Keith Donnellan

Essays On Reference, Language, and Mind

Keith Donnellan, Essays On Reference, Language, and Mind, Joseph Almog and Paolo Leonardi (eds.), Oxford University Press, 2012, 224pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199857999.

Reviewed by Antonio Capuano, Auburn University

Essays on Reference, Language, and Mind collects Keith Donnellan's classic essays on reference: "Reference and Definite Descriptions", "Putting Humpty Dumpty Together Again", "Proper Names and Identifying Descriptions", "Speaking of Nothing", "Speaker Reference, Descriptions, and Anaphora", "The Contingent A Priori and Rigid Designators", and "Kripke and Putnam on Natural Kind Terms".

At the end of the sixties and the beginning of the seventies, together with David Kaplan, Saul Kripke, and Hilary Putnam, Donnellan was one of the main contributors to the paradigm shift that took place in the philosophy of language and mind. The then dominant Fregean paradigm went under a fundamental critique and a new paradigm -- "direct reference" -- emerged. As Joseph Almog explains in the editor's preface, the volume

offers a unique two-tiered insight into this 1966-1970 turn. First, we get a new perspective on the distinct contribution of one of the main game changers, Keith Donnellan. Second, and more generally, we are offered a new -- somewhat surprising -- picture of what "the direct reference turn" was all about. (ix)

With the exception of the introduction written for the volume, all the other essays already appeared in print somewhere else and are all very well-known. Therefore, in this review, I'll not comment on them. I'll instead focus on two remarks Donnellan makes in the introduction hoping to show their importance to an understanding of his work on reference. Both concern his groundbreaking paper "Reference and Definite Descriptions". The first remark is the following:

Looking at the paper on reference and definite descriptions, I must confess that only one of the two writers mentioned as my targets, Bertrand Russell and Peter Strawson, could fairly be said to have held that definite descriptions are used to refer and that the entity referred to is identified in virtue of its having the properties mentioned in the description (plus properties assumed from the context of utterance). Of the two it is Peter Strawson who, in his (at the time of my paper's publication) widely read paper, 'On Referring', espouses this view . . . Strawson, then, is an example of one who holds an identifying descriptions view about definite descriptions. This, however, is not true of the second target of the paper, Bertrand Russell. (xv)

In the last forty years, the philosophical discussion on Donnellan's paper about reference and definite descriptions has mostly focused on the contrast between him and Bertrand Russell and almost ignored the contrast between him and Peter Strawson. A prominent and very influential example is Saul Kripke's seminal paper "Speaker's Reference and Semantic Reference" that explicitly focuses "on Donnellan versus Russell, leaving Strawson aside" (1977: 99). This focus has been unfortunate because it contributed to the blurring of Donnellan's original proposal. It has left many with the impression that Donnellan added little to Strawson on definite descriptions. The whole thing is really quite ironic. Of all the creative minds that came up in the late sixties, in my view, Donnellan was the most radical in rejecting the then traditional Fregean dominant outlook. It's not an accident that, unlike the other main figures in the turnaround, he questioned descriptivism on its most favourable terrain, i.e., definite descriptions.

Of course, it's not that the impression of a strong resemblance between Strawson and Donnellan is without basis. First, against Russell, in "On Referring" Strawson made the point that definite descriptions typically work as singular terms referring to objects. Second, Strawson emphasized that

"mentioning" or "referring", is not something an expression does; it is something that some one can use an expression to do. Mentioning, or referring to, something is characteristic of a useof an expression, just as "being about" something, and truth-or-falsity, are characteristic of a use of a sentence. (1950: 326)

Both remarks sound akin to Donnellan's approach. Third, as David Kaplan pointed out, Strawson

claims that in sentences with a definite description as subject, the definite description is a referring expression, not just in the sense of being a singular term, but seemingly also in the sense that the assertion one makes in using the sentence contains the denotation of the definite description as a constituent and does not involve the descriptive conditions, which are relegated to presuppositional status. (It is hard to see what else might serve as the assertion once the descriptive conditions are made presuppositional). (2012: 145)

If not the same, this is very close to the idea that Kaplan made popular and came to be, and still is, the standard way of understanding direct reference. A linguistic expression is directly referential if it occurs in a sentence expressing a singular rather than a general proposition. The often suggested view that when used referentially a definite description contributes an individual to the proposition expressed explains why Strawson's and Donnellan's points of view are often assimilated. However, on each of the aforementioned points the agreement between Donnellan and Strawson is only apparent. This is important to realize because seeing the distance between them helps to comprehend the original and innovative understanding Donnellan had of direct reference, one that had little to do with singular propositions and rigid designators.

