2012.12.18

Nicholas Tampio

Kantian Courage: Advancing the Enlightenment in Contemporary Political Theory,

Nicholas Tampio, Kantian Courage: Advancing the Enlightenment in Contemporary Political Theory, Fordham University Press, 2012, 256pp., $24.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823245017.

Reviewed by John Christian Laursen, University of California, Riverside


Nicholas Tampio argues that "political progressives should embody Kantian courage", defined as "a critical and creative disposition to invent new political theories" (ix). This is a book-length gloss on Kant's famous "Sapere aude" ("Have the courage to know").

Early on, Tampio makes a distinction between liberty and freedom, which he calls "twin ideals of the Left" without mentioning that they are ideals of other political stances, too (24). He draws the distinction from David H. Fischer: "Liberty, from the Greek word eleutheria, suggests a condition of being independent, separate, and distinct; freedom, from the Indo-European root priya (dear or beloved), means participating in an autonomous tribe or family" (24-5; cf. 109). Tampio calls for an Enlightenment that recognizes both of these values. On the one hand, I imagine that very few people know of such a distinction between the two words, which are commonly used interchangeably. And on the other hand, we do not really need this distinction between words because we already recognize both values: the tug of war between individualism and community is the very stuff of politics, and not only within the Left.

Tampio is quite right to say that the dogmatism of the first Critique, including the claim that it rests on a secure foundation that will last forever, is the type of statement that the Kant of "What is Enlightenment?" should have or "would have viewed with skepticism and derision" (37). In a nice deconstruction, Tampio shows how Kant changes the Aristotelian concept of courage as requiring phronesis to courage as requiring reflective judgment, suggesting that Kant very cleverly "retains the concept of courage, then, but purges the elements that could be used to turn it against him or his work" (37). He also sketches the changes in Kant's conception of courage from something that requires thinking with others in a public sphere to a later dehistoricized and depoliticized version of thinking (39). By his later works, courage is no longer political, but something within oneself.

The story Tampio tells starts with the Thirty Years War, which caused much more death and destruction per capita than the wars of the twentieth century. Religion was an important cause of that war, and the Enlightenment can be understood as a long-term response to such religious violence. Tampio observes that religious violence is still with us, and argues that we need a new Enlightenment to help us quell this violence. At this point he introduces Michel Foucault, who drew on Kant's critical ethos without sparing even the formal structures of universal value that Kant believed he had found. As Tampio points out, Kant scholars often believe that Foucault went too far in ascribing to Kant some of the historicization of reason that Foucault claimed to draw from him. But Tampio wants to follow up on this free reading of Kant in order to update his message. He does this by a close reading of texts from Allen Wood, John Rawls, Gilles Deleuze, and Tariq Ramadan.

The argument begins with a discussion of Wood, for whom "Kantian courage means apologizing for Kant's doctrines in the same way that Plato apologized for Socratic philosophy", according to Tampio (23). Wood thinks Rawls "could hardly get Kant's conception of ethical theory more wrong if he tried", because the supreme principle of morality is metaphysical, not a matter of reflective equilibrium of empirical intuitions (45). Similarly, he accuses Foucault of a "light-heartedly nihilistic attitude toward Enlightenment principles", which provides ammunition for the foes of Enlightenment (46). Wood stands for a rigoristic, rationalist Kant. And there is some value in his work, Tampio believes, as one end of the spectrum of interpretations of Kant, maybe as a sort of anchor in the most rigid, dogmatic, and inflexible, a sort of standard by which to measure healthy departures.

And from the standpoint of "traditional Kant scholarship", Tampio admits, "Rawls's interpretation of Kant's philosophy is rife with mistakes" (48). But he argues that Rawls's interpretation of Kant, whether true to Kant or not, may be invaluable for our purposes today. As he puts it, "Kantian courage, for Rawls, means adapting to the times" (53). His model of some of the finest examples of such adaptation is the legislation or law-making of the U.S. Supreme Court. This may come as a surprise to those with reasons to believe that the court is not supposed to legislate openly, is not always a model of courage, and certainly is a model of unchecked power.

The third point of reference for Tampio is Deleuze, who follows Maimon, Bergson, and Nietzsche in building on and departing from Kant. If critique should turn upon critique, and cherished ideals such as freedom and equality can be revised or rejected, it seems inevitable that Enlightenment ideals will disappear as well. So Tampio wants to save Deleuze as a provocateur, but this "cannot be the sole or even dominant approach" (68). Something similar could be said about Diogenes of Sinope.

As Tampio puts it, "all three inflections of Kantian courage -- as apology, legislation, and transgression -- contribute to stengthening the Enlightenment" (23). Rawls can be understood as favoring the freedom of the group, and Deleuze as favoring the individualism of liberty (71). At just this point, Wood's Kant seems to have disappeared, and maybe that is for the better (as,Tampio notes, recent writers like Ian Hunter have thought).

Kant's medieval metaphysics will no longer work today, Tampio suggests, so we need an alternative "naturalistic account of practical reason" (83). He rejects an obvious candidate, David Hume, because he "lacks a vantage point from which to criticize" the world, and thus endorses "conservative politics" (83). But Hume was one of those who wanted to erase all influence of traditional religion from politics and life, which can hardly be regarded as conservative. As Tampio later mentions, Deleuze knew that Hume knew that "We are habits . . . nothing but habits" (87), but the universe of habits include habits of constant change.

