2012.07.29

Jeremy Waldron

The Harm in Hate Speech

Jeremy Waldron, The Harm in Hate Speech, Harvard University Press, 2012, 304pp., $26.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674065895.

Reviewed by Brian Leiter, University of Chicago


Jeremy Waldron makes a spirited, if somewhat meandering, case for the legal regulation of "hate speech," one that American scholars in particular would do well to consider. Such regulation is unconstitutional content-based regulation of speech in the U.S., but is common in most other Western democracies. Is there a good reason for the U.S. to be the outlier here? As Waldron notes in passing, in the U.S. "the philosophical arguments about hate speech are knee-jerk, impulsive, and thoughtless" (11), which is at least partly due to confusion about what is at stake. Waldron observes that "hatred is relevant not as the motivation of certain actions, but as a possible effect of certain forms of speech" (35), and thus the real issue is "the predicament of vulnerable people who are subject to hatred directed at their race, ethnicity, or religion" (37).[1]

Eschewing a systematic theoretical framework, Waldron argues mainly by way of a series of prima facie plausible moral intuitions about a few basic concepts, such as dignity, harm, group defamation, and a well-ordered society. We may summarize the argument for Waldron's titular view as follows. First, the "harm in hate speech" results primarily from speech that is written rather than spoken. Second, the harm in question is damage to the "dignity" of people based on defamation related to certain characteristics they share with a group, such that they are then deprived of the "assurance . . . that they can count on being treated justly" (85) in daily life because they are deemed to be "not worthy of equal citizenship" (39). Third, this harm to "the dignitary order of society" (92) is distinct from the individual offense hateful speech may cause, the latter not constituting a ground for regulation on Waldron's view. Fourth, although regulating to prevent this harm may have some costs, the benefits justify the normal practice in democratic societies of regulating such speech (e.g., 151 ff.). Later chapters of the book respond to objections to the regulation of hate speech due to C. Edwin Baker, Ronald Dworkin and (more briefly) Geoffrey Stone. The book's concluding chapter examines early modern views of toleration as they bear on the regulation of "hate speech," and while intriguing, most of it is not essential to the argument. The book as a whole is quite accessible, and can be read profitably by legal scholars, historians, political theorists, and any educated person interested in the issue. Its lack of an explicit theory of free speech and its limits, however, comes at some costs, as I argue below.

Waldron makes two important claims early on. First, he argues that the "harm" associated with "hate speech" has nothing to do with the motives of the speaker, and everything to do with the message conveyed and the damage that message does in a democratic society predicated on equal citizenship. (By bracketing motive, Waldron is able to resist the charge that "hate speech" legislation is a form of thought control; but what people think is not the issue, the damage that what they say does is the issue.) Second, Waldron argues that written defamation (libel) matters much more than the spoken word. As he puts it, "libel is much . . . more serious because the imputations it embodies take a more permanent form" (45). The permanency of the form is only exacerbated in the era of the Internet, when the libel is dependent not for its continued existence on the preservation of the paper on which it is printed, but the continuation of the Internet where, thanks to Google and similar search engines, it quickly becomes available to anyone in the world with computer access. Such libel then "becomes a permanent or semi-permanent part of the visible environment in which our lives, and the lives of vulnerable minorities, have to be lived" (37). Note, however, that in the Internet era, when a video of slander can go "viral" and attract millions of viewers (and then exist in cyberspace forever), this proposed distinction between the printed and spoken word breaks down. What should be excluded from regulation, given Waldron's rationale, is only the spoken word that has not been recorded and uploaded to the Internet.

