2012.08.05

David W. Wood

"Mathesis of the Mind": A Study of Fichte's Wissenschaftslehre and Geometry

David W. Wood, "Mathesis of the Mind": A Study of Fichte's Wissenschaftslehre and Geometry, Rodopi, 2012, 304 pp., $87.75 (pbk), ISBN 9789042034914.

Reviewed by Daniel Breazeale, University of Kentucky


Readers of J.G. Fichte are accustomed to encountering obiter dicta concerning mathematics and the parallels between geometry and philosophy. From the earliest inception of the project of the Wissenschaftslehre (in the Eigne Meditationen über ElementarPhilosophie/Practische Philosophie manuscript from the winter of 1793/94 and the "Zurich lectures" from the early months of 1794) until the very end of his career (e.g., in his 1813 Introductory Lectures on the Wissenschaftslehre at the University of Berlin) and at nearly every stage in between, we find Fichte declaring that his goal is to construct a system of philosophy that can "measure itself against geometry," in the sense that it will have the same "self-evidence," the same "determinacy" or precision, and the same "irrefutability" or universal validity as mathematics.

He made no secret of his ambition to become "the Euclid of philosophy." Accordingly, he often stressed the deep similarities between the methods of geometry and philosophy: both are synthetic and a priori disciplines; both begin by "postulating" the performance of a certain mental act (whether "drawing a line" or "thinking the I"); both employ a distinctive "genetic" or "synthetic" method of construction within pure intuition; and both rest, in the end, upon an appeal to what is allegedly immediately self-evident -- something that one can only "see" directly for oneself and can never realize simply by means of discursive argumentation. Thus he describes his new system as the "mathesis of reason itself" (GA, I/7: 160[1]) and even, in the unfinished Neue Bearbeitung der W.L. 1800, makes a serious attempt to provide a presentation of his system more geometrico, with its own postulates, definitions, theorems, and corollaries, all connected by means of a priori "constructions."

It is therefore hardly surprising that Fichte would recommend the study of mathematics (that is, geometry, which he considered to be virtually identical with mathematics) as the best intellectual preparation for the study of his system. It may, however, come as a surprise to find him claiming that geometry itself requires a foundation in a still higher science, one that can demonstrate the very possibility of mathematics and of its application to experience; and to find him hence describing the Wissenschaftslehre as "the mathesis of mathesis" (GA,I/7: 156). Somewhat surprising as well are his occasional and independent forays into pure mathematics, as for example in a note to the first, 1794 edition of Ueber den Begriff der Wissenschaftslehre, where he not only denies the possibility of "squaring the circle" by inscribing within it a polygon with an infinite number of sides, but insists that the only real lines are straight ones, whereas curved lines are merely collections of points and not really lines at all. By far the most sustained instances of Fichte's efforts to contribute to mathematics is contained in the lectures on the Wissenschaftslehre he delivered at Erlangen in 1805, in which he proposed his own "original" or "archetypical" geometry, which he understood to be a discipline presupposed by and more fundamental than ordinary or Euclidian geometry (see GA, II/9: 124-37).

Such claims did not go unnoticed by Fichte's contemporaries, many of whom chastised him severely for dabbling in a field in which he seemed to lack any professional expertise -- or even basic competence. His mathematical ideas were roundly rejected by J.S. Beck as unworthy of discussion and by F.K. Forberg as largely false, while J.B. Erhard complained about Fichte's "idiotic and ignorant arrogance" in the field of mathematics and one of his most talented students, J.F. Herbart, took it upon himself to provide his professor with private instruction in the subject. Subsequent generations of scholars have largely shared this dismissive attitude toward Fichte's comments on mathematics, while at the same time ignoring or downplaying the implications of his stress on the parallels between the methods and characteristic features of philosophy and geometry.

