2013.03.20

Pico della Mirandola

Pico della Mirandola: Oration on the Dignity of Man: A New Translation and Commentary

Pico della Mirandola, Pico della Mirandola: Oration on the Dignity of Man: A New Translation and Commentary, Francesco Borghesi, Michael Papio, and Massimo Riva (eds.), Cambridge University Press, 2012, 278pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107015876.

Reviewed by Amos Edelheit, National University of Ireland, Maynooth


Ever since his untimely death it seems that there has been an uninterrupted interest in the thought and writings of Giovanni Pico della Mirandola (1463-1494), one of the most authentic representatives of Renaissance philosophy. Pico was interested in every philosophical or theological trend, accumulating ideas and doctrines from the ancient Greeks and Romans, from Jewish mysticism, from Arabic philosophers as well as from the most recent theories in natural philosophy. He lived and worked -- either as a student or as a colleague -- in the most important intellectual centres of his time: Padua, Florence and Paris. He associated with Nicoletto Vernia, Agostino Nifo and Elijah Delmedigo on the one hand, and with Angelo Poliziano and Ermolao Barbaro, Girolamo Benivieni, Marsilio Ficino and Lorenzo de' Medici on the other. Pico moved quite naturally and freely among different scholastic schools and humanist fashions and methods while developing his own particular interest in Jewish Kabbalah and its potential role in Christian theology ("inventing" a unique branch of knowledge which was later regarded as Christian Kabbalah). He also pursued his interest in oriental languages and cultures.

Pico's Oration, which stands at the centre of this new volume, has a special place in Pico's oeuvre. It is regarded as a kind of a manifesto of the new Renaissance spirit, mainly thanks to the first section, which is still part of the captatio benevolentiae. In it Pico introduces a brilliant idea, on both philosophical and rhetorical grounds: since man was created last, everything was already occupied and given to other created beings. God, who is depicted as a demiurge and an architect, solved this problem by putting man at the centre of the world so that he could better see what is there and by giving him the ability to choose his own place and thus to determine his own destiny. The exact philosophical and theological implications of this idea are still a subject of debate among Pico scholars. Pico composed the Oration in 1486. He organized a public debate in Rome and intended to open it with the Oration. The subject of the debate was to be nine hundred theses and conclusions from them that he had gathered from diverse sources or had composed under their inspiration. The debate, however, never took place. The Oration was not published during Pico's lifetime although he did use parts of it in his Apology (1487) defending 13 of the theses against accusations of different degrees of heresy. It was included in the 1496 posthumous edition of Pico's works and some sixteenth-century printers titled it Oratio de hominis dignitate (Oration on the Dignity of Man), the name by which it became known to readers all over Europe.

There is something remarkable in both the quantity and complexity that every student of Renaissance philosophy immediately faces when reading either humanist-oriented thinkers like Petrarch, Salutati, Bruni, Valla or Manetti, for instance, or scholastic thinkers like Dominici, Antoninus, Pisano or Saliviati. The essential gap between our contemporary modern life-style and rhythm, on the one hand, and Renaissance scholarship and erudition, on the other, can defeat the strongest hearts (but only in those rare cases where honesty and sincerity are involved). With regard to Pico, for instance, one should be familiar with the ancient and medieval sources that were available to him in Greek and Latin, along with some of the Hebrew (and in some cases Aramaic) sources and with Arabic philosophy (at least in Latin translations). I still strongly believe in the value of such an endeavour and in promoting and advancing our understanding of Renaissance philosophy by using "old-school" scholarly methods: philology and a historical approach combined with all the electronic devices and possibilities. Such concerns and circumstances, together with the new electronic technologies (and the constant need for funded projects) are pushing scholars nowadays to use electronic devices in special collective research projects. In such a context we find also the "Pico Project" and its first print edition, the volume under review.

Massimo Riva gives an overview of the Pico Project in the first chapter of Part I. Just before that, in the acknowledgments section, we are told not to expect any revisions in the Latin of the Oration since the volume's translators and commentators (not 'editors' as they are called on the cover) "adopted" the 2003 "critical text" of Francesco Bausi, one of the leading Pico scholars today. The purpose of this cooperative project between Brown University and the University of Bologna, was "to make the Oration widely available on the Internet as a resource for a wider community of scholars and readers, an essential step toward a better understanding and reappraisal of a legendary episode of the Renaissance" (p. 5). There is nothing wrong in making a fifteenth-century text more available through the Internet. How exactly this effort is going to be "essential" for "a better understanding" of this text and context is unclear in this statement, which is presented as the credo of the whole project. More problematic is the use of the word 'aphorisms' (p. 6) to describe Pico's method of collecting his theses or conclusions, which were only the opening declarations and short accounts preceding detailed philosophical or theological discussions, the kind of discussion we have in Pico's Apology that has absolutely nothing in common with "our own post-modern way of retrieving [diverse traditions and ideas] " (p. 6). I shall leave the question as to who exactly are the "we" or "our own" open. But any reader familiar with classical scholarship will find the speculations concerning the advantages of "dynamic" digital editions over printed editions superficial, since no serious scholar will ever consider a printed critical edition of any text as "potentially definitive" (p. 7), and the dynamic nature of scholarship has been well known to generations of scholars many years before the invention of the first computer.

