" (171). In light of his politically suspect associations, Socrates' failure to moderate his speech after the Thirty's fall may have seemed dangerously hypocritical (172-3), appearing to deny any responsibility for the sins of his followers (173).[7] Thus, Meletus in 399 exploited a low point in Athenian toleration at the end of decades of war and faction and at the beginning of "a costly and uncertain rebuilding period" (173).

Ober asks why Socrates chose to mount a defense rather than simply leaving Athens, which he acknowledges in the Crito as having been an option before the trial. It was because "Socrates believed that it was his civic duty to seek to educate (by stinging awake) his fellows -- and especially his fellow Athenian citizens" (174). While certainly plausible, this speculation is the kind of extrapolation from Platonic text to historical reality that Ober promised to avoid. The concluding section, "Why Socrates Lived in Athens", makes the important point that Athens' legal system "allowed him to live as a philosopher and as an obedient citizen", a system which, Ober acutely observes, allowed "for debate over morally relevant terms" "like a Socratic dialectical conversation" -- and thus, I would add, for progress towards the ideal political community.

* * * * * * *

"Socratic Ignorance", by Bett, is thematically connected with Christopher Rowe and Hugh Benson's essays, a point implied by the editor's grouping, but one that could have usefully been made explicit, for example through overarching section headings. Thus, the Socratic method (Benson) aims to relieve ignorance (Bett) and achieve (or pave the way for) self-knowledge (Rowe), whereas Socratic ignorance seems to have a methodical role and to be an example of Socratic self-knowledge. Bett asks four questions regarding Socrates' profession of ignorance: 1) What does Socrates take himself to be ignorant of? 2) Conversely: of what does he take himself to have knowledge? 3) What does it mean for Socrates to profess ignorance, and what conception of knowledge is he presupposing? 4) Is he sad about being ignorant, or does ignorance have a silver lining, despite falling short of bliss? Bett restricts his discussion to "the character Socrates as portrayed in a certain subsection of Plato's dialogues" (215), marked by an "ignorance of ethical matters" (216).[8]

Bett begins with the Apology, in which Socrates says, "he is well aware of not being at all wise [sophos]" (21b4-5) -- and not (as is often thought) that "he knows he knows nothing". This is an important clarification, but Bett himself seems to err in his presentation of the motive of this statement, viz., "the oracle proclaiming him the wisest person of all" (219). The oracle does not "proclaim" him the wisest or anything else. It was asked by Chaerephon: "Is any man wiser than [Socrates]?", and answered simply: "No one is wiser" (Ap. 21ab).[9] It is Socrates who then misinterprets the oracle to have ascribed positive wisdom to him. He sets out, consequently, torefute (elegxônAp. 21c1) the god, and finds, as he suspected, that the god was not lying (cf. Ap. 21b6; 22ab). Since Bett misreads the oracle's statement (i.e., as "Socrates is the wisest") he also misconstrues the sense in which Socrates finds the oracle to have been correct: Socrates discovers through serial refutation of reputed experts that there is no one wiser than he, which is entirely in accord with his being "not wise at all". Bett, by contrast, thinks that Socrates discovers a sense in which he is positivelywise or "wisest" (as opposed to there merely being none wiser than he), to wit, in having the "human wisdom" mentioned at Ap. 20d8. What does Bett think this human wisdom consists in? It is somewhat unclear, as he here mixes and matches statements from Ap. 21d and 23b, saying:

Now, this lesser, "human" wisdom is said to consist not in knowing nothing else [?] at all, but in knowing nothing valuable . . . and in seeing that one is "worth nothing". . . when it comes to wisdom. (219)

Here is what Socrates actually says, unbroken:

I am wiser [sophôteros] than this man; it is likely that neither of us knows anything fine and good [= "valuable"; kalon k'agathon], but he thinks [oietai] he knows when he does not know, whereas I, when I do not know, neither do I think [sunoida] I know; so I am likely to be wiser than he to this small extent, that I do not think I know when I do not know. (Ap. 21d; emphasis added)

Two points: first, Socrates is not making any claim to knowledge of anything, valuable or not: his claim to "wisdom" is entirely negative, namely not thinking or taking himself to know (anything, valuable or not) when he does not. Second, this is a very "ironic" wisdom that Socrates attributes to himself. It not only has no "valuable" content, it has no substance whatever. It is but a refraining from thinking that he knows. It is true that Socrates speaks of his being positively "wiser" here. Yet, either he means this to be heard in scare quotes;[10] or, more likely, he is still at this point in his attempted elenchus of the oracle under the false impression that it had attributed some positive wisdom to him; or, likeliest of all, we should read this "being wiser" as analogous to the condition of the prisoner at the second level of the cave, that is, one who has been shown that what he thought he knew was nothing, or nothing but shadows, and who, in seeing the statuettes whose shadows he had taken for reality, nevertheless has no positive knowledge such as he might gain at the earliest upon emerging from the cave.