David Wood's new book on these topics is therefore a particularly welcome and original contribution, one that is likely to come as something of a revelation to most scholars and students of Fichte and of German idealism. The book has two declared aims. The first is to take Fichte seriously as a philosopher of mathematics and to present a sympathetic account of his work, an account based largely, though by no means exclusively, upon the dozen or so pages of the Erlangen Logic devoted to "original geometry," a text that, as Wood notes, presents Fichte's "philosophy of mathematics in nuce" and is, as such, "unique in the Fichtean oeuvre" (p. 33). First published in 1993, this text has been almost entirely ignored by scholars, and one of the many valuable services of Wood's book is that it includes as an Appendix a complete and accurate English translation of the excerpt in question. Wood's second aim is to identify and to explore the precise influence of the method of geometry on the Wissenschaftslehre and to assess Fichte's own claims concerning the parallels between his philosophy and mathematics. Wood fully accomplishes both of these aims, while along the way providing his readers with a wealth of valuable information concerning the history of mathematics and Fichte's understanding of that history, as well as information concerning similarities and differences between his views concerning mathematics and those of others, such as Euclid, Kant, and Maimon. He also relates Fichte's philosophy of mathematics to certain later, nineteenth and twentieth century developments in geometry.

The first, second, and fourth of Wood's five chapters are concerned primarily with Fichte's "philosophy of mathematics" and the third and fifth with the relationship between geometry and the Wissenschaftslehre. In addition, there is an introduction that surveys the small amount of previous research on this topic, considers Fichte's own acquaintance with mathematics, and provides a brief summary of the contents of each chapter. A short conclusion summarizes the results of the previous chapters.

What kind of training in mathematics did Fichte have? At Schulpforta he was exposed to the rudiments of mathematics, including geometry (but not directly to Euclid). He also appears to have embarked upon an independent study of the topic while in Leipzig in 1790, at precisely the same time he was engaged in his first serious study of Kant.[2] Wood plausibly suggests that his renewed interest in geometry may well have been influenced by Kant's views on that subject in the first Critique and that his independent study of the subject may be have been guided by J. F. Schultz's Anfangsgründe der reinen Mathesis (1790).[3] As Wood notes, Fichte was less interested in the quantitative than in the qualitative aspects of mathematics; i.e., he was less interested in mathematical calculations than in the character of mathematical thinking and evidence. It appears that he was entirely unacquainted with calculus and other forms of higher mathematics, but it is certain that he was primarily interested in geometry, which he often treated as a synonym for mathematics in general. He remained fascinated with this discipline for the rest of his life. He refers to mathematics again and again in his writings from the Jena, Erlangen, and Berlin periods and never hesitates to express his own views on those mathematical issues and problems that particularly interested him, such as the so-called "problem of the parallels" associated with Euclid's fifth postulate. He continued to cite geometry as the paradigm of a certain and universally valid science and never wavered in his commitment to producing a system of philosophy that could "measure itself against geometry."

Chapter One provides an overview of Fichte's philosophy of mathematics, and it is here that Wood begins his serious effort "to reconstruct Fichte's principal views" on various mathematical topics (p. 10), largely, though not entirely, on the basis of the discussion of "original geometry" in the Erlangen Logic. He begins with a discussion of Fichte's general views concerning the following features of mathematics and of the philosophy of mathematics: (1) Mathematics is the best extant example of a genuine science, possessing both its internal and external features: self-evident certainty and systematic form. (2) Whereas the mathematician simply presupposes the existence of those objects that populate his domain of inquiry, the (transcendental) philosopher of mathematics must inquire concerning the ontological status of these objects and determine the conditions for their possibility. One of the tasks of the Wissenschaftslehre is therefore to provide geometry with a justification and deduction that it is unable to provide on its own. (3) The method of mathematics combines construction, intuition, and deduction. Such a method is synthetic rather than analytic. (4) Mathematical knowledge is self-evident and certain. It is therefore more secure than that of any of the other sciences. (5) As mentioned, the philosopher of mathematics has the additional task of determining the ontological status of the objects of this science. According to Wood, Fichte's views on this topic place him squarely in the tradition of "mathematical Platonism or neo-Platonism," inasmuch as his "original geometry" is concerned with the independently existing original "archetypes" of those spatial figures that are constructed a priori in Euclidian geometry and encountered in a very impure form within sensible experience.

