2013.03.29

José L. Zalabardo

Scepticism and Reliable Belief

José L. Zalabardo, Scepticism and Reliable Belief, Oxford University Press, 2012, 213pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199656073.

Reviewed by Tim Black, California State University, Northridge


To put it far too mildly, skepticism has been a thorn in epistemology's side for, well, a very long time. José L. Zalabardo falls in step with other reliabilists as they search for a solution to certain persistent skeptical problems, including the problem of the criterion, problems arising from the regress argument, and problems arising from arguments rooted in skeptical hypotheses. Zalabardo argues for a theory of knowledge -- or, at least, for a theory of non-inferential knowledge -- that is reliabilist in nature. His theory employs, most prominently, a sensitivity condition of the sort proposed by Robert Nozick:[1] S knows that p if S wouldn't believe that p if p were false. Zalabardo argues that the skeptical arguments he considers pose a threat to our knowledge only if one's knowing that p requires that one have adequate evidence for p. For Zalabardo, however, one can know that p even though one does not have adequate evidence for p. In this way, his theory is meant to disarm the skeptical arguments he considers.

This is the main argumentative thrust of Zalabardo's book. But he's also up to some other things. In Chapters 4 and 5, he considers inferential knowledge, addressing two questions: how must two propositions be related if one of them is to provide adequate evidential support for the other, and when p adequately supports q, how can a subject have inferential knowledge that q on the basis of p? Zalabardo argues in Chapter 4 that p adequately supports q only if there is a high likelihood ratio of p or a high value for the probability of q given p. He argues in Chapter 5 that a subject has inferential knowledge that q on the basis of p only if the subject knows both that p and that p supports q.

In Chapter 6, Zalabardo presents an account of non-inferential knowledge. He maintains that there are two kinds of non-inferential knowledge. One involves beliefs that track the truth, which requires that beliefs be both sensitive and safe (see 118). The other involves what he calls standing beliefs, which count as knowledge so long as they are true (see 136-9). It is important to note that since his account of non-inferential knowledge is a reliabilist one, it rejects what he calls the evidential constraint, according to which "knowing p requires having adequate evidence in support of p" (5). It is this feature of his account that gives it the power to disarm skeptical arguments in which the evidential constraint plays a fundamental role: "the rejection of the evidential constraint . . . open[s] major gaps in all the standard lines of reasoning against our knowledge claims" (5). Still, as Zalabardo claims in Chapter 7, there is a kind of skepticism that his account of knowledge cannot disarm: I know that snow is white, but I cannot know that my belief that snow is white is true. Beliefs of this sort are not standing beliefs, they do not track the truth, and we cannot have adequate evidence for them. In Chapter 8, Zalabardo suggests that we can find the roots of this lingering skeptical problem in a realist conception of cognition, one that sees cognition as aiming at truth, construed "as independent of the procedures we employ in its pursuit" (167). As an alternative to realism, he considers anti-realist conceptions of cognition, which see cognition as aiming at things that might be more accessible than truth, e.g., "warranted assertibility, maximally coherent belief systems, beliefs that we would hold under ideal conditions, and beliefs that would secure consensus at the end of enquiry" (171). He argues, however, that this conception of cognition is defective. The book ends with the outline of what Zalabardo calls a middle position between the realist and anti-realist conceptions of cognition. The middle position rejects the thought, found in both realism and anti-realism, that accounting for the contrast between cognitive success and cognitive failure "requires specifying what [that contrast] consists in" (182). The middle position accounts for this contrast in a different way, "with a description of the procedures that we employ for ascribing cognitive success and failure" (182). The middle position, Zalabardo suggests, "has the resources for defusing the skeptical threat" (181).