In short, Socrates' "wisdom" consists not in recognizing that such positive knowledge as he may have (and which he nowhere suggests he does have) is worthless, and thattherefore he is himself worthless when it comes to wisdom (219; Ap. 23b3), but rather simply in abstaining from thinking he knows what he does not know. This "wisdom" is, however, in its turn only an "ironic" wisdom, for it is insubstantial, about nothing even as "fine" as that which the craftsmen possess: hence this "wisdom" of Socrates is called "worthless" (Ap. 23b). It is the "empty" awareness of the "emptiness" of his soul with regard to knowledge. Only to "this small extent" does Socrates say he was "wiser" (Ap. 21d). For this reason, I think Bett's postulation of two Socratic "categories of knowledge" (i.e., between a human wisdom that he has, and a "more exalted wisdom" that he lacks) is likely to be a false start, and that the question of Socratic ignorance is not "whether we can find a clear way of drawing the distinction that [Socrates] seems to permit" (219).

Bett's investigation into this alleged distinction leads to further misreadings. For example, he writes that while the craftsmen possess genuine knowledge of "polla kai kala[many fine things]" (Ap. 22d2), "it is clearly not included within the type of knowledge that [Socrates] considers truly valuable" (219). Why? According to Bett, because "their possession of [it] is outweighed, in his opinion, by their ignorance (but pretension to knowledge) about other things of the greatest importance" (219). But why should being outweighed by their ignorance in other "most important pursuits" affect the value of the wisdom they do have? This is not Socrates' criticism of the craftsmen. Rather, like the poets, they overstep the bounds of their genuine knowledge, whereas Socrates' "wisdom" consists precisely in the clear recognition of his radical limitations. Thus, when Bett writes that "on balance [Socrates] takes himself to be wiser than [the craftsmen] are", he again misconstrues the text: Socrates not only explicitly says of the craftsmen that they are positively "wiser" than he (they possess crafts), but also that he is nevertheless better off, (not wiser) "with neither their wisdom nor their ignorance" (Ap. 22e; emphasis added). In other words, Socrates here confirms the point I made above, that his wisdom is ironic, not positive -- is but the consciousness of his limitations regarding wisdom. He is merely free of that "most blameworthy ignorance [of] believ[ing] that one knows what one does not know" (Ap. 29b; emphasis added).

Due to constraints of space, I cannot offer a detailed account of the rest of Bett's chapter. His general view that the sort of wisdom Socrates considers especially valuable is "knowledge of the nature of the virtues" is uncontroversial, and his discussion of the value of knowing the definitions of the virtues and of thereby gaining a "systematic understanding of the ethical realm" (224) will be of use and interest to the student (222ff.). Nevertheless, Bett often descends into dense technical language that may frustrate some readers (e.g., 223-5; all of Section 3, 225ff.).

* * * * * * *

Penner's essay, "Socratic Ethics and the Socratic Psychology of Action: A Philosophical Framework", is not written for the novice, staking out an unorthodox position that it would be very speculative to attribute to the historical Socrates.[11] It is bracing and compelling, but also hard to read, with obscure allusions and asides[12], and could have benefited from section headings (Penner asks us to count paragraphs [282, n. 37]). He nowhere states simply the view he wants to defend and how it differs from orthodoxy. In what follows, I attempt to reconstruct the argument.

Socrates, Plato, and Aristotle all believe "every deliberate action is generated by a desire for a single final end", happiness (260; emphasis added). Socrates, moreover, holds that "all motivated actions whatever are deliberate actions", i.e., generated by the desire for the telos of happiness (261; emphasis added). So, schematically (260-2):

1) The end (telos) of all desire is happiness (eudaimonia).

2) Socrates, unlike Plato and Aristotle[13], holds that all motivated actions are deliberate actions, i.e., actions generated by the desire for happiness.