Harm to "dignity" is the effect of hate speech that is Waldron's primary concern, and he says a variety of things about what is at stake. He calls "dignity" "the social standing, the fundamentals of basic reputation that entitle [persons] to be treated as equals in the ordinary operations of society" (5). He says dignity "is a matter of status -- one's status as a member of society in good standing -- and it generates demands for recognition and for treatment in accord with that status" (60); it involves, "intrinsic[ally]" the "assurance that one will be dealt with on this basis [as an equal in rights and entitlements]" (85); it involves what Stephen Darwall famously dubbed "recognition respect" (86-87); and "it is a matter of . . . one's status as an ordinary member of society in good standing, entitled to the same liberties, protections, and powers that everyone else has" (219-220). Adopting the lingo of the economists, Waldron even calls the preservation of dignity "the public good of assurance" (93). He summarizes his view, aptly, by saying that, "Hate speech and group defamation are actions performed in public, with a public orientation, aimed at undermining public goods" (100), that is, the good of assurance of dignity in public.

The harm to "dignity" is more aptly conceptualized, Waldron argues, on the model of "group libel," that is, written defamation that,

sets out to make [group membership] a liability, by denigrating group-defining characteristics or associating them with bigoted factual claims that are fundamentally defamatory . . . what hate speech legislation stands for is the dignity of equal citizenship (for all members of all groups), and it does what it can to put a stop to group defamation when group defamation . . . threatens to undermine the status for a whole class of citizens. (61)

Waldron gives considerable attention to a rather anomalous U.S. Supreme Court case, Beauharnais v. Illinois (1952), in which the Court actually approved of the doctrine of group libel with respect to vile racist pamphlets circulated in Chicago. (Waldron also argues, plausibly, that the subsequent raising of the bar for a successful claim of libel against "public" persons in a 1964 U.S. Supreme Court decision [New York Times v. Sullivan] does not vitiate the basic rationale of Beauharnais, which involved private citizens.) And he cites with approval the view defended in briefs by Catharine MacKinnon and colleagues in R. v. Keegstra (a landmark 1990 Canadian case upholding the regulation of hate speech) that "group libel . . . promotes the disadvantage of unequal groups" and "that stereotyping and stigmization of historically disadvantaged groups through group hate propaganda shape their social image and reputation, which controls their access to opportunities more powerfully than their individual abilities ever do" (58).

Why is dignitary harm, harm to the "assurance" of equal standing, the crucial issue with which the law should be concerned?[2] Oddly, Waldron's answer to this most basic question is never clear. He appeals to intuitions about what a "well-ordered society" should look like (explicitly eschewing the claim that this is Rawls's notion of a well-ordered society). He invokes Edmund Burke in stressing the importance of "political aesthetics, from official posters and warnings to advertising hoardings to posters pasted up by citizens" (75), adding that "the look of a society is one of its primary ways of conveying assurances to its members about how they are likely to be treated, for example, by the hundreds or thousands of strangers they encounter or are exposed to in everyday life" (82). He again invokes MacKinnon, this time in her critique of pornography, summarizing her view that,

Pornography is not just an image beamed by a sort of pimp-machine directly into the mind of a masturbator. It is world-defining imagery, imagery whose highly visible, more or less permanent, and apparently ineradicable presence makes a massive difference to the environment in which women have to lead their lives (74).

He cites no evidence that it makes "a massive difference," but perhaps it does.[3] Waldron, in any case, thinks something similar is true of the effect of the "hate speech" with which he is concerned.

But none of this, sensible as it is, answers the question: why is the dignitary harm to equal social standing (or the ideal of a "well-ordered society" or the "political aesthetics" of society) of such great significance, compared to all the other harms that speech can inflict, that the law should regulate it? I can imagine answers: perhaps that destruction of the dignitary order of society is incompatible with the legitimacy of democratic self-governance, for example. Waldron does not make that argument, however, so we are left with no answer to why this particular harm inflicted by speech is the one that cries out for legal redress.