This chapter also includes a discussion of what Wood calls the nine "elements of Fichte's philosophy of mathematics," as presented in the Erlangen lectures: (1) Geometry is the "ground" of all mathematics, and pure geometry deals with the abstract or formal determinations of space. (2) Arithmetic (of which Fichte considered calculus to be merely a part) is based on geometry, though the "space" of arithmetic (the space of numbers, so to speak) is, unlike that of geometry, not infinitely divisible. (3) Algebra, which is barely mentioned by Fichte, is an example of a merely "formal" science and not a "real" one like geometry or philosophy. (4) Fichte distinguishes the "real infinite" from the "mathematical infinite." The latter (like Hegel's "bad infinite") is simply the infinity of a rule or procedure that can be carried out ad infinitum, whereas the infinite itself is a real totality, albeit one that cannot be conceptually grasped. (5) Unlike the science of mathematics, the philosophy of mathematics is a science that investigates and establishes the very possibility of mathematics. (6) Geometry possesses certain irreducible and original or archetypical elements (Ur-Elemente). These are the objects not of ordinary (that is, Euclidian) geometry but of what Fichte calls "original geometry," a "geometry posited through pure reason" (II/9: 129 and 133-34) and graspable only be means of geometrical or "intelligible" intuition. Perhaps the most peculiar and distinctive feature of Fichte's difficult conception of these archetypical geometrical elements is the function of directionality in their definition. As Woods notes, the purpose of these absolute elements is, in the case of the archetypical diameter, to provide an absolute standard or "absolute direction'" and, in that of the archetypical perpendicular, to provide a standard of measurement or location, which can be applied to the objects of ordinary geometry and which Fichte thought could provide the key to the solution to various geometrical problems, including the parallel problem. (7) According to Fichte, the latter problem represents a "dubious blemish on geometry" (GA, II/9: 231), which can be resolved only by referring to a norm provided by the "archetypical line" or "original diameter" with a "original direction" of its own. (8) As early as 1793, Fichte had recognized that one of the tasks facing the philosophy of mathematics is to deduce the three dimensions of space, and he thought that this could be accomplished by treating them as universal forms of thought in abstraction from experience. (9) Finally, it is up to the philosophy of mathematics to provide the science of mathematics with a formal language to express what the mathematician can only construct and intuit.

Chapter Two goes somewhat more deeply into the theory of "original geometry" outlined in the preceding chapter and relates it to discussions among mathematicians concerning the distinction between "analytic" and "synthetic" geometry, to Euclid's concept of geometry, to Kant's philosophy of mathematics, and even to subsequent efforts in the 19th and 20th centuries by mathematicians and philosophers of mathematics such as Jacob Steiner, K.G.C. von Staudt, and Felix Klein to construct a purely synthetic or "projective geometry."[4] Wood emphasizes the following differences between Fichte's "original geometry" and the geometries of Euclid and Kant: (1) Fichte's original or archetypical geometry takes as its new, non-Euclidian and non-arbitrary, starting point the meeting of the archetypical diameter and perpendicular at the "archetypical point" (the absolute center, which Fichte associates with the I), as well as the freedom of the I. "Geometry, " he writes, "arises through the free acting of my I, by moving the point into a line in space. Geometry could never arise solely from space and the point" (IV/3: 24). What is generated in this way is nothing less than "ordinary" geometry. (2) As mentioned above, Fichte was convinced that his original geometry offered a new solution to the parallel problem. As Wood summarizes it, "the essence of Fichte's solution . . . is to posit a normal or normalizing line as an absolute standard for determining the angle and establishing the correct parallelisms of any given line" (p. 97). (3) According to Fichte, every line must be understood as a continuous whole with its own direction, from which he inferred that the concept of "straightness" was contained in the very concept of a line. He thus rejected the notion that a line consists of an infinite number of discrete points, as well as the very notion of a "curved line." Wood's discussion of these controversial claims is particularly clear and illuminating.

