2012.10.25

John Locke

Vindications of the Reasonableness of Christianity

John Locke, Vindications of the Reasonableness of Christianity, Victor Nuovo (ed.), Oxford University Press, 2012, cxi + 400pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199286553.

Reviewed by John Perry, University of Oxford


This volume is the fifteenth so far in the Clarendon Edition of the Works of Locke, the series produced by Oxford University Press and intended, ultimately, to provide critical editions for all of Locke's works. Although edited with meticulous care by Victor Nuovo, this edition of Locke's Vindications is likely of interest to specialists only.

Nuovo is one of the world's very best Locke scholars and throughout his career has made a compelling case for taking Locke's theological works more seriously; no doubt he hopes that will include a wider reading of these texts. He is right that we must read Locke as the theologian-philosopher that he considered himself to be, and not force him into the neat disciplinary quarantines of our university departments, which might tempt us to overlook what he says about God. So we cannot ignore Locke's theology. Yet there is no avoiding the fact that these particular texts are of only the narrowest theological interest. This in contrast to the Reasonableness itself, which deserves renewed attention (and for which there is already a Clarendon edition), and also in contrast to Nuovo's excellent collection John Locke: Writings on Religion.

All told, the present volume includes A Vindication of the Reasonableness of Christianity, A Second Vindication of the Reasonableness of Christianity, a previously unpublished fragment of a manuscript (of less than 200 words), and Que la Religion Chrétienne est Tres-Raisonnable, which is a French paraphrase that conflates the Reasonableness and its Vindications, written by Locke's friend, Pierre Coste. In addition, Nuovo provides introductions to each.

Rather than a general defense of the Reasonableness, both Vindications are targeted more narrowly at the Presbyterian John Edwards, who had accused Locke of being "all over Socinianized." (As the Reasonableness was published anonymously, Edwards could not at first be sure of its author, though he knew the rumors that it was Locke.) Their disagreement largely revolves around a relatively narrow concern: what to make of Locke's claim that the only necessary belief is that Jesus is the Messiah. (As he had written in Reasonableness, chapter five: "So that all that was to be believed for justification, was no more but this single proposition, that 'Jesus of Nazareth was the Christ, or the Messiah.'")

According to Edwards, this excludes all sorts of important doctrines, such as the Trinity and the atonement. Locke rejects this, though with a rather scattered shotgun blast. He identifies places that his text had implied something like the atonement; he points out that even those incapable of understanding complex theology can yet be saved and so the absolute doctrinal minimum must be quite low; and he argues that the doctrinal criteria were meant to function as membership criteria. That is, believing Jesus to be the Messiah is what it takes to become a Christian, but not all that a Christian must believe and do, just as a citizenship oath might make me an Englishman but would not be all that I must do to obey English law.

The problem in wading through all of this is that most of the substance is lost in quibbles about who said what where. Put bluntly, Edwards' and Locke's quarrel is long, boring, and repetitive. (The Second Vindication alone is a grueling 90,000 words; far longer than the Reasonableness itself. Such tedium was an unfortunate feature of Locke's other rebuttals. The three sequels to the Letter concerning Toleration are equally dull.)

This does not mean that the texts are not, in some general sense, of lasting importance to our understanding of Locke. As mentioned above, Nuovo's goal of having us read Locke as a theologian is extremely important, and we can already see this bearing fruit in political philosophers like Tim Stanton and Greg Forster. Prior to Nuovo's efforts (and those of others, mostly Cambridge School historians like Mark Goldie and John Dunn), the tendency had been to overlook Locke's theology, either because it was inconsequential to his legacy (as in Macpherson) or because it was a façade (as in Strauss). Nuovo and the others have won that fight, but this is only half the battle. It is a step in the right direction that we no longer pretend Locke's theology was only a veneer over his "real" concerns, yet reading him as a theologian means engaging with and evaluating his theology on its own terms. And much of the time, Locke's theology just isn't very good.

In an ironic way, the Vindications are part of the problem, for Edwards' critiques focus overwhelmingly on dogmatic rather than moral theology. The earliest responses to the Reasonableness had been ethical, and one of the valuable things we learn from the 200-word fragment included in this new volume is that Locke had first hoped to address these. The question there was whether punishment in the afterlife was necessary to restrain wrongdoing in this life. This would have been a promising launching point for further analysis.

Unfortunately, Locke was distracted from this by Edwards' attack. I read Locke's doctrinal concerns, which comprise the first eleven chapters of the Reasonableness, as a clearing-away project, making way for something he cares much more about: moral theology. The reason he spends so much time establishing his one doctrine, that Jesus is the Messiah, is because this will make most other questions of creedal orthodoxy go away. As Nuovo argues, his goal is to select a single, formal doctrine which will be immune from all controversies over orthodoxy, precisely because it can be filled with all sorts of different content -- or none at all.

Throughout the Reasonableness, Locke argued that two things were necessary for salvation (in the text, Locke gives "necessity" as a synonym for "reasonableness," which helps explain the book's title). One necessary thing is what to believe and the other is what to do. The first chapters address the former, and this is what receives Edwards' attention. The book's final chapters address the latter; in those chapters, Locke is much more interesting, and it is unfortunate that Edwards forced him onto such a long detour. In those final chapters we see one of the sharpest portrayals of the tension faced by early modern Christianity in deciding the continuing relevance of natural law under conditions of pluralism, and of the relation of revealed moral knowledge to moral truths that can be known apart from revelation. If Locke was going to spend 90,000 extra words developing any theme from the Reasonableness, much better for it to have been that.

The good news is that this volume is one of a pair Nuovo is editing for the Clarendon series. The other, John Locke: Theological Manuscripts, promises to be much more interesting, and more important for a wider audience. We can be grateful that he is such an extremely careful editor of complex manuscripts. The text itself is heavily and helpfully annotated, providing thorough historical background on even the most obscure references. I close with a minor complaint, though one worth registering. Like all of the Clarendon editions, the pages of the introduction are given in Roman numerals. Because these introductions commonly exceed 100 pages, this is very unwieldy for citation. There is a good reason Arabic numerals caught on.