2012.06.24

John Martin Fischer

Deep Control: Essays on Free Will and Value

John Martin Fischer, Deep Control: Essays on Free Will and Value, Oxford University Press, 2012, 244pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199742981.

Reviewed by Meghan Griffith, Davidson College


In Deep Control: Essays on Free Will and Value, John Martin Fischer offers a follow-up to his important collections, My Way and Our Stories. This third volume of essays will prove no less significant. Although all twelve entries (the fifth and twelfth coauthored with Neal Tognazzini) have appeared elsewhere, about half of them have been revised. Like the third installment in any good series, Deep Control offers additional insights about issues raised in previous work. The overall theme of the book is 'deep control', Fischer's version of the freedom condition for moral responsibility. Fischer here further defends his view that the kind of freedom required for responsibility does not require alternative possibilities. The essays in Part One largely focus on Frankfurt-style counterexamples to the Principle of Alternative Possibilities and Fischer's responses to various objections. In Part Two, Fischer defends his guidance control view as a 'middle path' between theories of responsibility which invoke a requirement of total control and those that settle for a kind of superficial control that does not trace back far enough in the agent's history (20-21). Overall, the essays are careful, insightful, and sensible. As always, Fischer is highly sensitive to the subtleties and intricacies of the arguments but has an uncanny ability to cut to the heart of the issues. And as always, he is charitable to his opponents. Rather than summarize each essay, I will discuss some themes and highlights.

Fischer's overall view relies heavily on the success of the Frankfurt cases, which therefore play a prominent role throughout. The Frankfurt cases are supposed to show that moral responsibility is an actual sequence phenomenon and does not require alternatives. In these cases, the agent cannot do otherwise but is still, intuitively speaking, responsible. The agent cannot do otherwise because there is a counterfactual intervener standing by, ready to force the agent's behavior if the agent does not perform the desired action on his own. The agent in such cases does perform the action 'on his own' and this is why we hold him responsible.

In previous work, Fischer has persuasively argued that the Frankfurt cases do provide genuine counterexamples to PAP. He has argued that those who cite alternatives in these scenarios are misguided. Such alternatives are mere "flickers of freedom" -- not robust enough to ground any kind of responsibility. In Part One of Deep Control, Fischer defends Frankfurt cases from a number of other interesting threats. For example, he responds to the important Dilemma Defense (of PAP). Here is one version of the Dilemma Defense: either determinism is true in the Frankfurt scenario or it is not. If it is true, then the counterfactual intervener is irrelevant. The agent is unable to do otherwise because of determinism, not because of the counterfactual intervener. If it is not true, then there is no way to guarantee that the agent cannot do otherwise. Thus, the Frankfurt cases cannot show what they claim to show (38). Fischer focuses mostly on the deterministic horn here. He claims that the presence of the intervener is not irrelevant to the argument for Frankfurt-style compatibilism. He presents his version of the argument and demonstrates that "nothing in the argument uses or exploits the assumption that causal determinism is incompatible with alternative possibilities" (48). The counterfactual intervener is thus playing the proper role.

In general in Part One, Fischer emphasizes two main insights: that not just any alternatives are good enough to ground responsibility, and that the presence of a counterfactual intervener is irrelevant to responsibility (18-19).

These insights figure prominently in an intriguing argument against the notorious 'problem of luck'. In the last essay of Part One, Fischer argues that there is a parallel between the worries raised for responsibility under determinism and those raised for responsibility under indeterminism. He suggests that similar strategies can be used for both (19).

Fischer responds to Peter van Inwagen's "Rollback Argument." This argument is supposed to demonstrate that what we do under indeterminism must be a matter of luck. The idea is that if God rolled back the universe 1000 times to just before the moment of choice, the agent would not always do the same thing, given the same prior conditions. If the agent does one thing 493 times and another 508 times, we should conclude that what will happen on the next replay is just a matter of luck (92-93). Fischer responds by asking us to imagine a world, W1, in which determinism obtains and in which there is the appropriate "responsibility-grounding relationship" between the agent's states and her subsequent choice. Imagine, next, a world (W2) just like this but in which determinism does not obtain. By hypothesis, in W2, the agent's states are appropriately connected to her choice in the way they need to be. Suppose further that there is a machine that operates randomly. Sometimes it is in state M1 just before the agent makes a choice. If it is in M1, then there is a 50/50 chance that the agent's choice will be preempted. The machine will either 'go to sleep' or it will do something to ensure that the agent refrains from his choice. Suppose that in the actual scenario, the machine is in M1 and it goes to sleep (94-95).

