Colin McGinn

The Meaning of Disgust

Colin McGinn, The Meaning of Disgust, Oxford University Press, 2011, 248pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199829538.

Reviewed by Daniel Kelly, Purdue University

Colin McGinn's The Meaning of Disgust numbers among several scholarly books on disgust that have been published in the last couple of years (including, in the interest of full and up front disclosure, one by the writer of this review). McGinn's book argues for a coherent, if incredible, account of the essence of disgustingness and of the emotion of disgust, and reflects on the potential significance of that account for different areas of human concern. It also bears many of the characteristics that readers of McGinn will have come to expect. The overall structure is tidy; the prose is flowery but lucid, though due to the subject matter here, often cloying; and for most part the discussion avoids technical jargon, with a brief discussion of encapsulation (59-60) and persistent use of the term "Sosein" being notable exceptions. These are exciting times for research on disgust, in large part because insightful contributions are being made from researchers whose approaches and disciplinary backgrounds differ, but whose interests have led them to converge on this puzzling emotion. This book barely acknowledges, let alone engages with, most of these contributions, and as a result The Meaning of Disgust is tragically flawed.

The book is divided into two parts. In the first, "The Analysis of Disgust," McGinn sets out his account of disgust, building up to his Death-in-Life theory, which is accompanied by some speculations about the evolution and function of the emotion. The second part, "Disgust and the Human Condition," assumes that account, and uses it to attempt to shed light on a variety of issues. A chapter apiece is devoted to the connection between disgust and the intuitive force of Cartesian dualism, the role disgust can play in various forms of repression, and the ways in which the emotion animates thought about death. The final chapter takes the reader on a whirlwind tour of cursory speculations about how disgust might be involved in aspects of culture ranging from reactions to nudity and the question of why humans wear clothes, to fascination with jewelry and sports, through etiquette, art, humor, society, religion, civilization, and the "Perfectibility of Man" (223).

It will help to understand the goal McGinn sets for himself in the first part of the book and how he goes about trying to achieve it. As his title suggests, he wants to know what disgust means. Ascertaining this is

basically a task of conceptual analysis, though not one that simply takes the word "disgust" and tries to peer into its meaning. Instead, I will survey the class of disgusting things and attempt to work out what brings them together in the emotion they provoke: what properties do disgusting things have that make them produce the emotion of disgust in us? (4, his italics)

He describes his project as an example of "impure philosophy," which he sees as "occupying the same territory as existentialism and psychoanalysis" (vii), and he finds inspiration reading the work of earlier writers in this vein, mainly Kolnai (1929/2003), Becker (1973), Miller (1997) and Menninghaus (2003). In addition to conceptual analysis and scholarship of this sort, McGinn applies the other resources of the armchair, drawing on casual observation, intuition, introspection, and the examination of and reflection on his own experiences of disgust.

The first chapter uses those methods to make a quick case that disgust is its own emotion, distinct from nearby aversive reactions like hate or fear, and concludes with some agenda setting questions:

Why should we be so averse to what is actually not intrinsically harmful to us? . . . We are naturally averse to what might harm us or has wronged us, but what has the disgusting object done to us that could provoke our extreme aversive response to it? (12)

This fixation on the sorts of things that can trigger a disgust response, as opposed to details about the character of the response itself, shapes much of the rest of the book. Elicitors of disgust are the explicit subject matter of the next chapter, which floridly catalogues a wide range of disgusting things, and which McGinn takes to underwrite the claim that the "main theoretical challenge posed by disgust is the great variety of objects that can provoke it" (65). Indeed, his project's "ultimate aim is to produce a theory of what unites the class of disgusting things: what all and only disgusting things have in common" (4). Call this the unity constraint.