The remainder of Chapter Three is devoted to a closer examination of Fichte's "mathematical Platonism" (which Wood contrasts with mathematical logicism, formalism, and intuitionism). One might have thought that Fichte's philosophy of mathematics would be an unambiguous example of "intuitionism."  But, as Wood points out, whereas mathematical intuitionists such as L.E.J. Brouwer treat mathematical objects as subjective mental constructs, Fichte grants "objective existence, universal validity and non-temporal laws to the sphere of mathematics" and appears to claim that such objects "reside in an ideal, non-temporal and non-causal realm, and ontologically speaking, exist as eternal and unchangeable archetypes or ideas" (p. 110). Fichte's philosophy of mathematics, according to Wood, is "Platonic" in the following respects: (1) Both Plato and Fichte view knowledge of mathematical laws and propositions as invariable, eternal, and universal. (2) Like Plato, Fichte seems to grant the ideal elements a "higher" form of existence than the sensible ones. (3) Fichte too speculated occasionally concerning the "Divine origin" of mathematical objects (see Staatslehre, GA, II/16: 147). (4) Again like Plato, Fichte often recommended the study of mathematics as the best training for the would-be philosopher.

Chapter Three addresses the place of mathematical terms and operations such as "intuition," "first principle," "axioms," "postulates," and "construction" in Fichte's various presentations of the Wissenschaftslehre. Here Wood expertly exploits some of Fichte's explicit comments (especially in various writings around 1800 and in his 1813 introductory lectures on the Wissenschaftslehre) concerning the similarities and differences between his own method of "construction in intuition" and the method of geometry. Though certainly interesting and appropriate, much of this discussion covers ground that will be more familiar to scholars than the preceding account of Fichte's philosophy of mathematics. With respect to the starting-point of philosophy and geometry (whether this is described as a "first principle," an "axiom," or a "postulate"), Wood emphasizes that what is crucial is that each science begins with an invitation to the reader or student to do something himself, to think in a particular way, to construct something in imagination, and to intuit the results of the same, along with the process through which this result was obtained. But there are also important differences between the first principle or postulate of the Wissenschaftslehre and that of geometry. The postulates of philosophy and mathematics have, of course, very different contents; that of geometry is received "from outside" and assigns geometry the task of "limiting space," whereas that of philosophy is self-generated and assigns philosophy the task of discerning the I's own necessary ways of acting. According to Wood, however, the main difference is this: "the first postulates of geometry are theoretical, whereas the first principle of the Wissenschaftslehre is practical" (p. 141)[5], and he then goes on to characterize geometrical construction as "technical, sensible, and free" and philosophical construction as "free and infinite," a characterization to which I shall return.[6]

From a consideration of the starting-point of geometry and philosophy, Wood turns to an examination of the roles of "intuition" and "construction" in each. The topic of "intellectual intuition" and what this means for Fichte is, of course, a difficult and controversial one, and Wood's discussion of it is sober and well-informed. He begins with a discussion of Kant's distinction between sensible and intellectual intuition and then shows how Fichte transforms the meaning of the latter term, while at the same time introducing a new distinction between the kind of pure intuition encountered in geometry (which Fichte calls "geometrical" or "intelligible" intuition) and the even "purer" kind of "intellectual" intuition encountered in philosophy. Wood points out very perceptively that whereas Kant appeals to his own account of pure geometrical intuition to justify his theory of sensible intuition, Fichte appeals to the same kind of geometrical intuition to justify his theory of intellectual intuition and to serve as a model for the latter. This is by far the best available account of the intimate relationship between geometrical and intellectual intuition in the context of the Wissenschaftslehre.

A priori "construction" is, according to Fichte, an essential feature of both geometry and philosophy, and Wood introduces this topic by referring to both Kant's and Maimon's views on a priori construction and then contrasting these views with Fichte's. Again, this is material with which many scholars will be familiar. They are not, however, likely to be acquainted with Fichte's very interesting comments on the differences between mathematical and philosophical construction in the context of the "theory of the image" or Bildlehre he articulates in his 1813 lecturesWood's detailed discussion of this text is therefore particularly valuable, albeit somewhat truncated. It concludes rather too summarily with a distinction between four different types of construction: technical construction by means of instruments; sensible construction either in imagination or in a sensible diagram, which is presumably the kind of construction encountered in ordinary geometry; free construction of geometrical objects in pure spatial intuition, which establishes the possibility of the preceding category of objects and is the kind of construction required in the case of Fichte's archetypical geometrical elements; and finally free infinite construction. Whereas the first three apply to geometry, the latter applies to philosophy alone. I will return to this topic as well.