Going backwards from the third to the first point mentioned, let me emphasize the differences between Strawson and Donnellan. First, unlike Strawson, Donnellan is not a friend of propositions. On the contrary, he believes that referential uses of definite descriptions raise questions about the notion of a proposition itself. Imagine someone referring to a spinster saying "her husband is kind to her". On Donnellan's view, the speaker said something true of the man to whom she is referring if he in fact is kind to her, regardless of whether one would "express this by 'It is true that her husband is kind to her'" (24). Donnellan's approach to reference is de re all the way down. When a piece of language is used referentially, what matters is whether the object referred to possesses a certain property -- in the example, kindness -- without questions concerning intermediate entities -- sentences, propositions, statements, dicta -- getting in the way.

This, I believe, helps one to understand Donnellan's idea that one cannot "say categorically of a definite description in a particular sentence that it is a referring expression" (20). One cannot say this because whether a piece of language is used referentially does not depend on the logical or grammatical form of a sentence -- like both Russell and Strawson think, it is just that they assign to sentences containing definite descriptions a different logical form[1] -- but on the actual history that generated the use of a piece of language. The second difference between the two then, as Donnellan emphasized in "Reference and Definite Descriptions", is that

It's not possible to tell how a definite description functions in some sentence independently of a particular occasion upon which it is used. This assumption is not really rejected in Strawson's arguments against Russell. Although he can sum up his position by saying, "'Mentioning' or 'referring' is not something an expression does; it is something that someone can use an expression to do", he means by this to deny the radical view that a 'genuine' referring expression has a referent, functions to refer, independent of the context of some use of the expression. The denial of this view, however, does not entail that definite descriptions cannot be identified as referring expressions in a sentence unless the sentence is used. (5)

Interestingly, Donnellan anticipates a point Kripke will rediscover later on in "A Puzzle about Belief". That is that a speaker's cognitive state cannot be retrieved by looking at the form of a sentence independently of the historical context that generated its use. One, in fact, cannot tell Pierre's cognitive state -- for instance, whether he is rational or not -- in isolation, just by looking at the sentences he assents to: "Londres est jolie" and "London is pretty", like one cannot tell a speaker's cognitive state just by looking at the grammatical category to which the linguistic expression the speaker is using belongs. To get at one's cognitive state, a richer description that mentions the history that generated a use of a linguistic expression is needed -- what in a later paper, "Speaking of Nothing", becomes the description given by the Omniscient Observer of History.

Third, in "Reference and Definite Descriptions", Donnellan is less interested in what a sentence containing a referential use of a definite description says, what proposition it expresses, than in discovering the nature of referring, the mechanism by which speakers come to refer to objects. In this respect, Donnellan and Strawson could not be more far apart. While Strawson reduces referring to denoting, Donnellan, in this respect like Russell, sharply distinguishes referring and denoting. A linguistic expression denotes an entity if the entity in question satisfies some predicate(s) associated with the use of an expression. For Strawson, the predicates are not part of what is said when using a sentence containing a definite description but are rather presupposed. If nothing is denoted and the presupposition fails, the definite description does not refer. For Donnellan, this is not the case. In his view, reference depends on having an object in mind. As in the case of "the man drinking a martini", if the speaker has an individual in mind when using the definite description, that nobody is drinking a martini at the party, and therefore that the denotation is lacking, is irrelevant. By the time the speaker used the definite description reference already took place.