Waldron is very keen, however, to argue that the "harm" at issue with group defamation has nothing to do with offending people: "undermining a person's dignity" is not the same as "causing offense to the same individual" (105). He claims, contra liberal theorists like Joel Feinberg, that, "Protecting people's feelings against offense is not an appropriate objective for the law" (106). Indeed, he goes further, insisting that "the basic distinction between an attack on a body of beliefs and an attack on the basic social standing and reputation of a group of people is clear," explaining it as follows:

I think the views held by many members of the Republican "Tea Party" right are preposterous and (if they were ever put into effect) socially dangerous; but Tea Party members are entitled to stand for office, to vote, and to have their votes counted. Denying any of these rights would be an attack on them but attacking or ridiculing their beliefs is business-as-usual in a polity in which they, like me, are members in good standing. Moreover, it would be inconsistent with the respect demanded by their status as citizens to publish a claim, for example, that Tea Party politicans cannot be trusted with public funds or that they are dishonest . . . . that would be a scurrilous attack on what I have called their elementary dignity in society. It would be group defamation of exactly the kind we have been considering. But at the same time, there is no affront to their dignity in "expressions of antipathy, dislike, ridicule, insult or abuse" directed at their economic views. (121)

This passage is difficult to make sense of. If I ridicule as idiotic and morally depraved all your central beliefs, that, on Waldron's view, has no effect on your "dignity" (even if it might "offend" you); but if I suggest that people who hold these idiotic and morally depraved beliefs should not be trusted, I have engaged in prohibited "group defamation" that impugns their dignity. The distinctions here are more difficult than Waldron's often high-handed rhetoric allows.[4]

This difficulty haunts much of the book. Waldron tries to deflect it by suggesting that such worries reflect a kind of pernicious "identity politics" in which one's social standing is identical with one's beliefs. As Waldron puts it:

If I identify my self with my beliefs, then criticisms of them will seem like an assault on me. And that, I might say, is something I am entitled to protection against by the law . . . [But] this implication or tendency of identity politics makes it much harder for a society to be administered in the midst of difference and disagreement. Better to reserve the idea of 'assault on me' for attacks on my person or attempts to denigrate or eliminate my social standing. (135)

But, again, the distinction in question is elusive. If I do not identify my "self" (my "person") with what I believe about the true and the good, what should I identify it with? My height? My hair color? Surely if someone holds up for ridicule all my central beliefs, they are attacking me and my "social standing": no one says, after all, "Your world view marks you as a fool and moral reprobate, and that means you deserve equal standing in our community." To be sure, such an attack is not quite the same as saying I have no right to run for office, no right to participate in political life, or no right to be seen or heard in public -- but then why not describe the latter as the content of impermissible speech? And if we agree that such claims should be verboten, then why limit the prohibition simply to speech that denigrates people based on race, ethnicity or religion? Yet even a prohibition so circumscribed to a particular content seems inadequate to Waldron's animating purpose, namely, giving "assurance" of one's equal standing in society. If I can ridicule the Tea Party folks as the damn fools they are, we are left, again, with the puzzle of how that could not be seen as undermining their sense of "assurance" that their "dignity" will be respected in public life? And if I am allowed to say that their views are preposterous, why am I not allowed to say that they should not be allowed to hold public office?

As the book goes on, the rhetoric about what is at stake in the protection of "dignity" shifts in ways that will be alarming to free speech libertarians. Much later, Waldron says that it "is a requirement of human dignity that we should deal with one another in [the] relaxed and civilized way" (219) that characterizes the interactions between citizens of different religions at the Royal Exchange in London in the 18th-century, as described by Voltaire. Waldron's point cannot, of course, be that the ideal of "civilized" interaction is that of market transactions -- where people bracket some or all of their disagreements in pursuit of profit -- but what is it then? He says that, "The primary habitat of human dignity is the mundane" (219) and that "The guarantee of dignity is what enables a person to walk down the street without fear of insult or humiliation . . . and to proceed with an implicit assurance of being able to interact with others without being treated as a pariah" (220). But should the law really govern "mundane" interactions, such that no one need "fear . . . insult or humiliation"? (This seems inconsistent with the earlier emphasis on libel as against slander.) Surely any Tea Party member who learns that Waldron thinks his views are "preposterous" will feel insulted (and correctly so!), but such Waldronian insults are supposed to be outside the scope of regulation. Why? Can the law really guarantee that anyone can walk down the street "without fear of insult or humiliation"? What would be the costs of doing so? These questions receive no attention -- indeed little acknowledgment as reasonable questions -- in Waldron's book.

