2012.09.11

Anthony Quinton

Of Men and Manners

Anthony Quinton, Of Men and Manners, Anthony Kenny (ed.), Oxford University Press, 2012, 288pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199694556.

Reviewed by Alexander Klein, California State University, Long Beach


Sir  Anthony Quinton was an intellectual fox who must have suffered through our age of unrelenting hedgehog-ism. This posthumous collection of previously unpublished or uncollected essays darts from topics as diverse as the obscure intellectual antecedents to Bacon (like George Agricola and Bernardino Telesio), to the significance of one of Coleridge's countryside houses, to the proper functioning of swear words, to the (in his view) execrable rise of cultural studies in the humanities. The book is divided into two parts, the longer on historical figures ("Of Men") and the shorter on values ("Of Manners").

Probably no one reviewer is qualified to offer serious criticism of secondary literature on Kant, T. H. Green, John Dewey, Bergson, Whitehead, A. J. Ayer, and Quine -- all of whom appear here in the more substantially philosophical articles. The reviewer's problem is compounded when one adds the more purely historical commentaries on the likes of John Radcliffe, La Mettrie, Richard Monckton Milnes, and T. E. Hulme, to say nothing of the pieces devoted to the theory of value. So rather than attempt a deep analysis of any one of these very different articles, in what follows I will distinguish seven thematic threads that tie together this motley collection of essays.

The first theme is stylistic. Quinton's writing is unapologetically accessible, even anti-scholarly in the sense that the book contains virtually no footnotes, endnotes, or citations of any kind. He could be describing his own work when he praises Gilbert Ryle as "less academically respectable and conformist" than Ayer. Ryle eschewed "all the standard etiquette of philosophical writing: the identification of aims, the footnotes, the polite references to Professor This and Doctor That" (149). Quinton himself studiously avoids all this "standard etiquette." Thus, chapter 6 appears indebted to Strawson's psychologistic reading of Kant, but Quinton seems to think it would be too stuffy to say so.

Even quotations and controversial interpretations often go unattributed -- so that if you wanted to know where Dewey (for example) is supposed to have committed himself to the view that "our conceptual apparatus is a wholly free construction, imposed by us on the indefinitely plastic tissue of our environment" (Quinton's words, 98), you would be out of luck. Informed readers will know that Dewey extensively analyzed the myriad ways the environment does constrain our conceptual apparatus (e.g., see Dewey 1907/1916). So it would be helpful if Quinton had supplied even a brief hint about which essays or books his controversial interpretation relies on.

One result of this breezy style is that Men and Manners often feels like a lecture for undergraduates (an unusually witty lecture, in places). The audience is implicitly asked to accept the interpretations on offer simply on the good word of the professor behind the lectern. In fact, Quinton probably intended most of these essays for non-specialists:

A part, perhaps a very large part, of the importance of philosophy . . . is that it is taught to, and studied by, people the vast majority of whom are not going in the rest of their lives to be philosophers at all, in any but the most marginal way. (159)

Still, even an engaged undergraduate is apt to be frustrated by the lack of scholarly apparatus, particularly in cases like the Dewey chapter where controversial interpretive claims go unsubstantiated.

A second theme in Men and Manners is a concern for the provenance of ideas. Examples include the essay on A. J. Ayer, which undertakes to show in some detail that Language, Truth, and Logic "is almost wholly composed of pre-existing material" (144) -- in other words, that the book repackages (sometimes effectively) arguments that had already been developed by other philosophers. Similarly, an earlier chapter attempts to debunk the myth that Francis Bacon's work was wholly unprecedented by identifying earlier philosophers who defended theses we now think of as uniquely Baconian.

Quinton offers some intriguing remarks about the value of such historical work for philosophy. He writes,

An unstated assumption behind this excavation of Ayer's intellectual borrowings is that a thinker's place in the history of philosophy is determined by the originality of the interesting or influential things that he says. I do, indeed, believe that assumption to be broadly correct. (149)

The results of this excavation cast Ayer in a rather unfavorable light. But Quinton pulls in a different direction in the earlier chapter on Bacon (whom he holds in higher regard):

A philosopher who came out with doctrines of which there had been no previous intimation would appear to be, and almost certainly would be, a charlatan. There have always been plenty of such desperately autonomous thinkers, and we are right to pay them little attention. (5)

The latter point is insightful, and it is not inconsistent with the former. Quinton presumably thinks effective philosophy must strike a careful balance between outright originality and connection with the tradition to which it purports to contribute. This would explain his longstanding interest in the originality or derivativeness of other philosophers' ideas -- an interest also reflected in the chapters on La Mettrie, Hulme, Bergson and Whitehead, and a partially autobiographical capstone piece to Part I entitled "The Rise, Fall, and Rise of Epistemology."