If readers are cutting-edge radicals, out to change the world with their ideas, they might be humbled or sobered to read that although the "radical Enlightenment generates philosophical, artistic, scientific, and political ideas", they only "become concrete by being implemented by the moderate Enlightenment" (27). If they wish to follow Deleuze all the way, they will discover that his political theory "seems more aristocratic than democratic, more sympathetic to pursuing philosophical lines of flight than building a democratic consensus" (95). Some of the best analysis here is the tension that Tampio isolates between Deleuze's fascination with the occult and hermetic and his project of demystification; between his praise for noncommunication and his appreciation of the role of established ideas and institutions (98). There is something attractive at both ends of many spectrums. As always, the question is, can you have it both ways? As Tampio remarks, "no society has room for all ways of life" (101).

Deleuze's contribution is to point us elsewhere, but he also seems to have unexamined categories. "Joyfulness" is a goal, and "sadness" something to avoid. But how are they defined? We are not told. One can certainly imagine that joyfulness to one person could be a nightmare for another, and sadness must be rather personal and idiosyncratic. We also never hear how to solve this problem: Deleuze wants us to avoid stagnation and permit experimentation, to "press against the limits of convention", but all this "without denying the need for limits to preserve mental, emotional, physical, and political bodies" (128). What are those limits? Doesn't one end of this set of desiderata undermine the other? As Tampio reports, many of Deleuze's formulations "would strike Rawlsians and many Kantians as hopelessly vague and impressionistic" (142). Tampio has not always avoided giving this impression about Deleuze as well.

However, he does provide some very thoughtful characterizations about what theory construction for the future should include. The first of these, "and most important", is to invent new conceptions of the person (124). One cannot change human nature, in Tampio's interpretation of Kant, but one can change conceptions of the person. The second element of theory construction is to "lay out the plane", that is, the mental landscape, which for Deleuze is complex, interconnected, and "Nietzschean in its wildness" (135). As Tampio points out, Deleuze departs the most from the old-fashioned Marxist left in this respect, and Tampio obviously sympathizes with him.

"The third activity of constructivism is to construct concepts and principles" (135), Tampio writes, not quite felicitously because he is using the verb to define the noun. But he spells out what it means well enough: experimenting, refashioning, and in general making things different than they have been. One problem that Deleuze recognizes is that "we can also think we are experimenting when we are, instead, opening our bodies up to microfascisms that destroy social bodies from the inside" (140). But unfortunately, "there are no metaphysical principles that can say when, for instance, to permit a foreign religion to thrive within one's borders and when to suppress it" (142).

Then there is the question of evaluating theories. What is our standard going to be? Rawls and Deleuze differ on how we should evaluate the affect of any theory on our passions, Rawls being more Kantian and Deleuze more Spinozist. Tampio writes that Kant's sense of the apodictic certainty of his own theory drives him back into the religious tradition that he excoriates (144). And Tampio also worries that Rawls's "reflective equilibrium" might be conservative (145). On the other hand, Deleuze's might be "purely aesthetic". Tampio's hope is that we can somehow triangulate, taking the good from each and avoiding the bad. Drawing the categories from Jonathan Israel, he concludes that "we ought to appreciate the contributions of both moderates and radicals" (156).

The last chapter of the book brings it into the new world of global political theory, imagining how Kantian theory can be revised to account for and live with Islam. On the one hand, some Islamists have claimed that all of Western secular culture favors Christianity (166). And on the other, some authors think that compromising with Islam in a Rawlsian vein "opens the door for the Taliban" (173). From Deleuze Tampio takes the idea of a fluid "assemblage" of identities, principles, policies, and just about every other element of life in order for us to adapt to Islam and Islam to adapt to us (174). It would be helpful if we could find "Muslim Spinozists who stretch the borders of what it means to be Muslim" (176). One can legimiately wonder what Muslims of all shades will make of this, but at any rate it is an effort to get along with them.

Tampio's extended analysis of Muslim ideas consists of a reading of the work of Tariq Ramadan, who he credits with embodying Kantian courage (178). Ramadan denaturalizes some of the basic concepts of Islam, suggesting that they are constructed and reconstructable. He redescribes the "space of testimony" (181). He does not require the hard-line Kantian's discarding of the "historical shell" of Islam (183). And Tampio agrees that Muslims should not be required to replicate the western Enlightenment step by step, but must invent their own (186).

Certain loaded terms are accepted in this book without criticism. We are living in "late modernity" (32 and elsewhere), which is an interesting claim because it assumes that we know that modernity is about to end. Or could modernity last another 200 years and it will turn out that we are now living in middle modernity?

And then, the book is addressed to "the Left" and progressives in general, although we do not get too much detail about who they are. There is a sub-genre of political theory that spells out its authors' political commitments in such terms, and this reader sees them more often than books specifically directed to "the Center" or "the Right". One wonders about its rhetorical purpose. Most generously, it is to be upfront about its author's political commitments, which the reader might not be able to draw from the text. It might be to make self-described "Leftists" feel at home so they can drop their critical instincts and go along for the ride. It might be self-congratulatory political moralism ("we are the good ones"). It would be almost the same book if a few such sentences of self-identification were omitted and it were imagined that anyone, with any set of commitments, could engage in the theorizing that Tampio recommends. But maybe the idea is to make readers from the Center or the Right put down the book because it is not meant for them. That might reveal a fear that these other categories of theorists would make harmful use of his ideas. I suppose that is a risk that all writers take.

This review of salient points in Tampio's book only begins to capture the subtlety and thoughtfulness of his comparisons and constrasts and interweaving of many theorists from the seventeenth century to the present. His book is an important contribution to many contemporary debates. It is a model of engaged and pertinent historical excavation and reconstruction in political philosophy.