3) Therefore, Penner calls Socrates' "psychology of action" a "belief/desire theory": every motivated action is determined "by the mutual interaction of two elements", viz.:

a) the desire for good/happiness, which leads to "the 'whatever' desire", i.e., for whatever particular action turns out best for promoting happiness generally;

b) a belief regarding what particular action will in fact achieve this. This belief is synthesized from one's "current beliefs and perceptions" about "that final end, . . . the courses of action available, and . . . what kinds of things are means to what" (261-2).

4) One settles on a course as the best one under the circumstances, and does what one can in each case to achieve maximal practicable happiness (cf. 264-5).

In practice, then, given the initial general desire, the agent arrives at a belief regarding the best course of action here and now, at which point this particular belief is "integrate[d] . . . into the 'whatever' desire", giving it a concrete direction; the generalized desire now becomes an "'executive desire'" which "brings about the action 'straightaway'"; it is always possible that a change in belief may occur at the phase of belief-integration, redirecting desire (262).[14]

Thus Penner gives a top-down theory of rational desire: all desire is ultimately for what is good for the agent all things considered; a particular desire is only "generated" by the "integration" of beliefs about what is for the best here and now, on the one hand, with that general "whatever" desire, on the other hand. Contrast this theory with a view that desires for food or drink or sex are autonomic, confronting reason and the rational desire for the good as independent and often countervailing factors. This raises a problem, viz., how to deal with run-of-the-mill desires, like that for drink. On the top-down theory, it seems, I "generate" a desire for drink by integrating into my whatever desire for the good the belief that there is a need for hydration as well as the convenient presence of water (263). Only now do I actually "have" a "particular desire" for drink. But Penner admits, "the desire for drink does occur"; what he denies is that it -- rather than the integrated "rational" desire -- motivates action directly. Instead, it merely "presents itself to our desire for happiness", and this general desire in turn consults "the belief-system to produce an estimate of the possible gains from various choices for fulfilling this [brute?] desire" (263). So the picture has been complicated. Not only is there a general whatever desire or "rational" desire for the good, and a belief-set that determines this desire; there is also a "brute" desire arising spontaneously that seems to spark the process of determining an action (or abstention).

For Penner (264-5), the statement, "everyone desires the good (happiness)", means that each desires it in each case for himself, and only insofar as it is practicable under his circumstances. In this light, then, the Socratic dictum "Virtue is knowledge" means not that knowledge or wisdom is good as a final end as "Virtue", but rather that it is good ("virtuous") as a means towards the end that is happiness, i.e., the good with respect to which "no one willingly errs" (266). Does this imply that this virtue, which is knowledge or wisdom, is "an egoistic science", the science of what is good for "me" in each case? No: science is perfectly general, and the Socratically wise person can "see what is good for your happiness quite as well as what is good for his own" (268); it is only the Socratic desire -- my desire for my (participation in) happiness -- that is "egocentric" and particular (267-8).

Penner now asks, "if the final end is happiness . . . -- and not wisdom -- how is it that virtue, or human excellence, is wisdom, rather than being happy?" (268). Why is the means rather than the end of human life and action held up as human excellence? Why is it not happiness rather than virtue that Socrates calls the only thing "good in itself" (268)? Penner introduces a distinction: the human good is not the same as human "good-ness"; virtue is human goodness, whereas happiness is the human good. Virtue or excellence is being superlatively good at accomplishing the good, i.e., the end of this or that science or technê: being an excellent football player (football-virtue) is not the good of the football player; his good is victory. But he is a good (excellent, virtuous) football player insofar as he is good at securing victory, his good. Thus, "virtue is knowledge" means: in attaining the human good or goal -- happiness -- excellence is (the) wisdom of how to do this: wisdom "is the only thing good in itself as a means to happiness" (271; emphasis added). Why? Because only by wisdom can we get right the aforementioned belief-structure necessary for judging the best course of action available (271). On Penner's view then, the human good is happiness, and virtue is the science or "wisdom" of attaining that good: it is being-good-at gaining happiness, and he who is good at achieving (practicable) happiness is wise, for he just has the appropriate (true) belief-structure about what will lead to the best achievable outcome here and now. This wisdom is no different from the skill of a cobbler or quarterback. The excellent cobbler and quarterback each know how to read the given material or situation so as to take the appropriate action -- not for attaining excellence -- but for realizing a pair of shoes or victory. Where cobbling and quarterbacking are the sciences (the how-to) of shoemaking and point-scoring, ethics is the science (the how-to) of human happiness.