The other observation from Donnellan's introduction I'd like to go back to is the following:

I should have supplemented the paper on definite descriptions, I now believe, by pointing to some features of the situations involving referential definite descriptions that give reason to think that the sentence uttered cannot be analyzed via Russell's theory of descriptions, features other than the fact that the speaker seems to be making a reference in uttering the sentence. This would have blocked any suggestion that while the sentence uttered may be analyzed as Russell proposes, some other feature of the situation gives rise to our intuition that reference is going on. (xvi)

Clearly, Donnellan is here thinking of Kripke's very influential suggestion of "rescuing" Russell's theory of definite descriptions by distinguishing speaker's reference and semantic reference. The idea is that as far as the semantics goes definite descriptions can be analysed along Russell's theory. Donnellan's considerations against Russell can be accounted by appealing to the pragmatic notion of speaker's reference. If this is the case, Donnellan's considerations alone do not refute Russell's theory of definite descriptions.

The relation between "Reference and Definite Descriptions" and Kripke's critique in "Speaker's Reference and Semantic Reference" is a curious one. Kripke has been read as vindicating Russell's theory of definite descriptions against Donnellan's critique. However, that this is the correct reading of Kripke's subtle and complex paper is dubious. In the very same paper that is often mentioned to support Russell's view on definite descriptions, in fact, Kripke rejects it. Here is what he actually says:

If I were to be asked for a tentative stab about Russell, I would say that although his theory does a far better job of handling ordinary discourse than many have thought, and although many popular arguments against it are inconclusive, probably it ultimately fails. The considerations I have in mind have to do with the existence of 'improper' definite descriptions, such as 'the table', where uniquely specifying conditions are not contained in the description itself. Contrary to the Russellian picture, I doubt that such descriptions can always be regarded as elliptical with some uniquely specifying conditions added. And it may even be the case that a true picture will resemble various aspects of Donnellan's in important respects. (Kripke 1977: 100; italics mine)

On the one hand, Kripke explicitly denies that Russell's theory of definite descriptions is likely going to work for natural language. On the other hand, perhaps surprisingly, he suggests that a true picture of the working of definite descriptions will probably resemble Donnellan's in many respects. This is very far from the current vulgate about Donnellan and Kripke's debate about definite descriptions.

Donnellan's idea to block the move in favour of Russell's theory of definite descriptions is not too distant from Kripke's observation that most definite descriptions are incomplete. Before Kripke, already in "Putting Humpty Dumpty Together Again", Donnellan hinted at it but somehow failed to give it the emphasis it deserved. The point Donnellan draws on in the new introduction is one that Howard Wettstein first emphasized in "Demonstrative Reference and Definite Descriptions". Briefly, Wettstein's point is that in natural language most of the definite descriptions used are incomplete and can be completed in many different ways. The problem is that often none of the completions "actually captures what the speaker intended by his use of the indefinite definite description" (246). The question, however, cannot be sidestepped because each completion determines a different analysis of an utterance containing a definite description. "Russell's theory fails as a general account of definite descriptions in natural language since in so many cases (at least in many cases of referential use) the indefinite definite descriptions we actually utter are not elliptical for the uniquely denoting descriptions that Russell's theory requires" (247).

More than forty years have elapsed since "Reference and Definite Descriptions" was published. The examples in it are still shining for their clarity and depth. Other important contributions, containing as many intuitive and deep examples and full of innovative ideas, followed. It is safe to say that in the years to come both Donnellan's examples and ideas will continue to play a central role in the discussion in philosophy of language and mind. The volume makes easily available to a new generation of students and philosophers classical pieces of one of the most preeminent figures of analytic philosophy of the last century.[2]



Almog, J. -- Leonardi, P. (eds.) 2012. Having in Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Kaplan, D. 2012. "An Idea of Donnellan". In Almog-Leonardi 2012: 122-175.

Kripke, S. 1977. "Speaker's Reference and Semantic Reference". In Kripke 2011: 99-124.

Kripke, S. 2011. Philosophical Troubles. Collected Papers, Volume I. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Strawson, P. 1950. "On Referring". Mind, 59, 235: 320-344.

Wettstein, H. 1981. "Demonstrative Reference and Definite Descriptions". Philosophical Studies, 40, 2: 241-257.

[1] This is not entirely accurate of Strawson who closes “On Referring” saying that “neither Aristotelian nor Russellian rules give the exact logic of any expression of ordinary language; for ordinary language has no exact logic” (1950: 344).

[2] I wish to thank Andrea Bianchi and Brandt Van der Gaast for comments on an earlier draft.