The central difficulty, I suspect, is that Waldron may have misdescribed the "harm" involved in "hate speech," at least in his official position on the subject, described above. But unofficially, in his rhetorical asides, he is often compelling and evocative. Imagine a society -- not much imagination is required, of course, just historical memory -- in which Jews or African-Americans are described in the media and in signs on the streets as "sub-human," "parasites," and "animals," in which their identity is deemed diseased and dangerous to the body politic. We could describe such rhetoric as an attack on the public assurance of their dignity, or we could just describe it as frightful and disgusting abuse, the possible precursor to murder and assault.[5] Waldron quite aptly asks about people so stigmatized and abused, "Can their lives be led, can their children be brought up, can their hopes be maintained and their worst fears dispelled, in a social environment polluted by these materials?" (10). Similarly, he invokes an anecdote about President Lyndon Johnson's defense of "the moral necessity of the 1964 Civil Rights Act," which Johnson justified as follows: "A man has a right not to be insulted in front of his children." Waldron continues: "It is a telling image of the ugliness and distress that the details of discrimination inflict upon people" (84; see also 154).

And indeed it is, but the compelling force of such examples is that the psychological harms to both children and adults in these cases seem obvious and appalling: why should parents and their children have to live like this? The harm isn't that these people have now been deprived of "the public good of assurance" of their equal standing as citizens (which could seem an almost comically abstract characterization of the wound inflicted on such people), it's that they have been demeaned and humiliated in ways that are cruel and disgusting, causing them, as Waldron rightly says, "distress," and probably more severe forms of psychological damage as well. One of the virtues of Waldron's book is that he puts these issues front-and-center, humanely and correctly, and often in evocative prose. But why does he then dress up the vicious psychological harm to these people in the language of academic political theory? Since Waldron himself agrees that the motive for the "hate speech" is not the issue, but rather its harmful effects, why limit the focus on harm to the ephemeral "dignitary order of society" as he does? Why not simply say that vulnerable groups of people should be protected from vicious and humiliating verbal abuse in public?

But then, of course, we might ask: why only that harm? Waldron is right to call attention throughout to the fact that it is harm to vulnerable people that underlies the moral urgency for regulating racist and other hate speech, but he does not fully consider where such an emphasis might lead. So consider: elderly people of limited means in the United States who are dependent on Medicare for their basic well-being -- there are tens of millions of them -- are rather clearly "vulnerable people." Why, then, is it not equally problematic when a powerful congressman, Representative Paul Ryan of Wisconsin, advocates effectively eliminating the program that benefits these vulnerable people, indeed, keeps them alive? "Hatred," after all, is not the issue as Waldron says, and no one, I assume, thinks Rep. Ryan "hates" the elderly or the poor. He may simply be stupid, or in thrall to an ideology, or defective in empathetic capacity, or beholden to special interests. Whatever the explanation, it is clear that his proposals, if enacted, would eventually result in elderly people in need being unable to afford essential healthcare. Thus, the harm to vulnerable people is equally, if not more, tangible, when someone advocates destroying programs that keep needy people alive, as it is when speech undermines the "public good of assurance" (I will refer to this, hereafter, as "the Ryan case"). Access to health care is surely in the realm of the "mundane," and "assurance" that one can get access to medical care when in need is a rather fundamental assurance! Some may think all this suggests a reductio of Waldron's position, but I think it raises a more interesting issue: namely, once one endorses, as Waldron does, the idea that the harm done by speech to vulnerable populations might warrant legal redress, it is not obvious why we should limit the scope of harms to be averted merely to those that are "dignitary" in Waldron's sense (especially since that category does not seem to adequately describe even Waldron's real concern).