Penner goes on to address objections to his novel interpretation as well as to give a convincing defense of the Socratic-Platonic view that all agents desire their real, not apparent, good; I must skip over these to his interesting conclusions. First, since a) the desire for the (my) good holds in every motivated action like "a law of [human] nature", and b) my beliefs at any moment are also determined (i.e., given), it follows c) that "at any given moment one could neither have desired otherwise, nor believed otherwise than one did", and so one could not "have done otherwise than he or she actually did" (288-9). Second, since the difference between good and evil-doing people cannot lie in their desire (for the good), it can "reside solely in [their] beliefs" (289). Thus, getting one's beliefs in order is paramount not just to "being good", but toattaining the good, not just for being virtuous, but also for becoming happy.[15] This rectification of beliefs is only possible through dialogue, i.e., mutual dialectical examination. From this Penner deduces Socrates' reason for thinking that harming others is to harm oneself, for all harm involves deception, which in turn means cutting oneself off from (dialectical) community with others, and so from good advice and truth. It is the truth as reflected in my beliefs that matters above all: what action in factwill lead to maximal possible happiness for me here and now? This exhausts Socratic ethics, leaving no room for any "evaluative, normative, moral, or conventional elements, [any] further Kantian principles . . . [or] further 'intrinsic goods'" (291). While I sympathize with Penner's point, this conclusion seems too strong.

The problem is this. For all his insistence that happiness is the end of all desire, Penner nowhere gives eudaimonia an interpretation, treating it as something self-evident. Now Socrates does claim always only to do what he believes best (Cr. 46b), where "best" may well mean: "conducive to happiness". Yet "happiness" here means living well (Cr. 48b); and Socrates gives "living well" a clear interpretation, viz., living finely and justly (Cr. 48b). In other words, happiness -- eudaimoniaeu zên -- essentially involves (is in fact no different from) justice and fineness (to kalon), and these are certainly "evaluative and normative . . . elements". This interpretation would seem to raise a great difficulty for Penner's construal of the relation of virtue and happiness as one of means and end; the Crito passage suggests that virtue is constitutive of happiness, not just enabling of it.

* * * * * * *

In his diffuse chapter, "Socrates and Eudaimonia", Bobonich examines four issues: (1) the idea of eudaimonia in Socrates' thought, (2) its place in his views of how to live and act, (3) its content, (4) its relation to virtue and knowledge. A fifth goal mentioned later is to argue that there are "gaps and tensions" in Socrates' views on happiness and virtue, which Plato's "middle dialogues . . . try to resolve" (297). Thus Bobonich's chapter complements Penner's, though where the latter explains the interaction of desire and belief in the pursuit of the human good, happiness, and defines virtue (wisdom) as the means to this end, Bobonich reverses direction, beginning with happiness and moving backwards (from (1) to (4)). Bobonich confines his discussion to Plato's Socrates, remaining neutral on the Socratic problem.

In the "Preliminaries", Bobonich sketches the historical background of eudaimonia in Greek culture, from which he extracts two main features: a) happiness is well-being, the best life for a person, all things considered -- it is not pleasure; b) given the fact of purposes in human life, happiness is its "most important or even sole, end" (296). Bobonich points out that this could be read either empirically as stating a fact about human psychology, or normatively -- readings that correspond to two theses often attributed to Socrates. The first, the "Principle of Rational Eudaimonism [ER]" states: it is rationally required that happiness ought to be the decisive consideration in all of a person's actions; the second, the "Principle of Psychological Eudaimonism [EΨ]" states: as a matter of fact, everyone gives his own happiness decisive weight in all his actions (296). Note that ER differs from Penner's thesis; according to ER it is rational or wise to make happiness the ultimate goal in light of which I should in every case act, whereas Penner says we always already do just that by a "law of nature" (EΨ?)[16], and "wisdom" is simply the means of achieving this natural goal.[17]