McGinn calls the theory he offers to meet this challenge the Death-in-Life theory, which he settles on after considering and rejecting several others. The theory holds that

Disgust occurs in that ambiguous territory between life and death, when both conditions are present in some form: it is not life per se or death per se that disgusts, but their uneasy juxtaposition. The disgusting is "death-life" and "life-death" -- neither one nor the other but both. What disgusts is the interpenetration of life and death, the incongruous joining of the two. (89-90)

This Death-in-Life theory is an amended version of what McGinn calls the Death theory, whose initial formulation he traces to Becker (1973), and whose core idea is that at root disgust expresses deep unease with mortality. It holds that because physical bodies, along with their fluids and byproducts, are unavoidable reminders of impending, inevitable death, they are potent elicitors of disgust. Becker's Death theory, McGinn holds, needs amendment because it is too inclusive; it succeeds in providing a necessary condition for something to be disgusting (connection to death), but fails as a sufficient one. The argument for the later conjunct: skeletons (87-9). Bones are clearly connected to and reminders of death, but they are not, claims McGinn, disgusting. Lacking flesh or fluid, they are pure death, rather than the right mixture of death and life to qualify as genuinely disgusting.

Thus adjusted, the Death-in-Life theory is poised to meet McGinn's main theoretical demand. It satisfies the unity constraint by providing candidate necessary and sufficient conditions for accurate application of the concept of disgusting. If correct, it would vindicate his surprising claim that "there is a 'fact of the matter' about whether an object is really disgusting" (62), and allow us to see that disgustingness is an "objective property, not a subjective or relative property" (61). In short, "in all disgust objects, a process of transition seems essential, where the poles of the transition are life and death" (91) because "what is disgusting is death as presented in the form of living tissue" (90, his italics).

Following the standard operating procedure of conceptual analysis, in the next chapter McGinn tests his Death-in-Life theory against a range of cases, specifically the catalogue of the disgusting compiled in his second chapter. After working through his examples, massaging some to fit the theory and explaining why others only appear to be counterexamples, he declares Mission Accomplished: "the death-in-life theory makes intelligible sense of the data [sic] of disgust. . . . Thus we have discovered the essence of disgusting things. We now know what it is that makes something disgusting." (122, his italics)

Concluding the analysis of disgust is a chapter imparting some thoughts on the evolution and function of the emotion. Identifying such a function is made difficult by the fact that disgust appears to be absent in non-human animals and human infants. McGinn takes this to indicate that "a simple survival-based account of disgust will not work; the emotion cannot be explained by elementary considerations of biological utility. . . . In humans no obvious biological need is served by our disgust reactions" (58). Conviction that disgust is thus a "philosophical" and "advanced" (58) emotion leads McGinn to posit a uniquely human adaptive problem that might have selected for it: infinite and unrestrained desire. "Human desire", we are told, "is apt to have unlimited scope: it is excessive, greedy, uncontrolled" (124). If this was the problem, then the specific emotion of disgust was Mother Nature's solution: "Disgust arose in the species because excessive desire had already arisen and led to unhappy results; we could not contain ourselves by will alone, so the genes (or culture) invented an emotional mechanism to contain us" (126).

In some places he suggests that the problem with human desire isn't just how powerful and intense it can be, but that it can be directed at anything: "Our 'default condition' is overweening, indiscriminate desire: but this is not good for us or other people, so disgust arises to dampen our excesses . . . in the beginning disgust operated to bring appetitive excess to heel" (129, my italics). Elsewhere is the suggestion that the dark heart of the adaptive problem is much more specific. I will let McGinn speak for himself on this:

Humans want lots of sex and lots of food -- and both commodities can be in short supply. In such circumstances, excessive human desire starts to spill over: we start wanting to have sex with more things than fertile human adults, and we will eat anything that seems edible. You can see where I heading with this: early humans started desiring sex with dead bodies and wanting to eat feces. Or maybe it was not shortage that prompted our pre-disgust ancestors but simple greed: they just wanted more and more, with variations and permutations, and weren't too particular about how they got it. At this point in human evolution, then, we are to imagine rampant, untrammeled, indiscriminate desire; with no disgust response in place: free-flowing desire beyond biological necessity, beyond reason, beyond sanity. The early humans were thus tempted to necrophilia and coprophagia (maybe also desiring to eat decayed human flesh), and we may suppose that they gave in to those temptations. . . . Giving into their excessive desires, in the form of sex with dead bodies and eating shit, does not sit well with other aspects of their nature. They feel conflicted, confused, disturbed, unhinged -- yet still driven. Incestuous necrophilia and coprophagia, in particular, produce tempestuous feelings of emotional turmoil in their sordid souls. They feel madness coming on (and isn't giving in to every passing desire a clear sign of madness?) (127-8)

