This book is an impressive contribution to debates about the moral status of nonhuman animals, and about the nature and extent of our obligations to such animals under current conditions. It is also valuable for its extended defense of R.M. Hare's "two-level utilitarianism." Varner's contributions are particularly admirable for being both philosophically sophisticated and deeply informed by relevant empirical work.
The book consists of three parts. In Part I, Varner explicates and defends the two-level utilitarianism that Hare articulated most thoroughly in his 1981 book Moral Thinking: Its Levels, Method, and Point. Part II examines recent empirical research on animal consciousness and cognition, and considers how this research should inform our categorization of nonhuman animals for the purpose of structuring our everyday (what Hare calls "intuitive-level" [1981, ch. 2]) moral thinking. Part III begins to apply the conclusions of Parts I and II to the question of how we ought to formulate (or revise existing) intuitive-level rules for the treatment of nonhuman animals, with particular attention to the practice of slaughter-based agriculture. Varner intends to further develop and extend the analysis in Part III in a forthcoming sequel volume.
Despite the fact that Varner's arguments in Parts II and III are informed by his commitment to Hare's version of utilitarianism, much of what is philosophically interesting in these arguments is independent of that commitment (this is particularly true of the material in Part II). Readers who are unconvinced by the defense of Hare's view in Part I, then, should not be deterred from reading on, since the remainder of the book contains valuable discussions of a range of issues that will be of interest even to those who reject Hare's (or any other) version of utilitarianism.
In Part I, Varner presents his case for Hare's two-level utilitarianism, drawing heavily on Hare's own arguments. Hare's view is distinctive for at least two reasons. First, his commitment to utilitarianism is grounded in an analysis of what Varner calls the "logic of moral discourse" (p. 12). Hare claims that "the formal, logical properties of the moral words . . . yield a system of moral reasoning whose conclusions have a content identical with that of a certain kind of utilitarianism" (1981, p. 4). This appeal to the logic of moral discourse is Hare's alternative to grounding his normative theory by appealing to intuitions about cases, or more generally in the use of the method of "reflective equilibrium" described and employed by Rawls and many others.
The second distinctive feature of Hare's view is his distinction between the "intuitive" and "critical" levels of moral thinking. He appeals to this distinction often, primarily in order to defend his normative theory against a range of objections commonly leveled against utilitarianism. The basic idea is that we both do and ought to rely on relatively simple moral rules when making everyday moral decisions, but that our practice of using these rules is itself ultimately justified in utilitarian terms. For various reasons, including the fact that we typically lack a great deal of relevant information about the likely consequences of our actions, and the fact that we are prone to bias calculations of expected utility to suit our own interests (p. 48), in everyday life we must rely heavily on intuitive-level moral thinking, using simple rules and guidelines when deciding what to do rather than attempting to think in explicitly utilitarian terms. At the same time, there are some cases for which the intuitive-level rules that we have internalized will be unable to provide guidance about what to do, for example in "novel cases," which those rules do not cover, or in cases in which intuitive-level rules conflict (p. 15). In these cases, as well as when assessing candidate intuitive-level rules themselves, Hare believes that we must engage in critical-level thinking, which ought to be done in explicitly utilitarian terms.
Varner explicates and defends both Hare's appeal to the logic of moral discourse (ch. 2) and his use of the intuitive/critical-level distinction to defend his normative theory (chs. 3-4). Much of his discussion and defense of Hare's normative theory is quite compelling, and extends in important ways Hare's own case for the theory. His case for Hare's claim that the logic of moral discourse commits us to utilitarianism, however, adds somewhat less to Hare's own work, and is generally much less compelling.
Hare's argument for the view that the logic of moral discourse commits us to thinking like utilitarians (at the critical level) is grounded in his claim that all genuine moral judgments have three logical properties, namely universalizability, overridingness, and prescriptivity. Moral judgments are universalizable, according to Hare, because it is logically inconsistent to claim that an act would be wrong in one case, while denying that it would be wrong in another case that is similar in all morally relevant respects, but in which, for example, the positions of the particular individuals involved are shifted (pp. 36-7). They are overriding, Hare claims, because part of what it is to think of a norm as a moral norm is to think of it as taking precedence over other kinds of norms. Varner says that the overridingness of moral judgments can "be expressed as the principle: 'Where moral and non-moral norms conflict, what you ought to do, all things considered, is what is morally right'" (p. 38). Because overridingness is, on Hare and Varner's view, a logical property of moral judgments, Varner claims that "one who fails to acknowledge [this principle] does not understand what it means to make a distinctively moral judgment" (p. 38, italics in original).