Fischer's claim is that the mere existence of an untriggered preemptor should not trouble us any more than the existence of an untriggered ensurer (as in the Frankfurt cases). As Fischer has repeatedly emphasized, it is the actual sequence that matters. And, by hypothesis, the actual sequence includes the appropriate responsibility-grounding relationship between the agent's states and choice. Fischer argues that because his imagined scenario is indeterministic, and appropriately so (the indeterminism exists in a relevant place -- between the agent's prior states and her choice), it cannot be indeterminism qua indeterminism that takes away responsibility (104). One of Fischer's goals is to bolster his claim that our responsibility does not 'hang on a thread' (it is resilient to threats from both determinism and indeterminism).

One might object that the appropriate responsibility-grounding relationship cannot hold if indeterminism is true. If this is the case, his example cannot get off the ground. Is Fischer entitled to build this into his scenario? He argues that "the mere fact of the application of the Rollback Argument does not show what it is intended to show, namely, that the responsibility-grounding relationship is absent" (97). Thus, Fischer presents the dialectical situation as one in which the burden is on his opponent to show that the possible application of the Rollback Argument precludes the proper responsibility-grounding relationship. He claims that the argument does not succeed because on its own the Rollback Argument does not rule out this relationship. Indeterminism allows the application of the Rollback Argument. But indeterminism does not thereby rule out the responsibility-grounding relationship. I think Fischer has the upper hand here, dialectically speaking. The proponent of the Rollback Argument owes us an account of how the responsibility-grounding relationship is undermined. Getting different results on the replays is not sufficient.

One of Fischer's important maneuvers both here and with the Frankfurt examples is to argue that the case for responsibility and control should be made in stages. With regard to determinism, he suggests, for example, that one ought first to argue (via the Frankfurt cases) that PAP is false. Then, one should seek to show that causal determinism does not threaten responsibility (73). He cites this two-step process when responding to certain objections about the Frankfurt cases. Likewise, in the case of indeterminism, Fischer suggests that his point about the Rollback Argument is only the first step (104, n. 34). A second step is required to spell out one's notion of indeterministic control. This two-step procedure is important because it is supposed to block the following kind of objection to both Frankfurt cases and the Rollback case. There is a temptation to claim that untriggered ensurers and untriggered preemptors are quite unlike determinism on the one hand and indeterminism on the other. But Fischer's point is that we must first understand that alternatives are not necessary (on the deterministic side) and that being able to run the Rollback argument is not problematic (on the indeterministic side). From there, we are to understand that if a lack of alternatives is not a problem and the possibility of the Rollback scenario is not a problem, then why would determinism or indeterminism be a problem?

Some incompatibilists have argued that determinism is in fact a problem apart from its preclusion of alternatives (sometimes this is referred to as the Direct Argument. Fischer discusses this approach in essay 7). Likewise, those skeptical of the prospects for indeterministic control may try a similar tactic and suggest that indeterminism is a problem for reasons apart from Rollback possibilities. They might, for example, emphasize the problem of the 'disappearing agent' (for example, see Pereboom 2004). As Derk Pereboom has pointed out, the problem is that the indeterministic events involving the agent leave it open what choice will occur, thus leaving the agent out of the picture in an important way. In other words, the agent's contributions do not settle what happens. Arguably, this problem does not rely on the running of a Rollback-type argument.

But the success of such an argument may end up depending upon just how one undertakes the second step that Fischer mentions. Thus, it may not be direct, in that one cannot argue straight from general elements of indeterminism to a lack of control. It seems clear from the preemption scenario that not all indeterministic situations will have difficulty with a disappearing agent. In the preemption scenario, for example, although it is left open what will happen in the sense that there may or may not be preemption, there is nothing about the existence of a preemptor that detracts from agential contribution. The agent does, in a sense, settle what happens barring the intervention of the preemptor.[1] She does not antecedently determine it, but, as Kane and others point out, this is not, in itself, a problem. What matters for responsibility is what the agent actually did and how the choice related to her inner states.[2] Thus, it seems that Fischer's argument poses a formidable challenge for the luck objector.