There is no evidence supporting this. Or maybe there is, and the reader is just not directed to it; McGinn offers no guidance on this score. Nor does he situate his hypothesis with respect to work in any part of evolutionary theory, let alone any of the large interdisciplinary literature dealing with the evolution of humans and human cognition. The claim is offered up on the grounds of plausibility, and lack of other options: "The theory [sic] is, of course, highly speculative: I put it forward as worth considering because I know of no other theory of the origin and function of disgust that seems to me even remotely plausible" (131).

But this is not worth considering. For some reason, nowhere does McGinn mention the possibility that disgust evolved to motivate disease avoidance and help protect against infection. This is a fairly prominent idea; it is well known and widely discussed. What it might lack in outrageousness is more than made up for in plausibility, especially when viewed from the evolutionary perspective in force in this discussion. It also has the virtue of being supported by a wide variety of evidence (see Curtis et al. 2011 for an overview of recent work). The failure to even take this alternative into account, or to really engage with any of the recent explosion of empirical work on disgust, is not just negligent but baffling, and it weakens the credibility of any of the claims made in the book.

As noted above, one of the puzzles posed at the outset was the question of why humans should react with aversion, specifically the aversion of disgust, to what is "actually not intrinsically harmful". In light of the adaptive problems posed by infectious diseases, the presumption of the question is misleading, if not simply false. Corpses, feces, rotting organic material, animals like lice and rats, other people with open sores, oozing wounds, or hacking coughs -- all of these typical elicitors of disgust, what McGinn might call paradigmatic examples of disgustingness, and all of them are typical sources of infection. On the fairly innocent assumption that contracting a disease is harmful, then much of what is disgusting is potentially harmful, sometimes fatally so.

This account traces the origins of disgust to something common and humble rather than uniquely human or deeply existential, or but it has potential to dispel confusion. The adaptive challenges associated with disease avoidance are not terribly mysterious. Most bacteria, viruses and other microbial parasites are not directly perceivable by humans. So it should not be surprising that a psychological system whose function was to protect us from the types of diseases they cause would have to be sensitive to something else, some more easily detectible kind of cue. Perceivable properties of the places, substances, critters and phenotypic characteristics that are reliably correlated with the presence of threatening microorganisms make good candidates. It also should not be surprising that such a system would be fallible, but that it would tend to err in the direction of caution, favoring false positives over false negatives, causing people to sometimes experience disgust in all its vivid phenomenological glory, even when they are not, in fact, in danger of infection.

It is hard to know what McGinn would say about any of this, since he does not address it. Perhaps he would consider disease and infection too basic of an evolutionary issue, pointing to the fact that disgust is not found in non-human animals or infants. To this there are relatively straightforward initial responses -- disease avoidance systems have been identified in a wide range of animals, and human infants lack all kinds of psychological capacities that emerge in later stages of develop, and at early stages they are enormously dependent on caregivers rather than their own wherewithal for protection from nearly everything. The dialectic would get tricky after that, and rather than shadowbox with what McGinn might have said, I'll just reiterate the complaint that he didn't say anything.

This shortcoming also leaves the reader left wondering how the disease avoidance account would fit with McGinn's Death-in-Life theory. As noted, the former appears well suited to account for many of what he takes to be paradigmatic examples of disgustingness and can diffuse some of the puzzlement about the kind of threat they pose and what they have in common. Perhaps McGinn would reject it as a competitor to his Death-in-Life theory for being unable to account for everything, and for failing to provide any necessary and sufficient conditions for the concept of disgusting. I would agree that disease avoidance does not reveal the objective essence of disgustingness; but I remain unconvinced there is any such objective essence, or that an account of disgust needs to provide such a thing. This brings us to the unity constraint.

