2013.01.02

Duncan Pritchard

Epistemological Disjunctivism

Duncan Pritchard, Epistemological Disjunctivism, Oxford University Press, 2012, 206pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199557912.

Reviewed by Declan Smithies, The Ohio State University


Epistemology has been dominated for at least thirty years by a debate between internalists, who argue that our beliefs must be justified in a way that is accessible through reflection alone, and externalists, who argue that our beliefs must be justified in a way that makes them objectively likely to be true. In his excellent book, Epistemological Disjunctivism, Duncan Pritchard embarks on a quest for the epistemological equivalent of the "Holy Grail" -- an epistemological theory that combines the insights of internalism and externalism in such a way as to offer a new and more satisfying solution to the skeptical problem. The result of this quest is a version of epistemological disjunctivism on which one's beliefs are justified in a way that is both factive in the sense that it guarantees the truth of one's beliefs and reflectively accessible in the sense that one can know by reflection alone that one's beliefs are justified in this way.

As Pritchard acknowledges, this proposal is substantially inspired by the work of John McDowell.[1] Nevertheless, the aim of the book is not to engage in an extended interpretation of McDowell's work, but rather to articulate some of its central themes, to clarify their commitments, and to defend them against a range of compelling objections. The result is an original, sophisticated, and well-articulated position that diverges in important respects from McDowell's. Moreover, while the book develops McDowellian themes, it is not written in McDowellian prose. Pritchard's style is clear, accessible, and engaging. In addition to making an original contribution to the contemporary literature, this book would be well suited for graduate and advanced undergraduate courses on the epistemology of perceptual knowledge; indeed, I have used it for this purpose myself.

The central topic of the book is the way in which our beliefs about the external world are supported by perception. Epistemological disjunctivism is a thesis about the nature of the rational support -- that is, the reasons, justification, or evidence -- that perception provides for beliefs about the external world. The defining thesis of epistemological disjunctivism is that one's rational support is radically different in kind depending on whether one's perceptual experience is an instance of veridical perception, illusion, or hallucination.

Epistemological disjunctivism contrasts with the more standard internalist view that one has the same kind and the same degree of rational support for one's beliefs whether one is in a good case in which one's perception is veridical and so provides a source of knowledge of the external world or in a bad case in which one suffers a perceptual illusion or hallucination that is introspectively indiscriminable from a veridical perception in the sense that one cannot know by introspection alone that it is not a veridical perception. According to Pritchard, one's rational support for believing thatp in the good case is constituted by the fact that one sees that p, where seeing that p is a factive mental state that guarantees not only that p is true, but also that one is in a position to know that p.[2] In the bad case, by contrast, one lacks this kind of factive rational support, since one does not see that p, but merely seems to see that p.

Notice that epistemological disjunctivism is a thesis about the nature of rational support and, as such, it is distinct from metaphysical disjunctivism, which is a thesis about the nature of perceptual experience. Metaphysical disjunctivism is the thesis that the nature of one's perceptual experience is different in the good case and the bad case, whereas epistemological disjunctivism is the thesis that the nature of one's rational support is different in the good case and the bad case. As Pritchard observes, epistemological disjunctivism does not entail metaphysical disjunctivism, since the nature of one's perceptual experience might be the same in the good case and the bad case, even if its epistemic role is different. On this view, the epistemic role of perceptual experience depends not just on its experiential nature, but also on additional factors, such as its relations to the external world. In view of this, further argument would be needed to establish that epistemological disjunctivism incurs any commitment to metaphysical disjunctivism.

A distinctive feature of Pritchard's epistemological disjunctivism is that, following McDowell, he seeks to reconcile the claim that one's rational support in the good case is factive with the claim that it is accessible through reflection alone. This stands in contrast with Timothy Williamson's version of epistemological disjunctivism in Knowledge and Its Limits. Williamson argues for an equation of evidence and knowledge, E = K, according to which one's total body of evidence is identified with the total content of one's knowledge. This proposal has the consequence that one's evidence in the good case in which one knows that p by seeing that p is different from one's evidence in the bad case in which one merely seems to see that p. However, Williamson denies that one's evidence isluminous in the sense that one is always in a position to know which propositions make up one's evidence. Thus, Pritchard's version of epistemological disjunctivism is set apart from Williamson's by his claim that one's factive rational support in the good case is reflectively accessible in the sense that one is always in a position to know by reflection alone that one is in possession of this factive rational support.[3]

One of the central aims of the book is to defend the coherence of this version of epistemological disjunctivism on which the rational support for one's beliefs can be both factive and reflectively accessible. An additional aim is to motivate this view by arguing that it has certain intuitive and theoretical advantages over alternatives. Pritchard summarizes these aims in the following passage:

In a nutshell, then, I shall be motivating epistemological disjunctivism by showing that this is an attractive position which we would want to hold if it were theoretically available, and further showing that it is theoretically available, contrary to the prevailing conventional wisdom in epistemology. (18)

In my assessment, Pritchard's defence of the coherence of epistemological disjunctivism is by and large successful, although I am not yet convinced that the view is well motivated, and so this will be the focus of my critical discussion below. Pritchard argues that epistemological disjunctivism is motivated by the following considerations: first, it provides an attractive solution to the problem of skepticism; second, it accords with commonsense thought and talk about reasons and rationality; and third, it reconciles the insights of internalism and externalism in epistemology. I will consider each of these points in turn.

First, Pritchard claims that his version of epistemological disjunctivism provides a more attractive solution to the problem of skepticism than more familiar versions of internalism and externalism. Consider the following skeptical argument:

(1)  I don't know that I'm not a brain-in-a-vat (BIV).

(2)  If I know that I have hands, then I know that I'm not a BIV.

(3)  Therefore, I don't know that I have hands.

Pritchard adopts a neo-Moorean response to the skeptical argument that denies the first premise. Of course, the challenge for a neo-Moorean response of this kind is to explain how I can know that I'm not a BIV. Following G. E. Moore, the usual strategy is to argue that I know that I'm not a BIV by competently deducing this from more basic perceptual knowledge, such as my knowledge that I have hands. But this raises further questions about how perception provides me with evidence, reasons, or justification that enables me to know that I have hands. And it is here that Pritchard thinks epistemological disjunctivism has the advantage over more familiar versions of internalism and externalism.

According to Pritchard, if I know that I have hands, then I must have reflectively accessible evidence that justifies believing that I have hands, and hence that I'm not a BIV, rather than justifying the belief that I'm a BIV. Moreover, Pritchard claims that I have such reflectively accessible evidence if and only if epistemological disjunctivism is true. Thus, Pritchard argues for epistemological disjunctivism on the grounds that it provides the best response to the following argument against the neo-Moorean response to skepticism:

(4) I know that I'm not a BIV only if I have reflectively accessible evidence that justifies believing that I'm not a BIV.

(5) I don't have reflectively accessible evidence that justifies believing that I'm not a BIV.

(6) Therefore, I don't know that I'm not a BIV.

Externalist responses to skepticism deny (4), since externalism allows that I can know a proposition without having reflectively accessible evidence that justifies believing that proposition. But Pritchard argues, and I agree, that externalism is highly revisionary and hence that an internalist response to skepticism is preferable. The problem, according to Pritchard, is that it is not clear how internalism can provide the resources for denying (5). But if epistemological disjunctivism is true, then we have all the resources we need, since the factive state of seeing that I have hands provides me with reflectively accessible evidence that justifies believing that I have hands, and hence that I'm not a BIV.

The key question for Pritchard is why reflectively accessible evidence must be factive in order to justify believing that I have two hands. Why suppose that my reflectively accessible evidence must be provided by the factive mental state of seeing that I have hands, rather than the non-factive mental state of seeming to see that I have hands? According to Pritchard, the challenge is to explain why the non-factive mental state of seeming to see that I have hands justifies believing that I have hands, rather than justifying the belief that I'm a BIV, since it is consistent with either possibility. This is a fair challenge, of course, but several responses have been developed in the literature. For instance, it has been argued that the non-factive mental state of seeming to see that I have hands justifies believing that I have hands, rather than justifying the belief that I'm a BIV, for each of the following reasons: (i) my experience of seeming to see that I have hands represents that I have hands (Pryor, 2000); (ii) I am by default entitled to assume that if I seem to see that I have hands, then I have hands (Wright, 2004); and (iii) the best explanation of the fact that I seem to see that I have hands is that I have hands (Vogel, 1990).

These strategies are all controversial, although none of them receives any sustained discussion in the book.[4] But in order to motivate the thesis of epistemological disjunctivism, it seems that what Pritchard needs is an argument that no strategy of this general kind can succeed. That is to say, he needs an argument that reflectively accessible evidence must be factive, rather than non-factive, in order to justify believing that I have hands.[5] In the absence of such an argument, we cannot conclude that epistemological disjunctivism represents the best internalist version of a neo-Moorean response to skepticism. So, we must look elsewhere for reasons to prefer epistemological disjunctivism over the alternatives.