Can Waldron resist that conclusion? Can he explain why the Ryan case isn't a proper target of regulation given the moral intuitions he begins with? If he laid the emphasis on the need to protect vulnerable people from vicious verbal abuse, then he might argue that the Ryan case is obviously different, since no such vicious verbal abuse is involved. But, as we have already noted, that is not his strategy -- and even if it were, it would not be clear why suffering vicious verbal abuse (or losing the "public good of assurance") should be considered worse than losing access to essential healthcare. If Waldron had not declared "motive" irrelevant to hate speech regulation, he might have invoked motive to distinguish the Ryan case, on the plausible assumption, mentioned above, that Rep. Ryan is not so motivated. But Waldron does claim that "hatred is relevant . . . as a possible effect of certain forms of speech" (35), and so even forgetting about Rep. Ryan's motives, one might note that the effect of his speech is not to perpetrate hatred against the elderly and needy, in contrast to the effect of paradigmatic racist or anti-semitic hate speech. That would distinguish the Ryan case, but again only if there were some explanation for why the harm of hatred, as opposed to other kinds of harms against vulnerable persons, is the one that warrants legal redress.

A more ambitious strategy is suggested in his reply to C. Edwin Baker's view that the value of free speech resides in its essential role in "autonomous self-disclosure" (163). According to Baker (as described, accurately I believe, by Waldron), "What each of us is -- and what we want others to know us as -- is the locus of a point of view, an outlook on the world. And we want to disclose ourselves as such" (162). Of course, most people are just regurgitators of pablum, vectors of ideological and commercial forces at work in the broader culture, so what they "disclose" is only, in their eyes, a mark of their individuality. That is surely relevant, though not decisive, in assessing the value of such self-disclosure, but it is not Waldron's concern.

Waldron's concern is Baker's defense of "hate" speech within this framework, that is, the idea that even hate speech is a valuable form of self-disclosure for the hateful speaker. Moreover, according to Baker "all the harm that [hateful] free speech does is mediated causally by the mental processes of those to whom the speech is addressed" (168), that is, the harm results from the way others receive the words of the hate speaker, a consideration that he thinks militates against suppressing the speech of hate-mongers given its self-disclosure value for them. As Waldron, however, correctly notes, "any impact speech has in the world must depend upon its being understood" (170), which would seem sufficient to establish the irrelevance of Baker's observation as stated: that hateful words have to be understood to harm hardly shows that their utterance isn't harmful! But if "mediat[ion] causally by the mental processes of those to whom the speech is addressed" is irrelevant to the question of regulation of harmful speech, then it might turn out, again, that the Ryan case involving "harmful" speech about Medicare is again a legitimate target for regulation. [6]

It seems, then, we should attend explicitly to the issue of causation. Even if we reject Baker's confused idea that speech is not "really" harmful because words must be understood by those who hear them before they cause harm, we can still acknowledge that the causal links are less immediate, and more tenuous, between certain speech and certain harmful effects. Much legal regulation, for example of possibly toxic materials, is predicated on tenuous causal claims, so we need some greater clarity about what kind of causal link is required. Waldron unequivocally rejects the view "that the social and economic effects of pornography are simply not worth being considered as reason for censorship" (180), but is the causal connection between pornography and, say, rape and sexual harassment less clear than the causal connection between advocating the elimination of government-funded healthcare for the elderly and its being eliminated? Waldron's position on pornography makes clear that he is willing to entertain a causal link significantly less tight than that involved in John Stuart Mill's famed example of incitement of a mob to do violence to the corn merchant. Waldron also dismisses (156-157), correctly I think, the mythology that more speech is an adequate remedy for "bad speech" or that in the "marketplace of ideas" truth will prove victorious. (It would come as news to American courts, where lay jurors are charged with discovering the truth, but subject to massive epistemic paternalism by the judge,[7] that a "marketplace of ideas" is a good mechanism for discovering the truth!) By the same token, then, he has also deprived himself of all these familiar explanations for thinking legal regulation of Rep. Ryan's harmful speech is not justified.