In Section 3, Bobonich discusses ER and EΨ in detail, beginning with a defense of the old consensus that the early dialogues espouse both principles. He finds in the Critoand Apology no evidence of anti-eudaimonism (e.g., at Ap. 28b6-c1; Cr. 49a4-b7), but to the contrary consistency if not coincidence between virtuous action and happiness (299). Moreover, Bobonich shows that in the Apology Socrates' interrogative practice is necessary for the happiness of his fellow citizens and especially for his own happiness (300-1), thus buttressing his main point, that Socrates seems always to justify his actions and way of life by pointing to their conduciveness to happiness -- and this is evidence that he indeed subscribes to ER. Bobonich points to Crito 48b as further evidence of Socrates' commitment to ER, where, as I mentioned earlier in my discussion of Ober and Penner, Socrates says that the good life (eu zên) -- "happiness"[18] -- is the paramount consideration in practical reasoning, and that eu zên is the same as kalôs zên (the fine life) is the same as dikaiôs zên (the just life). Now Bobonich wants Socrates here to mean that because happiness is equivalent to living justly, the happy life is the best life for a human being: for since one ought rationally to pursue the greatest benefit that is justice, then one ought to pursue happiness, given the equivalence of the just and happy life. And this means, he wants to conclude, that Socrates is a Rational Eudaimonist. For the purposes of this review, I will set aside the question of whether this conclusion is right in substance, and argue instead that it does not follow in the way Bobonich claims.

In essence, Bobonich seems to think that the supremacy of the good life follows from implicitly substituting "good life" for "justice" into "the conclusion of an argument designed to show that justice is of the greatest benefit to its possessor (Crito 47a-48b)" (302). And it is true that if Socrates had tried to argue that "justice is of the greatest benefit to its possessor", then "the good life (happiness) [would be] of the greatest benefit to its possessor", and so ought to be pursued. There are two problems with this reading, however. First, it is a stretch to think that Crito 47a-48b is "designed to show" the benefit of justice to the just; instead, the argument clearly aims at persuading Crito that

we should not . . . think so much of what the majority will say about us, but what he will say who understands justice and injustice . . . So that . . . you were wrong to believe that we should care for the opinion of the many about what is just, beautiful, good, and their opposites. (Cr. 48a)

It is true that Socrates suggests that life is not worth living with a corrupted soul -- "that part of us . . . that unjust action harms and just action benefits" (Cr. 47e) -- but he neither says that justice is of the "greatest benefit", nor is he here trying to urge Crito that he ought therefore pursue justice. Crito already wants to pursue justice: it is for this very reason that he is trying to get Socrates to escape (Cr. 45c). This misconstruction both of the passage from 47a-48b, and of its relation to the assertion that the good life is paramount, has two independent, negative consequences for Bobonich's argument. First, since Socrates does not say here that justice is of the greatest benefit to its possessor, it cannot be the case that by substituting "happiness" for "justice" he concludes, "Happiness is of the greatest benefit to the possessor". Rather, the proposition that "the most important thing is not life, but the good life" is a new starting point -- postulated by Socrates and endorsed by Crito -- of a new argument, namely to the conclusion that he ought not attempt an escape. The second negative consequence is that because Crito 47a-48b does not argue that one ought to pursue justice, it is also not the case that by substituting "happiness" for "justice", we get a version of ER, namely that there is a "rational requirement [an ought]" for each person to make "his own (greatest) happiness . . . the decisive consideration for all his actions" (296).

In support of his reading, Bobonich argues: if the good life or "happiness" merely means "the fine life, or the just life", rather than "a life that is best for the one who lives it", then "there would be no point to Socrates' further claim that the good life is the same as the fine and just lives". For "it is this coincidence that allows Socrates to proceed to settle the practical question of what to do in these circumstances by examining what justice requires" (302). I don't fully follow Bobonich here. He seems to mean that Socrates must explicitly equate the just and fine lives with the good life in order to draw the conclusion (by substituting "happiness" for "justice", as explained above) that the good life is the best life "for the one who lives it"; this, I argued above, is incorrect.[19]

If I am right, then what is the point of equating the good, fine, and just lives? Just as Bobonich says: this coincidence allows Socrates to reason practically to the just conclusion, i.e., the just action. As I said above, the proposition that "the most important thing is . . . the good life" is a postulate, its origin lying outside of the Crito itself: Socrates merely says, "it stays the same" (Cr. 48b). The point of equating the just life with the postulated "most important thing" becomes evident shortly as it comes to play an essential role in establishing the absolute prohibition on committing an injustice or wrong, even in return. The same goes for the additional equation of the good life with the fine life, a move that finds no explanation on Bobonich's reading. "Settling the practical question of what to do", as he puts it, requires no commitment to Rational Eudaimonism: Socrates does not act justly and finely because this will make him happy, but because in this way he lives well or excellently -- virtuously -- than which nothing is more important. For this reason he ought always to act justly and finely. That this excellent living might be precisely congruent with living happily is an entirely separate consideration, and plays no part in motivating his actions, at least not as far as we can tell from the passages at issue in the Crito.