Second, Pritchard argues that epistemological disjunctivism accords best with our commonsense thought and talk about perceptual reasons. For example, if I'm worried that I left my passport at home, my wife might reassure me that I didn't, and if I ask her for reasons, she might answer by saying, "I can see that your passport is in your shirt pocket." It would be much less natural for her to say, "I am having an experience in which I seem to see that your passport is in your pocket."

One problem, as Pritchard acknowledges, is that it is not easy to read any particular account of the nature of rational support into our ordinary thought and talk. For instance, even if rational support is provided by non-factive mental states, we can explain our tendency to cite factive mental states by appealing to the fact that it is usually a shared presupposition of the conversational context that perception is veridical and hence that error possibilities do not obtain. In cases where this presupposition is challenged, it is more natural to cite non-factive mental states. Thus, it is not clear that our commonsense thought and talk supports the central thesis of epistemological disjunctivism that rational support in the good case is provided by factive mental states.

Another problem is that even if epistemological disjunctivism fits well with some aspects of our ordinary thought and talk, it fits poorly with others. In particular, it conflicts with the commonsense datum that false beliefs can be justified on the basis of perceptual illusions and hallucinations, just as false beliefs can be justified on the basis of misleading testimony. The New Evil Genius Thesis provides a vivid, if rather extreme, illustration of this point: it seems that my perceptual beliefs could be fully justified even if I am systematically deceived by an evil genius who renders my experiences non-veridical in ways that I cannot discern though introspection alone. However, epistemological disjunctivism is inconsistent with this verdict and, more generally, with the claim that perceptual illusions and hallucinations are capable of justifying beliefs about the external world in the same way as veridical perceptions. This divergence from commonsense seems like a serious cost of epistemological disjunctivism.

Pritchard responds to this objection by invoking a distinction between justification and blamelessness. The suggestion is that while subjects are blameless in forming beliefs on the basis of perceptual illusions and hallucinations that are introspectively indiscriminable from veridical perceptions, it does not follow that those beliefs are justified. After all, blamelessness is not sufficient for justification, as shown by examples involving victims of brainwashing, drugs, or mental illness, whose beliefs are unjustified through no fault of their own. Nevertheless, as Pryor (2001, p. 117) observes, there is an intuitive distinction to be drawn between an envatted brain that duplicates a subject with justified beliefs and one that duplicates a subject with beliefs that are blameless but unjustified. And yet Pritchard's response seems unable to capture this distinction between beliefs that are blameless because they are justified and beliefs that are blameless but unjustified.

Finally, Pritchard argues that epistemological disjunctivism represents the "Holy Grail" of epistemology by reconciling the internalist insight that justification is reflectively accessible with the externalist insight that justification is objectively truth-conducive. As we have seen, however, Pritchard denies the New Evil Genius Thesis, according to which my perceptual beliefs are fully justified even if I am systematically deceived by an evil genius. And yet it is widely supposed that internalism stands or falls with the kind of intuitions that Pritchard denies. Thus, one might doubt that the attempted reconciliation of internalism and externalism is ultimately successful.

Pritchard's response is to argue that there is no sound argument from internalism -- construed as the requirement that the rational support for one's beliefs must be reflectively accessible -- to the New Evil Genius Thesis. Thus, he explicitly considers and rejects the following argument:

(1)  Accessibilism: S's internalist epistemic support for believing that p is constituted solely by facts that S can know by reflection alone.

(2)  The Highest Common Factor Thesis: the only facts that S can know by reflection alone are facts that S's recently envatted physical duplicate can also know by reflection alone.

(3)  The New Evil Genius Thesis: S's internalist epistemic support for believing that p is constituted solely by properties that S has in common with her recently envatted physical duplicate. [from (1), (2)] (39)

Pritchard argues that Accessibilism is consistent with denying the New Evil Genius Thesis, since the Highest Common Factor Thesis is false: there are facts that one can know by reflection alone in the good case that one cannot know by reflection alone in the bad case. In the good case, one can know by reflection alone that one sees that p, rather than merely seeming to see that p. However, it does not follow that, in the bad case, one can know by reflection alone that one merely seems to see that p, rather than seeing that p. Thus, Pritchard's rejection of the Highest Common Factor Thesis is consistent with the datum that what's bad about the bad case is that it is introspectively indiscriminable from the good case.

In my view, however, there is a more intimate connection than Pritchard recognizes between Accessibilism and the New Evil Genius Thesis, which does not depend upon the Highest Common Factor Thesis. In order to see this, we need to draw a distinction between Weak and Strong Accessibilism:

(1)  Weak Accessibilism: if one has rational support for believing that p, then one is in a position to know by reflection alone that one has rational support for believing that p.