Critics of content-based regulations, like Stone, object that government should not be allowed to regulate on the ground that it "'does not trust its citizens to make wise decisions if they are exposed to the [regulated] expression'" (153). But Waldron rejects this concern out of hand; indeed, he says that such apprehensions "are not unreasonable" (153) when it comes to hate speech, which is precisely why they should be regulated. Given all that we now know about the irrational and unpredictable ways in which "information" and arguments are processed by people -- from the Tversky-Kahnemann literature and its progeny on cognitive biases, to the work of Jonathan Haidt, George Lakoff, and many others on the influence of non-rational emotional responses in shaping moral and political views -- the real question is how one could not be apprehensive? Even Stone, Waldron's opponent here, has been moved recently, in the wake of the U.S. Supreme Court's lifting of all meaningful restrictions on the expenditure of money on behalf of candidates,[8] to propose a constitutional amendment empowering Congress to reasonably regulate spending on elections "in order to ensure a fair and well-functioning electoral process" on the grounds that,

Speech matters. It shapes people's perceptions, knowledge and attitudes. Why else would businesses spend billions of dollars each year on commercial advertising? Corporations and billionaires are not stupid. They would not waste millions of dollars to fund an endless flood of political ads if those ads didn't pay off. They do. Money may not guarantee victory, but it definitely helps.

To be sure that position is consistent with thinking content-based regulation is impermissible, but it does concede a crucial point to Waldron, namely, that one does have reason to be apprehensive about the effect of speech on the political process (i.e., one has reasons not to trust how the citizenry will respond to speech). Since Waldron thinks it is reasonable to be apprehensive about the effect given the content of the speech alone, he is again deprived of a rationale for resisting the proposal that Rep. Ryan's attack on Medicare should also be prohibited on the grounds that it may harm vulnerable people.

This brings us to what I expect is the heart of the matter: doubts about whether government should be thought competent or trustworthy to decide which speech is harmful to the vulnerable and which not. Waldron cites Stone for the worry (201-203), but it appears briefly in Mill's On Liberty (in Chapter 4), and is a familiar theme in the American constitutional literature, central, for example, to Frederick Schauer's seminal discussion thirty years ago in Free Speech: A Philosophical Enquiry:[9]

Freedom of speech is based in large part on a distrust of the ability of government to make the necessary distinctions, a distrust of governmental determinations of truth and falsity, an appreciation of the fallibility of political leaders, and a somewhat deeper distrust of governmental power in a more general sense.

We need not sign on to the more generalized paranoia about government power expressed at the end of Schauer's statement in order to still agree that government seems to be a problematic arbiter of truth and falsity, or harm and lack of harm, since it, too often, has dubious competence and often dubious motives for its decisions in these domains.[10] In the case of "hate speech," speech that harms the "dignitary order of society," Waldron is unimpressed by this worry, however. He asks why the prohibition of group defamation should be "an area where we should be particularly mistrustful of our lawmakers" (202)? After all, this is "a legislative majority bending over backwards to ensure that vulnerable minorities are protected against hatred and discrimination that might otherwise be endemic in society" (202). So "hate speech laws do not involve putting the interests of the majority above those of vulnerable groups" (203).

Waldron's characterization of the content of hate speech legislation in jurisdictions outside the United States is fair, and perhaps that is because democratic processes there are more robust than in the United States. But surely one could imagine that were the United States to go the route proposed by Waldron that Evangelical Christians would soon present themselves as a "vulnerable" group, oppressed by a secular society, and demand appropriate regulations governing how the secular elites speak about them. Richard Dawkins (maybe even Brian Leiter[11]?) better watch out how they speak about religious belief once the religious secure their Waldron-sanctioned protections!