Varner claims that "almost everyone agrees that both universalizability and overridingness are logical requirements on all moral judgments" (p. 38). But while it seems clear that genuine moral judgments must be universalizable, the claim that one who judges that, morally speaking, she ought to X, but that all things considered, she ought to do something else, is making alogical error seems less compelling. If the failure to acknowledge the principle quoted in the previous paragraph were a logical error, then so long as we take what one ought to do, all things considered, as synonymous with what one has most reason to do, then the question whether one always has most reason to do what morality requires would have no substance, and could be answered by appeal to the meanings of the relevant terms alone. It seems to me, however, that there really is a substantive question that can be asked about whether we always have most reason to do what morality requires, and that appealing to the meanings of moral words cannot in any way help us answer it.
The most controversial of the three logical properties that Hare claims all moral judgments have (p. 39), and the one most important to his argument that the logic of moral discourse commits us to utilitarianism, is prescriptivity. When Hare says that all moral judgments are prescriptive, what he means, as Varner explains, is that "one sincerely assents to a moral judgment only if one would act consistently with it wherever it applies, at least other things being equal" (p. 39). As Varner points out, this account of the prescriptivity of moral judgments seems to leave no room for weakness of will. This is, it seems to me, a significant reason to be skeptical of the claim that genuine moral judgments are necessarily prescriptive in Hare's sense.
According to Varner, the prescriptivity of moral judgments, combined with the requirement to universalize our moral prescriptions, entails that one must "acquire the preferences of everyone affected by one's action in the sense of willing whatever option would maximize the satisfaction of all one's preferences, under the assumption that one will have to undergo, in random order, the experiences of everyone affected by one's action" (p. 45). To motivate this thought, Hare uses an example in which one must decide whether to move another person's bicycle in order to park one's car (1981, pp. 110-111). Because it would be only mildly inconvenient for the bicycle owner to have the bike moved, while it would be highly inconvenient for the agent not to park her car where the bike is located, sound moral reasoning (at the critical level) would, according to Hare, lead the agent to conclude that she ought to move the bicycle. Hare goes on to say that from this case "we see in miniature how the requirement to universalize our prescriptions generates utilitarianism" (1981, p. 111).
Neither Hare nor Varner, however, say much about why the requirement to universalize our prescriptions must, logically speaking, be understood as requiring that we both treat the preferences of everyone affected by our actions as if they were our own and act so as to maximize the aggregate preference satisfaction of that group. Hare says that he "can see no reason for not adopting the same solution [in cases such as the bicycle case described in the previous paragraph] as we do in cases where our own preferences conflict with one another" (1981, pp. 109-110). Since it is clearly rational to maximize our own preference satisfaction when our individual preferences conflict, Hare suggests, we must understand the requirement to universalize our moral prescriptions as the requirement to maximize aggregate preference satisfaction. It is not clear, however, precisely why Hare and Varner think that this follows as a matter of logic alone. It at least seems that some sets of non-utilitarian moral prescriptions are universalizable, and, at least as far as I can tell, Varner provides us with no reason to think otherwise, despite the fact that the case for Hare's view that the logic of moral discourse commits us to utilitarianism depends on there being such a reason. It seems to me, then, that Varner's attempt to defend Hare's appeal to the logic of moral discourse to ground his normative theory fails.
Despite this failure, utilitarianism remains a plausible normative theory, and Varner devotes substantial attention to defending Hare's version of it against a range of objections. In Chapter 3 he argues that there are strong utilitarian reasons for having various kinds of intuitive-level rules to guide behavior, including rules of "common morality" (p. 51) and "professional ethics" (pp. 53-54), as well as "laws" (pp. 54-55). Following Hare, he also claims that individuals with different "temperaments" and "capacities" should adopt different rules of "personal morality," since for different individuals there will be different sets of such rules the internalization of which will maximize their personal contributions to the good (p. 52, quoting Hare 1981, pp. 41 and 199). These are claims that every consequentialist must endorse in some form. Varner's discussion is nevertheless useful, because to what Hare and others have said about how intuitive-level rules might function within the psychology of a utilitarian agent, he adds the idea that intuitive-level moral thinking may be best understood in terms of a connectionist model (pp. 63-71), rather than in terms of the classical model, appropriate to critical-level thinking, in which moral reasoning proceeds deductively by applying explicitly stated rules to the relevant circumstances.