A third theme is philosophical. Quinton often claims that some (but not all) spatial and temporal relations are directly perceived, while some other structural features of the world are mind-supplied. Thus he often complains that some philosopher or other wrongly thinks that all worldly structure is mind-supplied, with little push-back from the environment (Kant, Dewey, Green, Bergson, Whitehead -- he makes the same point in a chapter arguing against any real metaphysical distinction between humans and animals). Less often, he complains that other philosophers (Plato, Confucius) wrongly claim that no worldly structure is mind-supplied.

Some of these criticisms are genuinely intriguing. For instance, the Kant chapter's big question is where the structure of the "common world of experience" comes from. Kant thinks it comes from the application of "some piece of mental apparatus" -- "the forms of intuition and the categories" -- to the "manifold of sensation." Quinton asks, "Is the order of the common world wholly imposed on it by the mind or is it determined by intrinsic features of the manifold of sensation? Kant seems firmly committed to the first option" (p. 49). But Quinton points out that this position makes it hard to explain how different persons can occupy one and the same spatio-temporal world. That is, it is hard to see why the particular spatial and temporal relations my own mind imposes on my manifold of sensations should match the spatial and temporal relations your mind imposes.

Because of a total lack of citation of any secondary literature, however, it is difficult for a non-specialist to know how (or whether) other scholars have treated this problem. Quinton simply claims that "none of the many commentators I have studied" address this problem in Kant (59).

A few metaphorical remarks help establish Quinton's own view of the relative contributions of mind and world to our ideas of order. For instance, in criticizing Dewey for giving the mind too much freedom in creating ideas of worldly structure, he picturesquely suggests that there is a middle ground between biscuits and clear broth -- minestrone soup (98). Perhaps his most compelling illustration concerns butchery. Meat (he claims) is carved so differently across the world that the names for meat parts often resist direct translation; so there is a sense in which "carving nature at the joints" involves social construction even though the physical structure of the beast getting carved clearly sets some real constraints as well (113). I found these metaphors provocative if too-thinly substantiated.

A fourth theme concerns the history of literature in general, and of English-language poetry in particular. This theme first emerges in the early chapter on Coleridge, which discusses a house (Nether Stowey) the poet occupied for two of the most productive years of his life. And in a later chapter, Quinton assesses the literary impact of the sometimes poet and travel-writer Milnes. Quinton's assessment is grounded in a concise and capable review of standard English poetry anthologies (which apparently overlook Milnes' verse) as well as in the comparative successes of Milnes' fellow travel-writers like Warburton and Kinglake (69). And Chapter 11 discusses Hulme's influence on 20th-century poetry.

A fifth theme is a special concern for historical figures who have been associated with Oxford University. Quinton was a Fellow at All Souls and New College, eventually becoming President of Trinity, which helps explain why a book like this might contain a longer chapter on the now obscure doctor John Radcliffe who is memorialized in the names of several buildings and structures at Oxford. Oxford-centrism also emerges in Quinton's  discussions of T. H. Green and A. J. Ayer, both of whom he takes the time to place in the intellectual context of that university's history.

A sixth theme that emerges especially in Part II is the claim that morality is merely one among a plurality of values. Quinton argues that we consult non-moral values for determining "the greater part of conduct," e.g., when we choose an apple over a banana, or when we decide what clothing to wear on any given day (166). He calls "prudence" the "rational pursuit of a good life by an individual" (174), and since deciding how to balance moral and non-moral reasons for conduct is a key part of prudence, "prudence is sovereign over morality" (175).

A final, seventh theme emerges in two uncharacteristically shrill chapters (19 and 20) that advocate a broadly conservative social and academic-political outlook. These essays feel dated, linked to the academic culture wars of the 90s; indeed they were originally given as 1992 Cook Memorial Lectures. They have not aged well.