At first blush, such concerns might seem silly. Evangelical Christians, with significant control over one of the main political parties in the United States and facing no threat of serious state persecution, are obviously in a very different position than the minority of American Muslims, who are spied on by the police agencies and regularly tarred as terrorists and dangers to the body politic in national media, especially, but not only, on-line. Yet that is precisely the reason to worry, says the critic of Waldron's view: precisely because Evangelical Christians do have access to political power, they are in a position to get their self-representation as "vulnerable", as implausible as it may seem, recognized by the law.[12] What if other pseudo-vulnerable groups follow suit?[13]

This kind of worry cuts in another direction too. A critic might also object that the elderly are not a "vulnerable" group in the U.S., represented, as they are, by an allegedly powerful lobbying organization, the American Association of Retired Persons ("AARP"). The supposed power of the AARP is perhaps belied, of course, by the political viability of the Ryan case, but we may put that to one side, since the case also illustrates an ambiguity in the notion of "vulnerability." The elderly dependent on Medicare are vulnerable in the sense of being almost wholly dependent on a particular government benefit for their well-being and existence. Perhaps they are not quite as vulnerable in the sense of having no voice in the political process -- though, of course, that remains to be seen. Although Waldron is not clear on this point, I take it he means vulnerability in something closer to the first sense, that is, people who can be harmed unless government acts. In that case, the elderly dependent on Medicare are not that different from the vulnerable minorities on whom Waldron focuses.

Late in the book, Waldron affirms that "everything must be open to debate and challenge in a free and democratic society, no matter how important the objects of challenge seem to be to the culture and identify of our community" (198), which would seem to provide secure protection for the Ryan case. But it is not at all clear how that resounding affirmation of "open debate" can be squared with the idea that harm to vulnerable people is morally important, and that no one may impugn the "dignitary order of society." Is this entire exercise just Miss Manners writ large in the language of political philosophy? One might think so when Waldron admonishes that "forceful disagreement, when it is expressed, should be expressed in terms that can be engaged with intellectually, which is the only means by which belief might possibly be affected" (230; cf. 229). Yet it is absurd on its face to suggest that "belief" is only affected by "intellectual" forms of expression, and, of course, Waldron cites no evidence to the contrary (there is none as far as I know). Furthermore, his own discussion of the reasons for being apprehensive about "hate speech" suggests he does not really believe it. But even putting that empirical flight-of-fancy to one side, it is hard to see how this admonition to nice intellectual manners is consistent with his earlier claim that it is fine to "ridicule" (Waldron's word) the Tea Party folks as having "preposterous" views. At points like this, the lack of a systematic theoretical framework for the argument becomes particularly apparent.

Almost a half-century ago, the Marxist philosopher Herbert Marcuse expressed the view in his famous essay on "Repressive Tolerance" that

tolerance cannot be indiscriminate and equal with respect to the contents of expression, neither in word nor in deed; it cannot protect false words and wrong deeds which demonstrate that they contradict and counteract the possibilities of liberation. Such indiscriminate tolerance is justified in harmless debates, in conversation, in academic discussion; it is indispensable in the scientific enterprise, in private religion. But society cannot be indiscriminate where the pacification of existence, where freedom and happiness themselves are at stake: here, certain things cannot be said, certain ideas cannot be expressed, certain policies cannot be proposed, certain behavior cannot be permitted without making tolerance an instrument of the continuation of servitude.

Waldron's book is significant, in part, because he is an influential theorist, well within the rather staid mainstream of the liberal capitalist "West," endorsing the regulation of speech based on its content, in particular, based on the harm that content does to vulnerable people. But once that Pandora's Box is opened -- it has to be given the reality that speech causes all kinds of harms to vulnerable populations -- we end up having to ask why Marcuse was wrong? In that regard, Waldron's book may prove a watershed in Western theorizing about freedom of speech, less because of its dialectical ingenuity or theoretical innovations, and more because it legitimizes Marcuse's question in a way that has been unfamiliar in Anglophone debates for two generations.[14]



[1] Gender is omitted, a fact made all the more puzzling given Waldron's frequent invocation of arguments by Catharine MacKinnon.

