2013.03.09

Leila Haaparanta and Heikki J. Koskinen (eds.)

Categories of Being: Essays on Metaphysics and Logic

Leila Haaparanta and Heikki J. Koskinen (eds.), Categories of Being: Essays on Metaphysics and Logic, Oxford University Press, 2012, 512pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199890576.

Reviewed by Stephen Read, University of St. Andrews


Metaphysics had a difficult time during the twentieth century. It was reviled by the logical positivists, Carnap claimed to have "overcome" it in his 'Die Überwindung der Metaphysik', and it was dismissed by ordinary language philosophy, conceptual analysis and the linguistic turn. Indeed, Sami Pihlström, in the concluding essay, 'Transcendental Philosophy as Ontology', thinks the whole Kantian enterprise is anti-metaphysical:

the Kantian thinker -- the transcendental philosopher in the sense in which we use this term today -- typically rejects [the Aristotelian] claim [that the ontological categories . . . are categories of Being itself], urging that we cannot know anything about Being as such, or about the things in themselves. (p. 455)

In the end, he rejects the simplistic nature of this contrast: "transcendental philosophy . . . need not and should not be committed to the claim that 'metaphysics is dead'." (p. 475)

The turning point is exemplified in the central essay, Claire Ortiz Hill's 'Georg Cantor's Paradise, Metaphysics, and Husserlian Logic'. Nine essays lead up to this paper, running chronologically from Michael Loux's on Aristotle to Torjus Midtgarden's on Peirce. Nine papers follow it, starting with Peter Simons' discussion of Meinong and Husserl and ending with Ilkka Niiniluoto's 'On Tropic Realism'. Pihlström's paper serves as a coda. The ostensible topic throughout is the description and categorization of reality, of being, a project begun systematically in Aristotle's Categories and pursued in tandem with logic -- though what is recognised as logic varies tremendously. Ortiz Hill sees logic as the key to fighting against the rejection of metaphysics, notably in the work of Quine, who is also seen as a metaphysician malgré lui by the editors in their Introduction, and in Koskinen's essay, 'Quine, Predication and the Categories of Being'. The real bugbear, says Koskinen, is Quine's extensionalism. The linguistic turn shifted the debate from the separation of mind and world to that of language. The central problem of metaphysics, in the categories of being, is predication, to be solved according to Quine by semantics. Inscrutability of reference is the consequence of this divorce between language and reality, and for Quine everything is sacrificed in order to maintain a link between observation sentences and theoretical sentences. All becomes relative to a theory, but which theory is then just prejudice, Quine's prejudice being his preference for representation in first-order logic with an ontology of medium-sized objects. In other words, naturalism rides to the rescue.

The defense of metaphysics begins, for Ortiz Hill, with Cantor's and Husserl's recognition of the metaphysical requirements of set theory. She cites Lotze's opposition to nineteenth-century naturalism as having a central, but under-recognised, role in their thinking. The paradoxes of set theory, in particular Cantor's paradox of the set of all sets, required that Husserl devise a new account of totalities. The paradox derives from Cantor's theorem, that there is no greatest cardinal number, in particular, that the cardinality of the set of all subsets of a given set is strictly greater than that of the set itself. (For example, a pair set, containing two objects, has four subsets, the singletons of its members together with the empty set of the set itself; a triple with three members has nine subsets; and so on.) Now take the set of all sets. One might suppose it must be the largest set; but the set of all its subsets is a set and strictly larger.

Loux, in the opening essay on 'Being, Categories, and Universal Reference in Aristotle', pinpoints a similar paradox in Aristotle. Aristotle rejected the Platonic and Parmenidean thesis that there is a single property of everything: the one. 'Being' and 'One' (or unity) are transcendental terms, not belonging to any of his ten categories. Yet he must accept that there is a category-neutral way of speaking of being, or he would not be able to state his own thesis. Take an "infinite" name such a 'non-horse': this applies both to lines and to men, beings of different categories. Thus infinite names, though they do not strictly connote properties, which must fall under the categories, apply in a neutral way across categories.

But Aristotle's texts, while providing the questions and inspiration for medieval philosophers, both in the Arabic world and in the Latin West, were at the same time gnomic and puzzling. 'Do words signify concepts or things?' was asked repeatedly; are the categories, categories of words or of things? Do we predicate wisdom of Socrates, or 'wisdom'? In the Metaphysics (1017a21-2), Aristotle says that there are as many kinds of predicates as there are kinds of being. But do the kinds of predication derive from the kinds of being, or vice versa?