While much more needs to be said about this middle position and about how it might defuse skepticism, it is interesting and often worthwhile to watch Zalabardo carry the reliabilist flag into battle. It is not clear, however, that his reliabilist strategies are distinctive enough to make it the case that the battle will have a different outcome on this occasion. He employs a sensitivity condition like Nozick's, a safety condition like Ernest Sosa's,[2] and an account of evidential support and a probabilistic semantics for counterfactuals that are similar to Sherrilyn Roush's.[3] Having said that, it must be granted that Zalabardo parts ways with his predecessors at certain places. For example, his sensitivity condition, unlike Nozick's, is meant to be a sufficient but not a necessary condition for knowledge(see 63). Another significant place where Zalabardo parts ways with Nozick is in the role that belief-forming methods play in a theory of knowledge. Methods play a prominent role for Nozick, but methods have no role to play in Zalabardo's theory of knowledge. I will return to this issue shortly, but I want first to discuss Zalabardo's rejection of the evidential constraint on knowledge.

The evidential constraint on knowledge is this: "knowing p requires having adequate evidence in support of p" (5). One way -- but not the only way -- of arguing for this constraint is by using as a premise the following evidential constraint on epistemic rationality and responsibility: "If a subject doesn't have adequate evidence for a proposition p that she believes, then from the point of view of her conception of her situation she is epistemically irrational and irresponsible in believing that p" (32). Here's how such an argument might go:

  1. If S knows that p, then from the point of view of her conception of her situation she is epistemically rational or responsible in believing that p.
  2. If from the point of view of S's conception of her situation she is epistemically rational or responsible in believing that p, then she has adequate evidence in support of p. (Evidential constraint on epistemic rationality and responsibility)
  3. Therefore, if S knows that p, then she has adequate evidence in support of p. (Evidential constraint on knowledge)

Zalabardo denies the evidential constraint on epistemic rationality and responsibility:

a belief can in principle be rational and responsible from the point of view of the subject's conception of her situation even if she has no evidence for it. This will be so if the subject has done her best by her lights to determine the truth value of the proposition in question. (33)

But the reliabilist can show that this argument is unsound simply by showing that (1) is false; to show that the argument is unsound, the reliabilist needn't ever go near the evidential constraint on epistemic rationality and responsibility. But why not? A clue lies in something Zalabardo had said earlier in Chapter 2, when he "assume[s] for the sake of the argument that it makes perfect sense to ascribe to belief rationality and responsibility, as well as their opposites [irrationality and irresponsibility]" (27). This assumption strikes me as mistaken and, indeed, as something pretty close to a bit of nonsense. I am not at all sure what it means to say that beliefs themselves are rational or to say that beliefs themselves are responsible. I presume that if a belief is responsible, then it can be responsiblefor something or to someone. It seems utterly wrongheaded, however, to say that beliefs themselves can be responsible for anything or to anyone. Moreover, beliefs themselves are certainly not rational in the way that human beings are rational. Perhaps, though, we can say that a belief is rational in the way that a choice or a decision is rational: a rational choice or decision is one made rationally or one the agent is rational in making. Maybe a rational belief is one formed or held rationally or one the agent is rational in forming or in holding. But this is not to ascribe rationality to abelief but, on the contrary, to ascribe rationality to a believer. Since this is precisely what happens in (2)'s antecedent, where a believer is described as being epistemically rational or responsible in believing that p, and in (2)'s consequent, where a believer is said to have adequate evidence for p, it seems that the reliabilist might simply let (2) stand.

But if the reliabilist does this, won't that somehow open the door to those who want to impose an evidential constraint on knowledge? Not necessarily, since the reliabilist can say that what's required for knowledge is not that the believer possess some property or other, such as having a certain sort of evidence or being epistemically rational or responsible, but only that the belief possess some property or other, such as being true or being sensitive. This important qualification allows the reliabilist to deny both (1) and (3) above. S can know that p in virtue of the fact that her belief is true and sensitive. And, the reliabilist can say, since a belief's possessing these properties is not conceptually connected to the believer's being epistemically rational or responsible or to the believer's having evidence of a certain sort, it is possible for the believer to know that p even when she isn't epistemically rational or responsible and even when she lacks adequate evidence for p. The reliabilist and theresponsibilist might very well disagree when it comes to the constraints on knowledge, but there seems to be no reason why the reliabilist must go so far as to deny the evidential constraint on epistemic rationality and responsibility.