[2] I note in passing that Waldron's rationale would apply not only to "hate speech" but also to what my colleague Lee Fennell usefully dubs "love speech," that is, speech of the kind associated with various "white pride" organizations that celebrates, usually with false factual claims as well, the virtues and positive attributes of a particular racial group, but in such a way as to again undermine the equal standing of other groups, and thus, once again, the dignitary order of society in Waldron's sense.

[3]Although a popular work, Gail Dines' Pornland (Boston:  Beacon Press, 2010) is especially useful; excerpts are available. Many academics have almost no idea what the 21st-century pornography industry is like, and thus are in the dark about the sinister, often creepy, ways it permeates all of our culture.

[4]Waldron is forced into similarly tortured hermeneutics regarding the Danish cartoons ridiculing Mohammed.  He writes: 

In and of themselves, the cartoons can be regarded as a critique of Islam rather than a libel on Muslims; they contribute, in their twisted way, to a debate about the connection between the prophet's teaching and the more violent aspects of modern jihadism.  They would come close to a libel on Muslims if they were calculated to suggest that most followers of Islam support political and religious violence (125). 

How that distinction is supposed to be read off the actual cartoons is mysterious.

[5]See David Livingstone Smith, Less than Human (New York:  St. Martin Press, 2011) for a bracing compilation of the kinds of rhetoric that preceded actual murder and assault in these and other cases.

[6]Waldron, in his reply to Baker, also insists that "the harms emphasized in this book are often harms constituted by speech, rather than merely caused by speech" (166), since the very speech itself constitutes "the dispelling of an assurance essential to dignity" (169).  That would not, of course, answer the question why that harm deserves legal redress, but it would moot the empirical questions if harm to dignity were the morally urgent harm afflicting vulnerable people.  But that, as I have suggested, is not at all clear. 

[7]See Brian Leiter, "The Epistemology of Admissibility:  Why Even Good Philosophy of Science Would Not Make for Good Philosophy of Evidence,"Brigham Young University Law Review 1997:  803-819.

[8]See Huffington Post  (accessed June 12, 2012).

[9](Cambridge:  Cambridge University Press, 1982), p. 86

[10]We do "trust" government to hire individuals as police, arm them, and send them out in the community with enormous coercive powers, which seems to me even more alarming than trusting the government to decide that vicious racist and anti-semitic speech has no value.

[11]Brian Leiter, Why Tolerate Religion? (Princeton:  Princeton University Press, 2013).

[12] As Martha Nussbaum pointed out to me, this is essentially what has happened in India:  Hindus, who were indeed the target of institutionalized denigration during the colonial period, used their political power, once India was independent, to impose restrictions on the portrayal of Hinduism that extend well beyond "hate speech" to encompass scholarly discussion of Hinduism that does not comport with the understanding of right-wing Hindus.

[13]A variation on this worry animates the critical review of Waldron in The New York Times by Michael McConnell, a conservative religious constitutional law professor in the United States.  See Michael McConnell, "You Can't Say That," New York Times Sunday Book Review (Jun 24, 2012), p. 14.   McConnell declares that it "is hard to find a case anywhere in the world where speech in support of dominant ideologies is punished for the protection of the weak," but almost all his examples, remarkably, involve far right critics of homosexuals and Muslims being sanctioned under "hate speech" statutes.  That McConnell thinks this is evidence of the powerful oppressing the weak is deeply revealing about the peculiarities of American political culture.

[14]I am grateful to Leslie Green and Geoffrey Stone for comments on an earlier draft, and to valuable discussion of the penultimate draft with colleagues at a work-in-progress luncheon at the University of Chicago Law School.