Taneli Kukkonen, in his treatment of the Arabic history, 'Dividing Being: Before and After Avicenna', sees the neo-Platonists turning Aristotle on his head. Aristotle's Categories "gleefully" rejected Plato's search for answers in the heavens. Rather, Aristotle held, the categories are found in the form of predication: "In general . . . it is fruitless to look for the elements of all the things there are without distinguishing the different senses in which things are said to be" (Metaphysics 992b18 ff, cited on p. 39). The neo-Platonists, through Porphyry, then rehabilitated Aristotle by suggesting he was treating only of the sensible realm in his Categories, leaving Plato's deep metaphysical insights into the higher realms of being unaffected. The opposition between those wanting to base metaphysics on logic and those wanting to divorce it from logic runs right through subsequent treatments. For Averroes, says Kukkonen, "being, divided in accordance with the ten categories, is prior to any judgments about it" (p. 56); for Ockham, writes Henrik Lagerlund (in his essay on 'Leibniz (and Ockham) on the Language of Thought, or How the True Metaphysics is Derived from the True Logic'), logic is a matter of concepts and concepts reflect the world, so "by analyzing language into its simplest parts, one could uncover what there is in the world" (p. 100).

Lagerlund's paper is salutary in revealing the continuity between medieval and early modern theories, which is often overlooked or even denied, as Descartes and others strove to suggest a new start in philosophy, alongside the scientific revolution. However, his account (p. 113) of Leibniz's formalization of categorical propositions in his 'General Inquiries about the Analysis of Concepts and Truth' does not seem quite right: 'Every A is B' is not 'Every A and every B coincide' (as Lagerlund has it), but 'Every A and some B coincide' (p. 53 in Parkinson's translation, to which Lagerlund is referring, p. 363 in Couturat's edition), and so 'Some A is not B' is 'Some A and every B do not coincide', not 'some B' as Lagerlund has it. Leibniz seems here to be echoing the account we find in such medieval terminists as Ockham and Buridan, and anticipating the algebraic manipulations of Boole.

In fact, given the lack of historical awareness among many analytical philosophers in the twentieth century, it is easy to overlook the influence that medieval thought had right through until the nineteenth century. We need to be reminded, as Peter Simons does in his 'To Be and/or Not to Be: The Objects of Meinong and Husserl', for example, how conscious Brentano was of the medieval inheritance when formulating his concept of intentional inexistence. Brentano sought to demonstrate the autonomy of the psychological and the impossibility of reducing it to physiology, its characteristic being direction to an object. Pace Simons, the false step seems to have been Twardowski's in distinguishing the private mental content from the non-mental public object. Rather, as the medievals recognised, the object is single, sometimes non-existent, having only esse obiectivum (being as an object of thought), sometimes existing and thought of (and so having both "objective" and "subjective" being -- being in a subject). There are not two objects, one hidden behind a veil of conception.

This wonted ignorance of the history of philosophy, particularly of the period between Aristotle and Descartes, is often excused by the claim that the ills of metaphysics arose from the logical mistake of thinking all propositions are of subject-predicate form, an error identified and overturned by Frege. The right metaphysics, on this reading, distinguishes concept and object, more generally unsaturated functions from saturated or complete entities. Haaparanta, indeed, in her paper 'On "Being" and Being: Frege between Carnap and Heidegger', claims that while Aristotle had ten categories, Frege's corresponding categorial distinction was between concept and object (p. 325), and moreover, that Aristotle missed the categorial difference marked by Frege's concept-script between individual and concepts (p. 329). But the concept/object distinction generalizes the particular/universal distinction, which is another dimension of Aristotle's taxonomy: the vertical dimension of primary versus secondary substance contrasted with the horizontal distinction substance and accidents, themselves subdivided into the Aristotelian categories (and arguably, themselves admitting a particular/universal distinction, glossed in Categories 2 as those which are "in a subject but not said of any subject" and those which are "both said of a subject and in a subject").

Haaparanta also makes much of what is sometimes called the Frege-Russell ambiguity, between the 'is' of existence, the 'is' of predication, the 'is' of identity and the 'is' of class-inclusion (p. 323). 'Being' expressing the first of these she contrasts with "'being' that expresses the existence of an object (an empty concept, 'to be identical with oneself', e.g., 'Socrates is')," empty because is applies to everything. (See ch. V of her Frege's Doctrine of Being, 1985.) She claims further (p. 335) that "we may assert as follows: 'Obama's presidency is'; 'The identity of the evening star and the morning star is'; . . . 'The self-identity of Socrates is'." This is not only not English; there is really, pace Frege, no first-order concept of existence distinct from a second-order one. Whereas the grammar of 'There is a horse' derives from the predication 'A horse is there', Frege realised that its logic derives from '(The concept) horse is instantiated'. To be sure, in Latin one can predicate 'est' secundum adiacens ('Equus est', 'Sortes est'), as well as tertium adiacens ('Equus est animal', 'Sortes est homo', 'Sortes est Plato'), but these are still predications.