In Chapter 4 Varner attempts to vindicate Hare's view, both as an account of "descriptive ethics" (p. 73), that is, as an account of how actual people engage in moral reasoning, and as a theory of normative ethics. He suggests two arguments for the descriptive adequacy of Hare's view that Hare did not himself offer. One is from the universality of the Golden Rule, which Hare claims, when properly understood, "expresses the three logical properties of moral judgments" (p. 13). The other maintains that "incorporating a universal prescriptivist component in their language would have been adaptive for our ancestors and would help explain how moral thinking and the general practice of ethical debate evolved" [p. 82]). But the most plausible and interesting of his arguments build on arguments offered by Hare himself.
In Chapter 4 of Moral Thinking, Hare argues that the truth of his view helps to explain why many of its most prominent alternatives have seemed appealing, and therefore why, as Varner puts it, "even careful moral philosophers would deny the truth of utilitarianism and/or universal prescriptivism" (pp. 82-83). The basic idea is that because utilitarianism often directs us to adopt intuitive-level rules that have what Varner calls a "deontological flavor" (p. 83), and to develop strong dispositions to act on such rules without reflection, some philosophers will make the mistake of viewing deontological claims (such as rights claims) or character traits (e.g. virtues) as morally fundamental, rather than as ultimately justified by the principle of utility. It is important to note that at least some anti-utilitarians can in principle make a structurally similar claim, namely that whatever theory they endorse attributes derivative or secondary moral significance to happiness or preference satisfaction, and that utilitarians make the mistake of viewing utility (in whatever sense) as morally fundamental. But it seems to me that, as Varner also claims, this kind of explanation is most plausible on behalf of consequentialist views, in particular those with a structure like Hare's (p. 84).
Varner also helpfully draws on empirical work by Daniel Kahneman and Joshua Greene and colleagues to argue that we both can and to some extent do reason morally in the way that Hare's view prescribes (pp. 84-88). This discussion, along with that described in the previous paragraph, lends plausibility to the claim that actual patterns of moral reasoning have a roughly Harean shape.
Like Hare's explanation of why some philosophers have in fact rejected utilitarianism, Varner's defense of utilitarianism as a normative theory relies on the claim that a range of objections to utilitarianism derive from attributing a fundamental moral status that they do not in fact possess to intuitions that the adoption of good intuitive-level rules leads us to have. For example, with respect to the well-known Transplant Case, in which it is stipulated that a doctor can save five patients who would otherwise die by killing a single innocent person and harvesting his organs, Varner explains that while in a purely hypothetical case, in which all of the relevant consequences are simply stipulated, Hare's view implies that the doctor should kill the one to save the five, his view will never have this implication for any real-world cases, since (among other possible reasons) the epistemic limits that we always face in the real world are so severe that it will never be reasonable to engage in critical thinking in any case at all like the Transplant Case. And since the best intuitive-level rules to adopt in the real world would, of course, include a prohibition on killing patients, Hare's view does not have counterintuitive implications for any real-world versions of the Transplant case, which are the only versions that our intuitions and intuitive-level rules are meant to cover (pp. 92-94).
This basic form of response on behalf of utilitarianism is, I think, quite effective against a range of common objections. It does, however, require some adjustment and additional detail in order to deal with further cases and objections. Varner's discussion in the remainder of Chapter 4 attempts to provide some of this detail, with, it seems to me, considerable success. Varner, then, makes a rather strong case for Hare's two-level utilitarianism as a theory of normative ethics, despite having less success defending Hare's claim that utilitarianism can be derived from the logic of moral language alone.