(2)  Strong Accessibilism: if one lacks rational support for believing that p, then one is in a position to know by reflection alone that one lacks rational support for believing that p.

Epistemological disjunctivism is consistent with Weak Accessibilism, but not Strong Accessibilism. In the good case, one has factive rational support for believing that p, and one is in a position to know by reflection alone that one has factive rational support for believing that p. In the bad case, though, one lacks factive rational support for believing that p, and yet one is not in a position to know by reflection alone that one lacks factive rational support for believing that p. After all, what's bad about the bad case is precisely that one is not in a position to know that one is in it. Thus, Strong Accessibilism, unlike Weak Accessibilism, is inconsistent with epistemological disjunctivism and provides a theoretical basis for endorsing the New Evil Genius Thesis.

Is there any motivation for endorsing Weak Accessibilism but not Strong Accessibilism? Pritchard argues that Accessibilism is motivated by considerations involving epistemic responsibility. Thus, he writes:

For if the facts in virtue of which one's beliefs enjoy a good epistemic standing are not reflectively available to one, then in what sense is one even able to take epistemic responsibility for that epistemic standing? (2)

According to Pritchard, one can take epistemic responsibility for the positive epistemic standing of one's perceptual beliefs in the good case only if one has reflective access to this positive epistemic standing. By parity of reasoning, one can take epistemic responsibility for the negative epistemic standing of one's perceptual beliefs in the bad case only if one has reflective access to this negative epistemic standing. And yet on Pritchard's version of epistemological disjunctivism, one can take epistemic responsibility for the positive standing of one's beliefs in the good case, although one cannot take responsibility for the negative standing of one's beliefs in the bad case. But what justifies this asymmetry? The usual internalist idea is that one is always in a position to know whether or not one has a certain kind of rational support for one's beliefs, and hence one is always in a position to take responsibility for one's beliefs, whether one is in the good case or the bad case. However, Pritchard's epistemological disjunctivism cannot sustain this idea, and so it ultimately fails in its attempt to locate the "Holy Grail" of epistemology by reconciling the insights of internalism and externalism.

In conclusion, epistemological disjunctivism is a fascinating view that deserves critical scrutiny. As I have indicated, I am not persuaded that the view is well motivated, and I suspect that a more traditional version of internalism can offer the same benefits, and more, with fewer costs. Nevertheless, Pritchard deserves credit for articulating this view so clearly and putting it on the agenda for discussion. As he says, "Contemporary epistemology has an obligation to examine the view afresh and reconsider just what might be wrong about it" (5).

REFERENCES

Dougherty, Trent and Rysiew, Patrick. 2009. Fallibilism, Epistemic Possibility, and Concessive Knowledge Attributions. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 78 (1): 123-32.

Lewis, David. 1996. Elusive Knowledge. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74 (4): 549-67.

McDowell, John. 1982. Criteria, Defeasibility, and Knowledge. Proceedings of the British Academy 68: 455-79.

McDowell, John. 1995. Knowledge and the Internal. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 55: 877-93.

McDowell, John. 2011. Perception as a Capacity for Knowledge. Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press.

Pryor, James. 2000. The Skeptic and the Dogmatist. Noûs 34: 517-49.

Pryor, James. 2001. Highlights of Recent Epistemology. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 52: 95-124.

Smithies, Declan. 2012. Mentalism and Epistemic Transparency. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 90 (4): 723-42.

Vogel, Jonathan. 1990. Cartesian Skepticism and Inference to the Best Explanation. Journal of Philosophy 87: 658-66.

Williamson, Timothy. 2000. Knowledge and Its Limits. Oxford University Press.

Wright, Crispin. 2004. Warrant for Nothing (and Foundations for Free?). Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume 78 (1): 167-212.



[1] See McDowell 1982, 1995, and 2011.

[2] Pritchard denies that seeing that p entails knowing that p, since there are cases in which one is in a position to know that p, although one does not, and perhaps cannot, exploit one's position. See Pritchard's discussion of the basis problem on pp. 25-35.

[3] Pritchard does not discuss Williamson's anti-luminosity argument in detail, although I agree with his verdict that "the jury is still out regarding what this argument precisely demonstrates" (53, n. 2). My own response to Williamson's anti-luminosity argument is developed in Smithies (2012).

[4] Pritchard mentions these responses and some relevant secondary literature on p. 154, n. 12.

[5] See Lewis (1996, p. 549-50) and McDowell (2011, p. 54) for arguments of this general kind and see Dougherty and Rysiew (2009) for critical discussion.