Frege's concept-script (Begriffsschrift) was an ideal language, in which he sought to make explicit the ontological implications of our ordinary statements. But whereas Russell and Carnap used the method of analysis as "revisionary metaphysics", as Glock puts it in his essay on 'Strawson's Descriptive Metaphysics', eliminating and so denying being to sets and numbers, Frege did not interpret analysis in this way. Michael Beaney, in his lucid account of the metaphysics of Frege, Russell, Moore and Wittgenstein, 'Logic and Metaphysics in Early Analytic Philosophy', attributes the contrast to the fact that Russell and Moore thought of analysis as decomposition into atoms, which Frege did not. The central problem Beaney identifies in all these writers is the analysis of relations, e.g., 'a < b' and 'b > a'. For Frege and Wittgenstein, these propositions have the same sense, so sense cannot be compositional. Wittgenstein in fact denies that there is a (real) relation; there is only the manner of representation of the single fact (think of a and b placed on a line), which is pictured (differently) by the two propositions. The genuine elementary proposition contains only names for a and b (and consists in the fact that those names are suitably related). The fact that the names are so related (which cannot be said, only shown) says that a and b are related as greater and less. Beaney shows how Wittgenstein's saying/showing distinction derives from Frege's problems with 'the concept horse' (which, being a complete expression cannot strictly denote a concept), picking up on Frege's famous "pinch of salt".

Glock's claim is that Strawson's metaphysics is similarly non-revisionary, but this time by rejecting the need for an ideal language. So too did Wittgenstein (despite what Keith Campbell writes on p. 420 of his essay on 'D.M. Armstrong and the Recovery of Ontology'). The real question is whether to read a metaphysics directly from the form of ordinary language (e.g., taking the subject-predicate form to reveal a particular-universal ontology), or whether to treat ordinary language as misleading -- which does not require replacing it with an ideal language. Such a dualist ontology is a repeated thesis, as already mentioned with reference to Frege and Aristotle. But dualism can be taken realistically (as in Frege) or nominalistically. Arianna Betti, in describing 'Bolzano's Universe: Metaphysics, Logic and Truth', reveals Bolzano as having the best of both worlds. There are individual qualities (tropes in current parlance), which exist only if their subjects do; and there are objects, though no "Musilian" objects (as Betti calls them by nice allusion to Robert Musil's classic novel The Man without Qualities): objects which lack qualities altogether ("something . . . we know not what", in Locke's unfortunate phrase). But for Bolzano, besides things that exist, located somewhere and causally efficacious, there is a world of lektologica, propositions and ideas (that is, parts of propositions).

Ilkka Niiniluoto paints a somewhat similar picture in his essay 'On Tropic Realism': properties, as classes of similar tropes, are for him inhabitants of Popper's world 3. This is Platonic realism, contrasted with the moderate realism espoused by David Armstrong. Campbell opens his essay on Armstrong by again portraying the anti-metaphysical stance of British philosophy in the 1950s as a brief aberration, overturned from "down under" by Armstrong, John Anderson's successor in Sydney. Inspirational here was Donald Williams' division of metaphysics into speculative cosmology (an account of the basic elements in the world -- Campbell sees Armstrong's materialist theory of mind as an example) and analytic ontology (listing the categories of being -- as in Armstrong's Universals and Scientific Realism). Armstrong's is an essentially monistic ontology -- factualism: what are basic are states of affairs, or facts, which are particulars. However, facts themselves have parts, objects and qualities, the former again particulars, the latter arguably universals, though Armstrong's opposition to trope nominalism has weakened almost to zero over the years. Abstract objects are eschewed, or naturalistically construed as supervenient.

Of the few essays in the volume not yet mentioned, perhaps the most arresting is Kevin Scharp's argument in 'Wilfrid Sellars' Anti-Descriptivism' that Sellars anticipated the iconoclastic doctrines of Kripke, Putnam and Kaplan. To be fair, Sellars was not alone: Keith Donnellan's contribution is here underplayed, as is that of Ruth Barcan Marcus, mentioned only in a footnote on p. 398. Sellars too rejected abstract entities, denying that understanding should be seen in Fregean terms as the grasp of abstracta. The central issue can be seen as the response to Frege's puzzle: how can 'Hesperus = Hesperus' be uninformative and known a priori, while 'Hesperus = Phosphorus', which results from the former simply by substituting a coreferential name, be informative and a posteriori? Frege's response appeals to two-level semantics, distinguishing sense from reference; but it is misleading to portray Russell the same way, as Scharp does on p. 360. Inconstant in many things, Russell stuck to one-level semantics throughout his other changes of mind. When there is (or even may be) no reference, there is no meaning either -- the name must be a disguised description, and descriptions are incomplete symbols, disappearing on analysis. It is also not strictly accurate to attribute to Frege (p. 360) the claim that the "meaning [of most any linguistic expression] is given by a description." As Dummett has reminded us, sense for Frege is given by a recognitional ability, which cannot always be captured by a description.

These few caveats aside, however, the present collection constitutes a valuable survey and rigorous examination of the categories of being, of the development of metaphysics over two and a half thousand years. I find the subtitle, 'Essays on Metaphysics and Logic', a little misleading: they are essays on metaphysics, much of which is informed by, and responsive to, logic. Any influence of metaphysics on logic is left unexplored. Students of metaphysics, and more senior researchers, will learn much from these twenty essays.