Bobonich concludes Section 3 with several arguments for ascribing not only ER, but also EΨ to Socrates. Thus Bobonich has argued strongly (my criticisms of his reading of the Crito notwithstanding) for two dimensions of Socratic eudaimonism. But ER and EΨ are merely "formal theories", so he turns in Section 4 to the issue left unaddressed by Penner, namely "the content of happiness". Though Bobonich illuminates the relation of virtue, goodness, and happiness, his account ends in aporia: virtue is not sufficient, nor necessary, nor identical with happiness, a conundrum indicative of basic flaws and "serious gaps in Socrates' views" (330). It was these alleged flaws that provoked as attempted remedies both Plato's middle-period ethical innovations and later the Stoics' psychology and cosmology (331).



[1] The English translation of Döring's essay, moreover, has numerous errors.

[2] But see David Konstan's Ch. 4, "Socrates in Aristophanes' Clouds".

[3] Morrison prints "sokratikoi"; Ch. 2 (correctly) has "Sôkratikos logos" (24); the volume has numerous typographical and other editorial errors.

[4] My comments in this review regarding the Crito may be further clarified by reference to my essay, "Crito and Critique", OSAP 41 (2011).

[5] Ober admits that it is "impossible to demonstrate that the historical Socrates was committed to the contractual conception of citizen duty . . . [laid] out in the Crito" (156).

[6] Cf. the role of envy in O'Connor's Ch. 3.

[7] Ober here seems to liken Socrates' attitude regarding the teacher's responsibility for his students' actions to the one expressed by Gorgias at G. 456.

[8] Bett's cautious speculation on the legitimacy of attributing this ethical ignorance to the historical Socrates by appealing to similarities between Plato's presentation and a fragment of Aeschines seems unnecessary, and in any case ignores the fictional nature of the Sôkratikoi logoi discussed by Dorion (216).

[9] Griswold correctly describes the oracle episode, p. 342f.

[10] Cf. Melissa Lane, p. 245.

[11] Yet one wonders if an introductory Companion is the place for an "amazing" and "entirely original, if still largely unrecognized" reading (288; 268-9)?

[12] How is his argument advanced by equating Nixon and Hitler (288, n. 53)?

[13] Penner throughout assimilates "Socratic" with "Platonic" ethics, especially in contrast to Aristotle; but if it is Platonic, then why attribute the alleged view to Socrates at all?

[14] Penner goes on to contrast his reconstruction of a Socratic belief/desire theory with modern psychologies of action, in a paragraph (p. 263) illustrative of Penner's frustrating and almost willful elusiveness. The "forty-one other actions" mentioned are "other" in addition to the action (drinking), flowing from the given example of thirst/presence of drink with which we began (for a total of 42). The main point here is to defend the idea that it is ultimately the whatever-desire, suitably determined, that is the ultimate "generator" of an action.

[15] Penner inexplicably asserts that Socrates holds himself to be "the wisest person there is", though knowing nothing important about the good (289-90). He holds no such thing, as I have argued.

[16] Note that despite the difference from Penner described above, ER says, like Penner, that "one's own greatest happiness is the only ultimate reason for action" (301).

[17] It is here that Bobonich introduces a certain organizational confusion; having begun by listing the four goals mentioned above, he now gives a new list of three basic issues, (1´) –(3´); it seems that (1´) = (1), but (3´) = (2) while (2´) = (3) and (4). This double list causes problems, e.g., at p. 299, when he says that "our decision among these options will affect our answer to our second issue -- that is, what is the ultimate criterion on the basis of which people do, or rationally should, pursue things and perform actions"; in point of fact, the "second issue" on neither of the two lists answers to this description, but refers to the second of the two "concerns" raised on pp. 298-9. As in Penner's chapter, Bobonich has a tendency to get overly technical and hard to follow, especially for a student; cf., e.g., p. 316, n. 40, and the introduction of terminology on p. 324. All these problems are ultimately the editor's responsibility, of course.

[18] Cf. p. 302, n.17.

[19] Penner, too, would reject this view since, I think, he would think it absurd to argue for the position that the happy life is best for the one who lives it.