Chapter Four is devoted to Fichte's conception of space and includes more detailed examinations of his understanding of points, lines, planes, and solids, with an emphasis upon his philosophical interpretations of these geometrical elements. Here Wood calls attention to the considerable differences between Fichte's views of space, etc. and those of Kant (and Euclid). One of the more interesting aspects of this discussion is the close connection it reveals between Fichte's larger theory of the practical and theoretical activities of the I and his conception of the basic elements of geometry, with the ideal point being "the image of the I" (GA, II/6: 288) and the ideal line (which, one will recall, is for Fichte always directional) being, as it were, the image of the activity -- and hence of the freedom -- of the I: "the line is the schema or the form of forward motion" (GA, II/5: 400).

Worthy of special mention is Wood's excellent discussion of the image of "drawing a line," an image of which Fichte was exceptionally fond and which recurs often in his writings. The main point of this discussion is to point out how the activity of drawing a line in thought or imagination (not on paper) is intended to serve as a "propaedeutic or preliminary exercise for those students of the Wissenschaftslehre who cannot directly proceed to intellectual intuition" (p. 219).[7] What is crucial for Fichte is that the activity of drawing a line be grasped as a "free self-activity of the imagination" (GA, IV/3: 34), of which one can become aware only by means of an immediate "intellectual" intuition.

This chapter also includes an excellent discussion of Fichte's somewhat difficult theory of space and of how it differs from Kant's. These differences are as follows: (1) Fichte, unlike Kant, denies the real possibility of empty space, since for him all spatial determination depends upon and thus presupposes some concrete objects that fill space; i.e., he deduces matter along with space. (2) Unlike Kant, Fichte purports to provide a genetic deduction of space and not a mere "explication" of its concept. Whereas Kant infers the ideality of objects from the ideality of space and time, Fichte infers the ideality of the latter from that of the former.[8] Hence space is not, as it is for Kant, something given a priori; instead, it is generated by the I, along with the objects that fill it. (3) Fichte, unlike Kant, grants no special status to time, but treats time and space as "intimately interlinked" (GA, II/4: 91). Each can be measured only in terms of the other.

Chapter Five examines in more detail the connections between the Wissenschaftslehre and geometry, many of which have already been mentioned in the preceding chapters. Here again, Wood stresses the parallels between Fichte's and Plato's views of mathematics (i.e., geometry) as an "intellectual propaedeutic" to philosophy, a point that is emphasized by Fichte both in the earlier and later versions of his system. In discussing this topic Wood examines the possible influence of the writings of the Swiss pedagogue J.H. Pestalozzi upon Fichte's views concerning the educational value of mathematics. He also calls attention to Fichte's claims (in his notes for private lessons he gave in 1803 and in his plans for the proposed curriculum of the new university in Berlin) concerning the propaedeutic value of mathematics for developing the powers of imagination and intuition.