Let's now return to the issue of belief-forming methods and their place in a theory of knowledge. Nozick recognizes the limitations of his initial statement of the sensitivity condition, according to which S knows that p only if S wouldn't believe that p if p were false. (Zalabardo recounts these on 57.) In light of these limitations, Nozick revises his sensitivity condition, relativizing it to belief-forming methods: if p weren't true and S were to use M to arrive at a belief as to whether p, then S wouldn't believe, via M, that p (where M is the belief-forming method S uses in the actual world in forming the belief that p). Zalabardo rejects this methodized version of sensitivity. He reminds us that "many belief-forming methods capable of producing knowledge are what Nozick calls one-sided methods" (58). A one-sided method cannot recommend that we believe ~p; it either recommends that we believe p or it makes no recommendation. Consider, for example,

a medical test for a condition with virtually no false positives but lots of false negatives. A positive result in the test virtually guarantees that the condition is present, but a negative result provides only very weak support for the hypothesis that the condition is absent, since lots of people with the condition test negative. This test can recommend belief in the proposition that the condition is present, but it can only recommend very weakly belief in the proposition that the condition is not present. (58)

The problem is that, where one-sided methods are concerned, "satisfaction of the method-relative condition can depend on what happens in worlds that are much more remote than those that determine satisfaction of the unrelativized condition" (59-60). Consider a case in which a doctor believes that the condition is present in a particular patient. If her belief is based solely on the positive result of the one-sided test described above, then her belief will satisfy the unmethodized sensitivity condition: "in the nearest world in which the condition is absent she won't believe that it is present" (60). However, "Once we relativize to methods," Zalabardo claims, "what happens in the nearest worlds in which the condition is absent no longer settles the issue. Now we need to look at the nearest worlds in which the condition is absent and the doctor forms a belief as to whether or not the condition is present using the test" (60). But "If in the nearest world in which the condition is absent and the method produces a belief, it produces the belief that the condition is present, the doctor's actual belief won't have the status of knowledge, after all" (60). This strikes Zalabardo as the wrong result:

If she forms the belief with the method that we have described, the doctor's belief that the condition is present should count as knowledge by virtue of the fact that she won't form the belief that the condition is present in any nearby world in which the condition is absent, independently of what happens in the more remote worlds in which the condition is absent and the method produces a belief (60).

Zalabardo considers some reformulations of method sensitivity that might be able to avoid this problem, including "remov[ing] mention of the method employed from the antecedent of the sensitivity subjunctive" (60) and "us[ing] a different construal of the notion of forming a belief" so as to include "cases in which S suspends judgement on whether or not p with M" (61). These are the only reformulations he considers, and he argues that neither of them works. He says, though, that "There might be other more promising revisions of the notion [of method sensitivity] that achieve the intended result" (63). He chooses, however, not to pursue any other revision. I want to suggest that there is a revision that might very well achieve the intended result. Rather than formulating the methodized sensitivity condition in this way:

Methods-1

If it were true that p is false and M produces a belief as to whether p, then M would not produce the belief that p,

we might formulate it like this:

Methods-2

If p were false, then if M were to produce a belief as to whether p, M would not produce the belief that p.

In the case of the doctor's belief that the condition is present in a particular patient, Methods-1 demands that we examine the nearest worlds in which the following conjunction is true: the condition is absent and the test produces a belief as to whether or not the condition is present. These worlds are very remote, as we have seen, and so we can side with Zalabardo here and say that the doctor's belief is insensitive when Methods-1 is the operative version of sensitivity.