In Part II Varner turns to recent empirical research on animal consciousness and cognition, and considers what this research suggests about the moral status of various nonhuman animals. In Chapter 5, he attempts to determine which animals we have reason to believe are sentient, that is, which animals have "the capacity for phenomenally conscious suffering and/or enjoyment" (p. 108). All beings in this category, according to Varner, must be given consideration in our formulation of intuitive-level rules for the treatment of animals. On the basis of what he calls the "standard argument by analogy" (p. 110), which relies on comparisons of various pain-related physiological characteristics and behavioral responses of animals with those of humans (who we know are sentient), he concludes that "probably all vertebrates can feel pain, while invertebrates (with the exception of cephalopods) cannot" (p. 113). He acknowledges that there is still much left to learn about animal pain (p. 116), and that new evidence may suggest that invertebrates are generally capable of feeling pain as well (p. 132). But he insists that in making, for example, current legislative decisions about how to treat different kinds of animals, we must rely on the evidence that we currently have, rather than speculating about additional evidence that we might acquire in the future (pp. 115-116). After arguing that recent research on various forms of learning and problem solving in a range of animals does not support the view that any animals are conscious that are not also capable of feeling pain, Varner concludes that the species that we have reason to believe can feel pain (i.e., all vertebrates plus cephalopods) must all fall within our intuitive-level rules for the treatment of animals.
In Chapter 6 Varner claims that typical humans are special in a way that other animals are not because unlike them, we can tell stories, and have a biographical sense of self that qualifies us as "persons" in his stipulative sense of that term (p. 134). He also says that happiness requires living a good life story (p. 137), and that "autonomy can be understood as achieved when . . . one tells a story about the future, and then lives it" (p. 139). On his view, then, only humans are clearly capable of happiness and autonomy, and this suggests that human lives are, generally speaking, of greater moral significance than the lives of other animals. He goes on to endorse Marya Schechtman's "narrative self-constitution" view of personal identity, according to which "a person's identity . . . is constituted by the content of her self-narrative" (p. 142, quoting Schechtman 1996, pp. 93-94, italics in original), and to claim that this view can help us see "why having a biographical sense of self gives the lives of persons special moral significance" (p. 140). In addition, he claims that having the kind of biographical sense of self necessary for personhood requires linguistic capacities that the available evidence suggests that only humans have (p. 147), although he acknowledges that it is possible that dolphins and elephants have them as well (p. 158).
Despite the fact that he believes that only humans qualify as persons, Varner also believes that the lives of some nonhuman animals have greater moral significance than the lives of others. Specifically, he claims in Chapter 7 that those animals that possess autonoetic consciousness, or "a robust, conscious sense of their own past and future" (p. 160), are what he calls "near-persons" (p. 159). Our intuitive-level rules, on his view, ought to be more stringent with respect to our treatment of near-persons than with respect to our treatment of animals that are "merely sentient" (p. 159). This is, in part, because beings with autonoetic consciousness have "the ability to consciously remember the past and to consciously anticipate the future," which allows them "to reexperience good (and bad) states of consciousness and to anticipate (and dread) future experiences" (p. 162). Another relevant factor, according to Varner, is that they have the ability to plan for the future beyond a few moments, which means that they have a wider range of desires that can be satisfied or frustrated (pp. 164-165). The lives of persons, in turn, have greater moral significance than the lives of near-persons, because they can tell and understand stories, including stories about their own lives (p. 166), because they can desire to remain or become a certain kind of person (p. 169), and because only they have an interest in how their lives-as-wholes go, where this is determined by how successful they are at living out their chosen self-narratives (rather than by the aggregate of the positive and negative conscious states that they experience, as in the case of near-persons and the merely sentient; pp. 172-174).
Chapter 8 examines in detail research that, on Varner's view, helps to shed light on which animals have autonoetic consciousness, and therefore which animals we should categorize as near-persons for the purpose of formulating intuitive-level rules. Varner considers research that attempts to test for "episodic memory" (p. 184), or the "remembering of personally experienced events" (p. 184, quoting Tulvig 1985, p. 2), mirror self-recognition, and use of a theory of mind, or "interpret[ing] others' behaviors in light of their beliefs and desires" (p. 204). While experiments cannot yet test directly for episodic memory in nonhuman animals, various studies suggest that a range of animals, including scrub jays, rats, dolphins, and gorillas, at least have "episodic-like" memories (p. 186). Work on mirror self-recognition, Varner reports, indicates that chimpanzees have autonoetic consciousness, and strongly suggests that elephants, dolphins and bonobos do as well. There is also some evidence suggesting that orangutans and gorillas are capable of recognizing themselves in mirrors, and a study of African grey parrots can be interpreted as providing some support for the view that they can as well. The available evidence, both anecdotal and experimental, on theory-of-mind use is subject to significant interpretive controversy, but Varner notes evidence that can plausibly be taken to support theory-of-mind use in a range of primates, including chimpanzees, baboons, vervet monkies, gorillas, and rhesus macaques, as well as in elephants, dolphins, and scrub jays.