In Part Two, Fischer discusses other varieties of responsibility and argues that they are either too shallow or too over-the-top. He also further emphasizes his actual sequence model. An interesting thematic element is the role of perspective. Fischer discusses T.M. Scanlon's idea that responsibility is based on judgment-sensitivity and the Value of Choice. To greatly oversimplify, Scanlon's view emphasizes that outcomes should be counterfactually dependent on choices, and choices and actions counterfactually dependent on judgments (145ff). This is a compatibilist view (whereby freedom is, in a sense, conditional), but it is a view that emphasizes the value of 'regulative control.' Scanlon appears to be emphasizing the extent to which we care about alternative sequences. Fischer first argues that this kind of 'conditional' view falls prey to Frankfurt cases. One can be morally responsible but fail to secure the relevant counterfactuals (due to counterfactual interveners). Then, Fischer offers an interesting insight about perspective. He argues that we should distinguish between an abstract perspective and a concrete perspective. The abstract perspective does not include knowledge of any of our actual preferences. From this standpoint, it makes sense to suppose that we would prefer something like regulative control (he qualifies this point but I will set that aside). Since we don't know what our preferences are, we would prefer to have a system that allows outcomes to depend on choices and choices to depend on judgments. We want to be able to satisfy our preferences, "whatever they turn out to be" (148-149). But from the concrete perspective, which includes our preferences, we have no need for this, as evidenced by the Frankfurt cases. From the concrete perspective, if I am able to act on my preferences, it is irrelevant whether there is an intervener on the sidelines. Thus, Fischer can agree with Scanlon that our intuitions do point towards a kind of value of choice, but the implications are not what they seem to be.

The issue of perspective also plays a role in Fischer's discussion of incompatibilist 'sourcehood' arguments. Such arguments claim, in one way or another, that in order to be responsible, agents must be the 'ultimate sources' of their actions. Fischer mostly responds to the arguments of non-libertarian incompatibilists such as Galen Strawson and Saul Smilansky. Perspective comes into play prominently in his response to Smilansky, who cites "zoom-out" arguments in order to explicate his notion of ultimacy. The idea is that if we take what he calls the 'ultimate perspective' -- that is, if we zoom out and see that causal determinism means that all of our choices and actions are the 'mere unfolding of the given' -- then we will see why we cannot be held responsible for anything that we do (177ff.). With characteristic level-headedness, Fischer asks why such a zoomed-out perspective is appropriate here: "It is certainly not the case that as we get more and more distant temporally or spatially, we always get closer to the truth, no matter what the domain. Frequently it is quite the opposite" (180).

This sensible claim is part of Fischer's overall notion that responsibility is found in a middle way between the "superficial control" of judgment-sensitivity (and various non-historical "mesh theories") and the "total control" postulated by various incompatibilists. The former do not go back far enough in the agent's history, and the latter go way too far (21).

Fischer does not imply that these notions of perspective are decisive. They can't be. For it is always open to his opponent to argue that we value other things, even from the concrete perspective, for instance. Or one might agree that we often lose truth by zooming out too far, while disagreeing about the outer limits. But in any case, Fischer's insights here, as in his other work, will prove invaluable for framing the debate and moving it forward.

In describing his view, Fischer cites the Buddha's Middle Path as the path of wisdom and freedom (21). In Deep Control, even those who are wary of this path will find an excellent guide.

Works Cited

Kane, Robert. (1999). "Responsibility, Luck, and Chance: Reflections on Free Will and Indeterminism." Journal of Philosophy 96: 217-40.

Pereboom, Derk. (2004). "Is Our Concept of Agent-Causation Coherent?" Philosophical Topics 32: 275-86.



[1] This is reminiscent of Robert Kane's famous example of the husband who intentionally swings his arm down onto a glass tabletop. It might be undetermined whether the table will break, but this does not negate his responsibility for breaking it (since this is what he was trying to do) (for example, see Kane 1999). If Kane's view falters, it may be in placing the indeterminism in dual efforts of will, since openness at that point seems to prevent the agent from being able to settle which way she decides.

[2] Although Fischer leaves open the possibility that dual control models (models like Kane's in which agents have control in both the actual sequence and the alternative sequence) could be developed at this second stage (104, n. 34), it remains to be seen how such models could utilize the relevant intuitions from the preemption case. Although the agent in the preemption case does not fully control whether her action comes to fruition, her participation does not seem in question with regard to the most important element, i.e., the choice. On the dual control model, it is difficult to understand how the agent stays in the game, so to speak, given that her participation leaves it open which way she decides.