In a rare footnote, Quinton opens the second of these chapters by acknowledging a debt to Tenured Radicals, Roger Kimball's 1990 screed. Like Kimball, Quinton is worried about the literary canon's dismantling at the hands of liberal professors who think literary judgments should be grounded in political judgments. And he repeats Kimball's basic line, that the student radicals of 1968 had become the tenured radicals of the early 90s (233). Quinton goes on to ridicule Continental philosophers like Derrida, Foucault, Habermas, and Heidegger. He portrays them as peddling a brand of gratuitous obscurity that exemplifies the "anti-rational" principles at play among those opposed to the canon of "Dead White Males" (220). Quinton's main criticism of these figures is not very interesting -- it amounts to reproducing a few passages and summarily pronouncing them "simply babble, a sort of verbal delirium" (228). Thomas Kuhn and Paul Feyerabend are also represented as enemies of rationality. They are portrayed as "objectors to the supposedly supreme objectivity of natural science" (220), and treated as thereby unworthy of any serious engagement.

What the educators who criticize the literary canon are supposed to challenge directly (and what the philosophers he cites are supposed to challenge indirectly) is the very integrity of something called "high culture." Drawing on Matthew Arnold, Quinton defines "high culture" as "the best that has been thought and said in the world" (222).  Kimball was attacked even in relatively friendly reviews (e.g., Rosenblat 1990) for failing to say what should count as "the best" literature. Quinton is similarly mum on this matter, save for the passing claim that "best" is to be determined by long-term convergence of expert judgment (238). This view is not wholly implausible, but it does not square with other aspects of Quinton's discussion. I will return to this point below.

A key objection Quinton considers is that the existence of a literary canon imposes the "interests" of a minority group on everybody else. The thought is that worthwhile literature by various racial, gender, and economic groups has been unfairly excluded from the canon -- and this exclusion has deleterious psychological effects on the groups in question (224).

When it comes to gay writers, his response is that that group has "no real statistical cause for complaint" since five or six canonical poets who wrote in English were gay. He concedes that women may have a legitimate grievance: the charge that the canon's "selectors prefer works written by people like themselves over works written by other kinds of people which are of equal or greater merit" (225 -- emphasis in the original) may indeed be available to women, who have "a body of arguably undervalued work to appeal to." But he quickly adds that that argument "is not available to blacks or the poor" (226). It is not that Quinton thinks blacks and the poor have already been incorporated in the canon -- he explicitly says he thinks of the canon as including no blacks at all (225). Instead, his suggestion is that blacks and the poor simply have produced no works "of equal or greater merit" to those already included in the canon.

For a man as famously learned as Quinton, I find this line fundamentally perplexing. Quinton was writing in 1992, a time when works by Frederick Douglas, W. E. B. Du Bois, Booker T. Washington, Langston Hughes, Ralph Ellison, Zora Neale Hurston, Richard Wright, Alice Walker, and Toni Morrison (to reel off just a few) were hardly underground. In fact, expert opinion has long been trending towards an agreement that these and other minority writers have produced literature that should be incorporated in the canon. So if "the best" literature is a matter of converging expert opinion, it is hard to see how Quinton can consistently maintain that a completely black-free canon provides no "cause for complaint."

To me, the essays on academic politics overstep the boundaries of reasoned deliberation, containing passages that are simply mean-spirited. "Societies of the Third World that are minimally, and only very recently, literate are absent" from the canon because those cultures have not produced much serious literature. He continues, "stories about animal tricksters, orally conveyed, are part of the childhood of mankind and, apart from anthropologists, are principally of interest to children" (236).

Readers interested in value theory with a conservative slant would do well to skip the Cook lectures all together in favor of chapter 18. That essay packs considerable insight and nuance in a concise treatment of "man as a worker and producer, as an economic being" (213) rather than as a mere political or moral subject.

Despite the shallow combativeness of the two Cook lectures, Quinton is widely remembered as a charming, jovial, and sophisticated man. The essays here generally reflect his great wit and breadth of learning, and the popular style helps recommend the book to a group Quinton seems most eager to court: those William James called "seriously inquiring amateur[s] at philosophy" (James 1907/1975, 23).

References

Dewey, John (1907/1916), "The Control of Ideas by Facts", Essays in Experimental Logic, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 230-249.

James, William (1907/1975), Pragmatism. Edited by Fredson Bowers and Ignas K. Skrupskelis, Works of William James. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Kimball, Roger (1990), Tenured Radicals: How Politics Has Corrupted Our Higher Education. 1st ed. New York: Harper & Row.

Rosenblat, Roger (1990), "The Universities under Attack . . . ", The New York Times, April 22, 1990, 3.