Pier Cesare Bori's piece is an English translation taken from his book on Pico (2000) and is used here as an historical introduction to Pico's Oration. Beside some relatively minor problems (for instance, Flavius Mithridates is referred to (p. 13, n. 8; p. 15; p. 16, n. 17) as a "colleague" of Pico, while in fact he was Pico's teacher and translator employed by the Count), it is unclear why Bori gives such a detailed account of Pico's famous and dramatic love affair with Margherita (pp. 11-15). This is not justified by any new evidence or a new interpretation of known documents. Bori refers (p. 27) to what he regards as Pico's "pluralistic theoretical perspective, and his capacity to see reality in the light of innumerable points of view", while in fact there is very little evidence for such a "pluralistic perspective." Pico's purpose in accumulating as many doctrines and opinions (verba) as possible was probably to understand better the reality (res) reflected in those true and adequate doctrines, assuming a necessary relation between concepts and reality. In other words, his novelty lies more in his historical than in his conceptual approach, although this point is of course open to debate. The historiographical division provided (pp. 32-33) between those who emphasize the importance of mysticism and esoteric doctrines in Pico's thought and those who focus on his contributions to the theological tradition and to religious discourse is very simplistic (a point I shall return to shortly).

There are several inaccuracies in Francesco Borghesi's chronology of the main events in Pico's life. For instance, Elijah (this is the standard English form of this name, not 'Elia') Delmedigo is mentioned (p. 39) beside "another converted Jew, Guglielmo Raimondo de Moncada," a formulation which will lead non-expert readers to assume that Delmedigo was also a converted Jew, which he was not. The account (pp. 39-40) of Pico's famous letter to Lorenzo, in which Pico compares the poets Dante, Petrarch and Lorenzo himself, does not include the fact that Pico expresses a preference for the poetry of Lorenzo over that of Dante or Petrarch. It is unclear why Borghesi emphasizes Alemanno's competence in "reading Arabic sources in Hebrew" (p. 42), while both Delmedigo and Mithridates were just as competent. Alemanno brought into play his expertise and sincere interest in Kabbalah. In this regard he differed from both Delmedigo (a rational Aristotelian thinker in the Averroist tradition who famously rejected the standard way of understanding and interpreting Averroës in the Latin West by philosophers with no knowledge of Arabic) and Mithridates (a translator of Kabbalistic texts who was not specially engaged with the subject).

Michael Papio provides a reliable account of the printed editions of Pico's Oration (pp. 45-51). A sharper and more consistent distinction is needed, however, between a critical edition of the text, on the one hand, and translations of the text, on the other; in this light the phrase 'English editions' (p. 51) is inaccurate and misleading.

The last two sections of Part I are an account of different interpretations of the Oration by Francesco Borghesi and an "Overview of the Text" by six participants in the Pico Project. Part II contains the Latin text (i.e., Bausi's critical text) and a new English translation.

One could agree with Borghesi's critique of Farmer and his obsession with the concept of syncretism (in the latter's edition and translation of Pico's 900 theses),[1] as well as with Borghesi's preference for "concord" instead (p. 54 and n. 13 there). However, it is much more difficult to understand his remark about "the proposition that God 'is above Being' -- a thesis maintained by Plato's Academy" (p. 55). This is mere speculation and is not attested by the ancient sources we have (we in fact have very little information about what was actually going on in Plato's Academy). If Borghesi is referring to the Academy as a school of thought (i.e., the students and followers of Plato in the first generations after his death), then there is an even more serious problem since, as is well-known, the Academy during most of this period held a skeptical approach.