But what about Methods-2? It demands in the first place that we examine the nearest worlds in which the condition is not present in the patient. It then demands that we look among all and only those worlds for worlds in which the test produces a belief as to whether the condition is present. But there are no such worlds: the nearest worlds in which the condition is absent are worlds in which the test comes back negative and therefore recommends no belief. The high number of false negatives keeps the doctor (in these non-actual worlds) from forming a belief as to whether the condition is present. But this means that the doctor's (actual-world) belief that the condition is present is sensitive: the nearest worlds in which the condition is absent are worlds in which the test fails to produce a belief as to whether or not the condition is present and therefore fails to produce the belief that the condition is present. Given Methods-2, the doctor's belief is sensitive.[4]

It seems, then, that there are reformulations of method sensitivity that stand a chance of handling the case of one-sided methods. Even if the reformulation I've suggested is deficient, the possibility that there is a satisfactory reformulation is one that should be explored. Moreover, given that there is a decent chance that a satisfactory reformulation is available, there is little reason to reject a methodized version of the sensitivity condition. But it is the rejection of methodized versions of sensitivity that pushes Zalabardo toward some of the more distinctive elements of his account, for example, toward the thought that we need one sort of theory for inferential knowledge and a different sort for non-inferential knowledge. If we hold on to methodized sensitivity, however, we need only one sort of theory, a truth-tracking theory, and we can use it in accounting both for inferential knowledge and for non-inferential knowledge. In addition, it seems that a methodized sensitivity theory of knowledge can disarm all the same skeptical arguments, and in the same way, as Zalabardo's theory. Methodized sensitivity theories, just like Zalabardo's theory, will deny the evidential constraint, and this gives them the power to disarm any skeptical argument in which that constraint plays a fundamental role. Given all this, it's not clear why we ought to prefer Zalabardo's theory over one whose cornerstone is a methodized version of the sensitivity condition.

Despite the concerns I've voiced here, I think Scepticism and Reliable Belief is an important work in epistemology: it makes a strong push for a reliabilist response to skepticism, and it does so with fresh eyes and in a clear and thorough manner. Those of us who have an interest in finding an adequate response to skepticism will benefit from a close and careful examination of Zalabardo's book.[5]

 

REFERENCES

Nozick, Robert. (1981). Philosophical Explanations, Cambridge, MA, Harvard University Press.

Roush, Sherrilyn. (2005). Tracking Truth: Knowledge, Evidence, and Science, Oxford, Oxford University Press.

Sosa, Ernest. (1999). 'How to Defeat Opposition to Moore', Philosophical Perspectives 13, 141-54.

Williamson, Timothy. (2000). Knowledge and its Limits, Oxford, Oxford University Press.



[1] See Nozick 1981.

[2] See Sosa 1999, for example.

[3] See Roush 2005.

[4] Zalabardo gives the following case, which might count against Methods-2: Suppose that Grandma believes that her grandson is well and that she does so only on the basis of consulting a crystal ball, which tells her that her grandson is well "by failing to shatter when lightly stroked with a feather" (61). But if it were not the case that her grandson is well, others "would remove and destroy her crystal ball" (61). It seems that Grandma's belief is Methods-2 sensitive in this case -- if her grandson were not well, then her crystal ball would produce no belief as to whether or not her grandson is well and, therefore, she would not believe that he is well. It also seems that she does not know that her grandson is well. Given that her belief is sensitive but that she does not have knowledge, Zalabardo concludes that a reformulation like Methods-2 "has to be rejected" (61). So far as I can see, though, Zalabardo's case does not speak at all against Methods-2 as a sensitivity conditional. If it speaks against anything, it speaks against casting Methods-2 as a sufficient condition for knowledge (on this, see Williamson 2000, 154-5). But to say that Methods-2 is no good as a sufficient condition for knowledge is not to say and does not entail that it is no good as a sensitivity conditional. Zalabardo's case does nothing to show that we should reject Methods-2. (Incidentally, Nozick, as well as every other sensitivity theorist I know of, maintains that sensitivity is a necessary but not a sufficient condition for knowledge.) Many thanks here to Kelly Becker.

[5] For their comments on an earlier version of this review, I thank Kelly Becker and Takashi Yagisawa.