First note that the unity constraint is not argued for; it is presupposed. Based on a general metaphilosophical preference (defended elsewhere in McGinn 2012) it is asserted early in this book as a working hypothesis, a premise on which the project is predicated:

I therefore reject the idea that the class of disgusting things is linked by nothing stronger than family resemblance. . . . In any case, as a methodological precept, we should seek necessary and sufficient conditions first, abandoning that project only if we have to (4, fn. 3).

A reader unsympathetic to the central claims of McGinn's considered view could take the line of thought that yielded them as a reductio ad absurdum argument against the unity constraint itself.

Whatever its virtues as a general principle, the demand for necessary and sufficient conditions for the specific concept of disgusting seems implausible in its own right. A theoretically informed reason you might be skeptical that there must be some feature shared by all and only those things that provoke your disgust response -- above and beyond provoking your disgust response -- is that you are familiar with the way the evolutionary process tinkers, and are alert to the idea that traits like encapsulated psychological systems can be exapted, rendered multifunctional, redeployed to operate in more than one domain, their scope broadened so that they are activated by a range of fundamentally different kinds of properties (Sterelny 2003, Anderson 2007). Identifying those different functions and domains could help show how "the definition of the disgusting" might be a "disjunction" without being a "pointless" one (28). A more mundane reason you might be skeptical that disgustingness is an objective property is that you probably aren't disgusted by all of the same things that even your best friend or significant other is disgusted by. Different people find different things disgusting. Similarly, even casual observation suggests there are interesting patterns of variation in what is typically considered disgusting from one culture to the next. Such disagreement does not immediately undercut claims to objectivity -- there are familiar moves that can be made in response -- but it raises questions. The book's failure to address them or to take seriously the kind of individual or cultural level variation that raises them is another damaging omission.

The Death-in-Life theory was constructed and assessed specifically in light of the unity constraint, which requires that a theory of disgust reveal the commonality in the set of things that are disgusting. At the very least, the existence of variation makes it unclear how to determine what does and doesn't belong in the set in the first place. One might try to separate out the "genuinely" or "properly" disgusting from the rest -- McGinn appears to do something along these lines when he dismisses "moral and intellectual disgust", as "only marginally relevant to developing a general theory of disgust" (38) -- but doing so in a way that is not arbitrary or question begging appears difficult, if possible at all. One might look for clues in different empirical literatures, and attempt to identify cross-cultural universals, common themes, as well as interesting patterns of variations on those themes. Alternatively, one might try to build a case based on similarities and differences in the fine-grained physiological, behavioral and psychological details of different people's disgust responses to different families of elicitors.

It is difficult to see how it could be convincingly done from the armchair alone, especially without running the risk of being hopelessly parochial. It is also difficult to understand why, in the midst of the cross pollination of ideas and infusion of empirical information about disgust, one would want to remain isolated from the interdisciplinary conversation. Here, as in other areas at the buzzing intersection of philosophy and the cognitive sciences, there is plenty of opportunity for philosophers to make important contributions, providing conceptual clarification, teasing apart possibilities, pulling material together, using the methods of experimental philosophy to investigate folk concepts, and exploring philosophically significant implications of the empirical work. This book does not rise to the occasion. McGinn either ignores or is unaware of one of the major accounts of disgust and its evolution. Despite use of the authorial first person plural to talk about what "we" find disgusting, he proceeds without much appreciating the fact that different individuals and different groups of people are liable to be disgusted by different things, and that this raises difficulties for the way he sets up his project. Despite rather quaint use of the word "data" to describe the examples of what he deems to be disgusting (36, 41, 55, 78, 122), nowhere does he consult current empirical literature for evidence about disgust, cross-cultural or otherwise. The resulting book is as disappointing as it is irresponsible.


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McGinn, C. 2011. The meaning of disgust. New York: Oxford University Press.

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Sterelny, K. (2003). Thought in a hostile world. New York: Blackwell.