One should be more cautious and critical with regard to phrases such as "mystical vocation" (p. 59) or "mystical aspect" (p. 60), which are not very helpful in explaining Pico's ideas. The same goes for the speculations concerning an "inclusive" or "exclusive conception of Christianity" (p. 60), which immediately bring us to a very dangerous account of religion as culture -- so far away from the fifteenth-century notion of Christianity -- and then, to "a pluralistic Christian theological doctrine," a contemporary idea that again has very little in common with Pico or any other Renaissance philosopher or theologian. Identifying "concordism" with "religious pluralism" (p. 60) is again very problematic, and reflects a very confused historiographical account which is missing (see e.g., the crucial studies of Charles Trinkaus, Salvatore Camporeale, John O'Malley and John D'Amico on Renaissance humanism and Christianity).[2] In this regard, the discussion on pages 60-65 is a step backwards. A phrase such as 'concordistic theology' (p. 64) does not really explain the novelty of Pico, who stands outside many unhelpful historiographical categories.

The purpose of the last section of Part I is not entirely clear. This "Overview of the Text" contains much speculation on various sections of Pico's text. On too many occasions, the discussion resembles an undisciplined stream of consciousness concerning different "possibilities." What would the reader gain from the observation that

Pico takes this stance [that man has no place or nature of his own] not only in order to exalt man's free will, flexibility, and perfectibility but also, and especially, in order to argue that the ultimate goal of man is the attainment of a reality that transcends every image, so that humans become in effect the image of a nonimage (p. 67)?

Beyond the obvious confusion and the effort to say something new at all costs we should remember that no such argument concerning transcending images can be found in the Oration or in any other text by Pico. Having the ability to choose provides humanity with the possibility of emulating the angels and even going above the angels in the cosmic hierarchy, and this is why Pico immediately discusses the three angelic orders in the context of human progression. This progression has a very remote connection with Diotima's speech in Plato's Symposium, or with the "cave analogy" in Republic 7, and the word 'parallelism' (p. 69) is much too strong and unjustified. On the other hand, the emphasis on the importance of Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite (e.g., pp. 72-73) is fully justified, but there is, of course, nothing new in this.

In the overview, Massimo Riva's discussion of Enoch and Metatron (pp. 74-78) is on the one hand, full of speculations regarding "possible cabalistic (and Gnostic) references" (p. 75) and unhelpful references to Cassirer's "symbolic thought" (p.75, n. 29). His competence in matters concerning Kabbalah, Hebrew and Aramaic, on the other hand, is doubtful; so, for instance, we find  the Hebrew word מטבצ instead of מטבע (p. 77 and on pp. 132-133 in Pico's text), and we have חשמים instead of השמים (p. 89), but who nowadays can read Hebrew?

The overall level of Michael Papio's discussion of the next section of Pico's Oration (pp. 78-89) is better. But even here we find statements such as "Pico syncretically embraces the best of the Logica antiqua and Logica modernorum" (p. 83), or, "What emerges is a mode of thought that seems to succeed in blending Neoplatonism and Aristotelian Scholasticism quite productively" (pp. 83-84), which are far too general and thus quite meaningless. Papio gives several references to Maimonides (pp. 87-89), but does not suggest that he used the Arabic text of the Guide of the Perplexed, only the 1995 English translation. It is unclear which version of the Zohar he used (pp. 86-87).

Two disturbing aspects of this section of "free" commentaries on Pico's Oration are the many repetitions and its lack of a coherent and synthetic analysis.  The obvious reason is that the section has multiple authors, but that explanation does not eliminate the problem. Another disturbing aspect is the endless praise given to Pier Cesare Bori who played a leading role in the Pico Project. The authors in this section all contiually refer to Bori's works and theses about Pico, whether they make sense or not. There is, for example, an open clash between Bori and Bausi. Bausi is more cautious and does not see "a plurality of diverse and parallel spiritual itineraries" (p. 93, a citation from Bori's book), but rather justly points out the priority assigned by Pico to Christianity (p. 93, n. 56). Melloni, Papio, and Riva choose not to decide between the two. However, the fact that Bori's account is in the main text and Bausi's in the footnote is not accidental.

A general disregard of the scholastic tradition and its enormous influence on Pico is yet another disturbing aspect of the overview. Instead there is an inflation of fashionable phrases such as 'hermeneutical stance' and 'hermeneutical practice' (p. 99). The biblical fact that Joshua ben Nun was the leader of the people of Israel after Moses is presented with the formulation: "according to various biblical narratives" (p. 101). The fact that Pico was in touch with, and learnt from, three Jewish scholars does not mean that he "acquired these requisite skills [linguistic and theological background]" (p. 103) for becoming competent in independent reading of Kabbalistic texts, an issue which was thrown in doubt many years ago by Chaim Wirszubski. Kabbalah was already a very popular trend in the Jewish world by the fifteenth century and not "relatively new within Judaism" (pp. 103-104), and among its few opponents we find Delmedigo. It is very difficult to know what Riva means when he referes to "the cabalist tradition . . . from Maimonides to Abulafia" (p. 104, n. 68), since Maimonides is known for his rational and anti-mystical approach. Speculations concerning Pico's "conversion to the Cabala" (pp. 104-105) can hardly be qualified as "scholarship."