Varner concludes, on the basis of the empirical work relevant to autonoetic consciousness, that we have reason to count the great apes, cetaceans (i.e. dolphins plus some other aquatic mammals, including whales and porpoises), elephants, and corvids (i.e. jays, including scrub jays, plus ravens, crows, magpies, and nutcrackers; p. 218) as near-persons, and that there is at least some evidence in favor of including parrots, monkeys, and rats as well. He acknowledges that future research may add to or detract from the case for including or excluding any particular species, but reemphasizes the point that we have to make current decisions on the basis of the evidence that is currently available.
Varner's detailed accounts of the observations of and experiments using various animals are illuminating, and his motivating thoughts, that the moral status of animals with a conscious sense of their own past and future is greater than that of merely sentient animals, and that we ought to attend carefully to the relevant empirical evidence in order to determine, as best we can, which animals have the characteristics that ground this greater moral status, are both important and, I think, correct. Not being an expert on animal cognition, I cannot comment in any detail on his interpretations of the evidence that he describes, other than to say that his general approach strikes me as both appropriately cautious and admirably thorough. I am less convinced by his claim that humans, as persons, have a greater moral status than near-persons in virtue of their capacity for storytelling (in part because I do not find the narrative self-constitution view of personal identity particularly compelling). But I think that the more basic fact, which he also notes, that humans typically have complex desires and plans for the future that can be satisfied or frustrated, and which nonhuman animals are incapable of, can ground roughly the same conclusion.
Varner moves on, in Part III, to consider what intuitive-level rules are suggested by the commitment to two-level utilitarianism defended in Part I, combined with the distinction between persons, near-persons, and the merely sentient advocated in Part II. He begins, in Chapter 9, by suggesting that the principle "don't kill sentient animals unnecessarily" is one that should be incorporated in the intuitive-level norms of all societies (p. 229). This principle, however, by itself entails no substantive conclusions about when killing animals is justified, since this will depend on when such killing is necessary in the relevant sense. Its purpose is simply to remind us that we must be concerned about all sentient creatures.
With regard to the question whether we are justified in raising and killing animals for food, Varner notes that, for utilitarians, the answer will depend on various empirical facts about our present circumstances, such as how much pleasure and pain the animals will experience while alive, how much they will suffer when being killed, and how much we stand to benefit from the raising and consuming of animals. Hare's version of utilitarianism accepts that all beings (including persons, p. 240) are "replaceable," in the sense that, morally speaking, creating new beings with preferences that will be satisfied can compensate for killing other beings and thereby preventing what would have been their future preferences from being satisfied. Therefore, it appears that so long as the typical animal raised and killed for food has a life that, on the whole, includes more pleasure than pain, the practice of slaughter-based agriculture will, on that view, be justified.
After criticizing several attempts by Peter Singer to argue that we should think of persons as, in some sense, non-replaceable, while accepting that non-persons are replaceable, Varner notes that on Hare's view, we must, at the critical level, view all beings as replaceable, and endorse maximizing total (rather than average) happiness. This means that on Hare's view, which Varner also endorses, we have a "prima facie duty to procreate" (p. 243), and must, all else equal, continue to increase the size of the human population so long as aggregate happiness will be increased (even if average happiness is reduced to very low levels, as in Parfit's "repugnant conclusion" [p. 242]). We also have a duty to bring additional nonhuman animals into existence, so long as continuing to do so will increase aggregate utility.