Wood concludes this chapter by noting three similarities and two differences between the Wissenschaftslehre and geometry. Philosophy and mathematics are similar in the following ways: (1) Each rests upon what is claimed to be self-evident, though in the 1804 Wissenschaftslehre and in the 1805 lectures on logic Fichte introduces a distinction between the merely "factual" self-evidence of geometry and the "genetic evidence" of the WL (GA, II/8: 47). (2) The propositions of each science are completely "determinate," and this for the same reason: because they are grounded not in concepts but in determinate and immediate intuitions, intuitions encountered in the course of a priori acts of construction, which everyone must undertake for themselves. (3) Philosophy, like geometry, is irrefutable. Neither science appeals to discursive arguments; both intend upon the immediate and incontrovertible self-evidence of pure intuition. As for their differences: (1) Geometry is more abstract and formal than the Wissenschaftslehre. (2) Whereas geometrical constructions are based on a mixture of sensible and intelligible intuitions and are to that extent both technical and free, the constructions of the philosopher are based on intellectual intuition, which, says Wood, "generates free infinite constructions" (p. 261). Fichte himself explains the difference between these two types of construction by saying that in the case of geometry what is given or requested is a certain action and what is sought is the product of the action, whereas in the case of the Wissenschaftslehre what is given is a certain product (viz., the world of ordinary human experience or the "system of representations accompanied by a feeling of necessity") and what has to be sought are the necessary actions by virtue of which this product is present (see GA, IV/3: 36 and GA, II/5: 344). Wood glosses this (somewhat problematically) as follows:

In geometry there is Notwendigkeit, necessity, there are strict laws and rules for spaces and the elements of space; we cannot arbitrarily change them and invent our own rules. However, by means of our power of imagination we are free to choose where to put a point, when and where to draw a line in space. Thus, philosophically speaking, in theWissenschaftslehre there is pure freedom, whereas in geometry there is a limit to our freedom. And of course, as a system of transcendental philosophy the Wissenschaftslehre was to be a philosophy of freedom par excellence"(p. 263).

Wood concludes his book simply by summarizing the contents of the preceding chapters and claiming that he has achieved his two aims. I agree fully with this conclusion. The author of this book has accomplished something that no one before him has even attempted. He has demonstrated that Fichte does indeed possess a coherent and original "philosophy of mathematics" and even propounds a "new model of geometry,"[9] one that deserves closer attention than it has received. He also has shown that the connections between geometry and the Wissenschaftslehre are deep and significant, especially significant for an understanding the method of Fichte's system.[10]

Having described the contents of Wood's monograph, indicating the importance and originality of his achievement, and expressing my admiration, I would like to conclude by expressing certain questions and reservations concerning three controversial aspects of his interpretation.

First of all, concerning Fichte's "mathematical Platonism": If Fichte really did embrace the Platonic view of the independent existence of mathematical objects that Wood attributes to him (and which appears to be warranted by the text of the Erlangen Logic), then this raises serious questions concerning the overall ontology of the Wissenschaftslehre. If it is indeed the case, as Fichte claimed throughout the 1790's, that all Sein is Gesetzsein and that all reference to genuinely "mind independent" objects or things in themselves is proscribed by theWissenschaftslehre, which must therefore strictly confine itself to "the circle of consciousness," then where does this leave mathematical objects and what does this entail concerning the "higher being" of the same? This is an issue that must be addressed by anyone who ventures to combine Fichtean with Platonic "idealism."[11]

Secondly, I question the claim that the difference between the "postulates" of geometry and those of the Wissenschaftslehre is that the former are purely "theoretical" whereas the latter are simply "practical." This seems to me to miss one of the central advantages of starting with the Tathandlung in which the I "simply posits itself": namely, that such a starting point involves the immediate union of theoretical and practical moments. In positing itself the I is practical, to be sure; it does something -- it posits itself. At the same moment, however, it is equally theoretical; it knows something -- namely, itself.

Finally, even though Fichte himself in his 1813 lectures characterizes philosophical construction as "free and infinite," I think it is problematic to frame the difference between mathematical and philosophical construction, as Wood does, in terms of the distinction between necessary and free construction.[12] Of course, both are "free" in the sense that each must and can only be freely undertaken. But once one has done this, once one has "posited the I" for oneself "as an I," then there is little remaining space for freedom. On the contrary, Fichte's view (at least in his Jena writings) appears to be that the additional acts of the I constructed by the transcendental philosophy as necessary conditions for the possibility of the freely posited Tathandlung are one and all necessary and that the entire process of construction is therefore necessary as well. Indeed, the role of "intellectual intuition" (which Fichte also refers to in this context as "inner intuition," "attentiveness," and "reflection") is here simply to confirm -- through the immediate self-evidence of such intuition -- the necessity in question.


