Frank Jackson's Language, Names and Information plunges us back into the content wars of the 90's. In it, he develops a sui generis account of reference and content, of rigidity and possibility, which is sure to generate controversy for the boldness of its proposals. Jackson is drastic, for instance, in his views on Kripke's theory of the semantics of proper names, and on his 'internalist' account of the content of sentences. He proposes a return to narrow content, but provides an information-based account of it. In fact, this informational perspective serves as inspiration for most of the proposals in the book.
Let us consider some of the most enticing ideas presented by Jackson. We'll take a look at his non-standard view of the meaning of proper names and substance terms, and then go on to ponder his advocacy of a special form of content.
The Meaning of Proper Names
Jackson defends the idea that, in the case of the semantics of proper names, the reference relation supervenes on some natural relation. There is, then, some (relational) property of the referent that explains why a certain name refers to it. This is the property, described by Kripke in Naming and Necessity, that consisting in the existence of linguistic conventions that causally link uses of the name with an initial baptism of the referent with that name. Jackson's central tenet here, however, is that, contrary to widespread opinion, competent language users have knowledge of the relational property on which reference for proper names supervenes.
This knowledge is manifested, he thinks, for instance, in our referent identification practices: we go about them precisely by trying to trace back the causal chain that links the token of the name with its referent. Jackson's defense of this view in the first chapter of the book is quite impressive, dealing deftly with possible objections. He firmly argues that proficient adult users of a language are necessarily competent in the these identification practices.
In fact, the strength of his defense deeply contrasts with the stubbornness of defenders (for instance, Frege and Russell) of descriptivist reference theories based on non-linguistic properties of referred. How could these authors have missed such obvious and common reference-retracing practices as the ones Jackson describes,while, at the same time, proposing with insistence the idea that names are semantically equivalent to non-linguistic descriptions? What would be the reason for the surprise and praise with which causal theories of reference were received, if the practices are so familiar?
In any case, there is another point worth mentioning concerning Jackson's view on the semantics of proper names. What we have said up to now applies to proper names only. In particular, the 'Kripkean' property mentioned above concerns them exclusively. And rightly so, since the diversity of representational systems seems incompatible with a single story based on baptism and causal chains for all instances of the reference relation.
But, then, what do we do about this relation of reference itself, the one that supervenes, in different representational systems, on a variety of lower level relations. The semantically relevant issue would be to specify what this relation of referring is. The 'Kripkean' relational property is interesting because it characterizes how referring works in a certain context: the context of human languages containing proper names. But what about referring items in, for instance, mental languages? What about other sorts of expressions ―pertaining to different representational systems― for which it makes sense to say that they refer?
The 'Kripkean' property would then certainly not constitute the 'essence' of referring, and knowledge of it by competent speakers (required by Jackson) would not constitute knowledge of what referring is. It would rather be knowledge of how referring works in a particular context: i.e., of the conventions that govern the semantic use of proper names provided an information-managing purpose.
The Meaning of Substance Terms
A second issue that strongly draws the attention of the reader concerns how Jackson contemplates the semantics of substance terms such as "water". He maintains that the issue is too open to allow him to compromise with the idea of a certain use as the correct use of the term. This might be so (empirical linguistics should tell us), but it is worth remembering what has come to constitute one of the central tenets of the standard semantics for this sort of term: namely, the non-necessary and non-sufficient character of the components of what Putnam called the stereotype.
As a consequence of this fact, there are a variety of linguistic practices that seem explicitly excluded for competent speakers: for instance, to use natural class terms as abbreviations for conjunctions of predicates. Thus, the term "water" could never be used as Jackson's expression "the watery stuff", on pain of ceasing to be a substance term and instead becoming such a conjunction.
Furthermore, the properties of the stereotype may help users to identify portions of the referent of a substance like water, but they do so fallibly, and so, as is common knowledge in semantics, the reference relation cannot be determined by such properties.
A propos of the variability of the components of the stereotype, Jackson talks of the possibility, for natural class terms, of an imperfect or incomplete understanding of them. But there doesn't seem to be a perfect or complete understanding either -- one that, for instance, consisted in the grasping of a closed perfect list of learnable characteristics. Instead, as we know, what we find is a list of usually fallible external characteristics, and a possibly perfect or complete knowledge of the nature of the substance, obtained from its empirical study.
This idea of a complete understanding, which clashes so evidently with basic ontological and semantic tenets concerning substances and substance terms, seems to be one of the reasons that motivates Jackson's revival of the notion of narrow content. But why would we need narrow content provided we want to keep an informational perspective on language? Aren't 'informational' perspectives based precisely on broad content? Jackson reopens the issue and claims only narrow content can account for such perspectives in a satisfactory way.
He stipulates about understanding that it entails "knowing how things have to be in order to be in accord with the sentence" (p. 32). But this knowing cannot be a knowing of broad content, as it doesn't contemplate how things have to be in order to be the referent of the expressions in the sentence. For instance, the referent of "I" in a statement has to be the author of that statement. In the case of a proper name, it will be the entity at the end of the corresponding causal chain. None of this information appears specified in the broad content of ordinary sentences. Jackson's proposal is, however, similar to the one developed by David Israel and John Perry in "What is information?", where they propose to distinguish between pure and incremental contents, with the former including a specification of the way in which entities are referred to by the expressions in the sentence.
Now, it is common knowledge that broad or incremental content isn't enough to account for understanding, belief, and behavior. Either some sort of more fine-grained content has to be proposed to explain, for instance, differences in cognitive significance in sentences involving coreferential expressions, or these differences have to be explained in terms of other features of the structure of belief (modes of presentation, for instance; see Crimmins 1992, Perry 1990).
Jackson seems to think that we should take the first route, and construct a specific content that accounts for the extra information involved in this sort of situation. But, if we are concerned with subject matter, with what is said, the subject matter of "I have a beard" said by Frank Jackson seems to be the same as that of "Frank Jackson has a beard". Why not speak of the structure of the belief, of the expressions used, to account for the differences in cognitive significance between the two sentences? After all, the subject matter of a belief seems to be a very different sort of thing from the means one uses to express this belief. In any case, we know that although this extra information is not explicitly stated, it certainly may be invoked and exploited by the user. On the other hand, even if it is not explicit, it can become readily so.
Does all this grant the legitimacy of talk in terms of narrow content? I confess that I haven´t been able to derive this conclusion from my reading of Jackson.
Crimmins, M. 1992. Talk About Beliefs. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
Kripke, S. 1980. Naming and Necessity. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
Israel, D. and Perry, J. 1991. "What is Information?". In Philip Hanson (ed.). Information, Language and Cognition. Vancouver: University of British Columbia.
Perry, J. 1990. "Self-Notions". LOGOS: Philosophic Issues in Christian Perspective, Volume 11, 17-31.