Let us move now to what is probably the volume's most significant scholarly contribution, the new annotated English translation (Part II, pp. 107-277). It can generally be said that it is quite reliable and provides the Latin-less reader with a mostly adequate translation together with some useful information in the footnotes. There are, of course, some minor issues regarding certain decisions taken by the translators. Consider the following examples. The "dignity of man" theme (p. 111, n. 7) has many ancient and medieval accounts that should have been at least partially referred to, given the importance of the theme; scholastic discussions might have been crucial here considering Pico's scholastic formation. The words 'supremi spiritus' are translated as 'the Intelligences' (pp. 118-119) and no explanation is provided for this decision. The words 'emolumenta' and 'dignitatem' are translated as 'dignity' and 'value' (p. 163) although it would have been rather easy in this case, and also more accurate, to keep the plural in 'emolumenta' and render it as 'benefits', which is better in this context (the benefits we gain from the liberal arts), and render 'dignitatem' as 'dignity'. On the same page, the exclamation 'by Hercules!' is not in the Latin and there is no explanation for it in note 116 (only a reference to Bausi's edition, where there probably is an explanation). Pico's important critical account of the status of philosophy in his own time (pp. 182-183) should have been contextualized (i.e., dealing with the question of why Pico thinks that philosophical activity in his time is derided and disparaged), beyond following Bausi's reference to Cicero' De finibus (p. 183, n. 180) and even the important information provided (page 185, nn. 181-182) is not enough. The mention of the word 'conscientia' (pp. 188 and 196) required some scholarly account of this important concept in the ancient and especially the scholastic contexts. The same applies to 'disputandi genus' (p. 190) which surely deserved a discussion of some scholastic practices. Important remarks on Thomas and Scotus, for instance, (p. 200) or on Giles of Rome, Francis of Meyronnes, Albert the Great and Henry of Ghent, (p. 204) did not receive any serious discussion in the footnotes. Pico's remark on the unique feature that each philosophical school has (p. 202), as well as the addition in the Palatino manuscript ( p. 213, n. 249) concerning "the privileges of truth," both deserved a scholarly account in the light of his "concordism".

To conclude: this volume and the Pico Project as a whole are probably going to increase the availibility of Pico's Oration. But with regard to the second part of thecredo of the scholars participating in this project, to provide "a better understanding," much more work is still needed.


[1] S.A. Farmer [ed. and trans.], Syncretism in the West: Pico's 900 Theses (1486) (Tempe, Ariz. 1998). See also the critical notes on this edition in Luc Deitz, 'De omni re scibili: et de quibusdam aliis. A New Attempt at Understanding Pico's 900 "Theses"', in Neulateinisches Jahrbuch 7 (2005), pp. 295-301. Seen in this light, Bori's assessment of Farmer’s edition as being "important" (p. 19, n. 28, in the volume under review) is problematic. 

[2] These four scholars of the last generation, who paid a great deal of attention to the relationship between humanists and theology, developed the notion of a specifically humanist theology, which they interpreted in various ways: Charles Trinkaus, concentrating mainly on Petrarch, Salutati, and Valla, used the term 'rhetorical theology'; Salvatore Camporeale, focusing primarily on Valla, used the term 'teologia umanistica'; and John O'Malley, who studied sermons delivered in Rome, coined the term 'Renaissance theology'. See Charles Trinkaus, In Our Image and Likeness: Humanity and Divinity in Italian Humanist Thought, 2 vols., (London 1970); The Scope of Renaissance Humanism (Ann Arbor 1983); Salvatore I. Camporeale, Lorenzo Valla: umanesimo e teologia (Florence 1972); Lorenzo Valla: umanesimo, riforma e controriforma, studi e testi, (Rome 2002); John O’Malley, Praise and Blame in Renaissance Rome: Rhetoric, Doctrine, and Reform in Sacred Orators of the Papal Court 1450-1521 (Durham, North Carolina 1979). See also the historiographical remarks in Camporeale, Lorenzo Valla: umanesimo… (2002), p. 247, n. 60; p. 346, n. 12. For the relation between Roman humanism and religion see John F. D'Amico, Renaissance Humanism in Papal Rome: Humanists and Churchmen on the Eve of the Reformation (Baltimore 1983), especially pp. 144-168. D'Amico on p. 167 prefers, for his historical context, the term 'theologia erudita' or 'docta' to Trinkaus' 'theologia rhetorica'.