[1] GA J. G. Fichte-Gesamtausgabe der Bayerischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, ed. Erich Fuchs, Reinhard Lauth†, and Hans Gliwitzky† (Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 1964ff.).

[2] "I have particularly acquired a taste for mathematics, which I am also teaching" (Fichte to Johanna Rahn, November 2, 1790).

[3] Schultz was a professor of mathematics and Hofprediger in Königsberg, a friend of Kant and author of the influential Prüfung der Kantischen Critik der reinen Vernunft (1789 and 1792). Fichte became personally acquainted with Schultz and his family during his stay in Königsberg during the summer of 1791, when he was a frequent guest in their home. In the "Second Introduction" to the Wissenschaftslehre he asserts that it was to Schultz that he first confided his bold project of "basing all of philosophy upon the pure I" (GA, I/4: 225).

[4] Wood also provides an informative account of how Fichte's remarks on mathematics were received -- and admired -- by twentieth century mathematicians such as Hermann Weyl, Andreas Speiser and by the French philosopher of mathematics Jules Vuillemin, all of whom seem to have been struck by the sheer originality of some of Fichte's mathematical ideas.

[5] "The Fichtean postulate is inherently practical, and grounded in the practical (moral) nature and activity of the human being" (p. 145). "Fichte's system is grounded in the primacy of practical reason, of acting, and his first axiom or postulate is none other than that of the absolute I, which as a purely rational being is beyond all empirical self-consciousness, and as pure will is the necessary condition for it" (p. 147).

[6] This chapter also includes a useful discussion of how Fiche's use of the term "postulate" differs from that of J.S. Beck and suggests that the Wissenschaftslehre nova methodoshould be viewed, at least in part, as a response to Beck. The main difference between them is that for Beck a postulate is always supposed to be grounded in some "fact," orTatsache, whereas the Wissenschaftslehre is grounded in a "fact/act" or Tathandlung.

[7] "In the Fichtean system of philosophy the drawing of a geometrical line is intimately related to the activity of the intelligence, and depends on an 'inner agility of your spirit' (GA,I/6L 237)" (p. 222).

[8] "We require the ideality of time and space in order to be able to place ideal objects" (GA, I/2: 335).

[9] "On account of these significant departures from Euclid and Kant, and because of Fichte's integration of original, infinite, and Platonistic elements into his mathematical theories, we can no longer speak of Fichte's model of geometry as identical with the traditional Euclidian model of geometry or with a Kantian version of the same. Instead, one is justified in speaking of an original Fichtean model of geometry" (pp. 119-29)

[10] "The Wissenschaftslehre may be read as a form of philosophical mathesis, or as a 'mathesis of the mind'; that is to say, as a mathematical theory of the structure and activity of the rational mind or spirit. Geometry is not simply a rigorous inspiration for Fichte, but serves as a structural and scientific touchstone for his own methodology and philosophical system" (p. 12).

[11] Perhaps carried away by these parallels with Plato, Wood at one point goes so far as to speculate that Fichte's transcendental idealism "is directly inspired by his geometrical idealism." (p. 10), though he offers no evidence or support for this rather dubious claim.

[12] On p. 188 Wood cites the following passage from Fichte's 1797/98 lectures on Logic and Metaphysics, which contrasts mathematical and philosophical construction:

Maimon accuses the Kantian philosophy of not having any reality, for he asks: How can we apply a priori concepts to objects? He says, in mathematics we have insight into the reality of our concepts, and adds that we construct them ourselves. It is easy to see that this fits with the laws of our mind. However, just like in mathematics, so it is in the entire worldview, the sole difference is that in the constructing of the [geometric] world one is not conscious of the constructing, for it is something necessary and not free.

As I read this passage, what Fichte is claiming is precisely the opposite of what Wood seems to think (as evidenced by his interpolation of "geometric" in the last sentence). It seems clear that what Fichte is asserting here is that philosophical construction -- in which we construct for ourselves those necessary acts through which the I originally constructs or generates its "entire worldview" -- is, unlike geometrical construction, "something necessary and not free."