Varner suggests that despite the fact that we must, at the critical level, endorse these obligations, the best intuitive-level rules of common morality and law for current societies to adopt would "leave decisions about procreation up to individuals" (p. 244) and "leave decisions about animal procreation up to the farmers and pet owners involved" (p. 246). Although this last claim is not implausible, it is not obviously correct either. And even if purely hypothetical cases in which, for example, forced procreation would maximize aggregate happiness do not present a genuine threat to Hare's view, if it turned out that aggregate happiness in the actual world would be maximized by, say, inclusion within common morality (though not law, since it is extremely implausible that this could maximize aggregate happiness) of a rule requiring each person to have at least two children, this would, it seems to me, raise a serious challenge to Hare's view, since the form of response that he generally offers to purported counterexamples would not be available. A similar point can be made about Varner's claim that good intuitive-level rules for societies like ours will treat persons as non-replaceable, and his claim that such intuitive-level rules will justify treating merely sentient humans as having greater moral significance than other merely sentient beings.
Chapter 10 examines the notion of "humane sustainable agriculture" (p. 255). Varner claims that the appropriate content of this notion will vary depending on the economic and technological conditions, consumer preferences, and traditions of different societies. For example, Native Americans hundreds of years ago may have been justified in hunting bison in ways that caused great suffering and sometimes prevented them from using all of the animals killed, but certainly we would not be justified in using their techniques today. Our contemporary slaughter practices constitute a significant improvement relative to the practices of the past, but a great deal of progress is also still possible. In the near future, certification programs that verify that animals are raised and/or slaughtered humanely, and laws banning certain forms of welfare-limiting treatment can move us toward the achievement of an appropriate vision of humane sustainable agriculture. In addition, utopian visions, which propose radical changes to contemporary practices, can help us to make even greater progress in the long run, by contributing to large-scale changes in the way that people typically think about our treatment of animals. For now, Varner suggests, on the basis of careful consideration of a range of relevant empirical factors, "a reasonable case can be made for eating small quantities of meat from extensively reared ruminants (e.g. cattle) as a form of demi-vegetarianism" (p. 283). The discussion that leads to this conclusion is an excellent example of the kind of careful attention to empirical issues that is essential, in particular from a consequentialist perspective, when assessing practices from a moral perspective, and that is to be found throughout the book.
Varner concludes, in Chapter 11, by noting some of the ways in which Singer has appealed to roughly Harean arguments, and in particular to the distinction between intuitive-level and critical-level moral thinking, in defense of his views on animal ethics and other issues. He suggests that in light of the extent of Singer's agreement with Hare's ethical theory, it is surprising that he has not defended the view that we should treat persons as non-replaceable in terms of the intuitive/critical-level distinction. He also claims that Singer, especially in light of his most recent account of the ground of the special value of persons, ought to accept his category of near-persons, rather than claiming that great apes, and perhaps other animals, are full-fledged persons. In addition, he notes Singer's claim that although at the critical level raising merely sentient animals such as (perhaps) fish and chickens for food may be justifiable, good intuitive-level rules would reject the killing of all animals for food, because such killing "makes us think of [the animals] as objects that we can use as we please," which in turn will prevent us from changing our attitudes toward animals more generally in the ways that we ought to (p. 288, quoting Singer 1993, pp. 133-34). This claim, Varner argues, is "at least in tension" with Singer's defense of active euthanasia against the objection that allowing it may lead to greater disregard for human life generally, in which he claims that we are capable of maintaining a sharp line between candidates for euthanasia such as terminally ill patients and the rest of humanity.
This concluding discussion highlights some important areas of disagreement between Varner and Singer, and therefore helps to make clear why the book is an important contribution to debates about animal ethics within the utilitarian framework. But its value extends well beyond this contribution, and it should be read by anyone with a serious interest in animal ethics.
Hare, R.M. 1981. Moral Thinking: Its Levels, Method, and Point. New York: Oxford University Press.
Schechtman, Marya. 1996. The Constitution of Selves. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
Scheffler, Samuel. 1992. Human Morality. New York: Oxford University Press.
Singer, Peter. 1993. Practical Ethics, 2nd Edition. New York: Cambridge University Press.
Tulvig, Endel. 1985. "Memory and Consciousness." Canadian Psychology 26: 1-12.
 Samuel Scheffler’s discussion of this substantive question (1992, ch. 4) is particularly helpful in terms of clarifying the relevant issues.
 Despite the fact that Varner, following Hare, ultimately rests his case for utilitarianism on the appeal to the logic of moral language, it is possible to argue for the normative component of Hare’s view on other grounds, such as by employing some version of the method of reflective equilibrium.