G. A. Cohen

Finding Oneself in the Other

G. A. Cohen, Finding Oneself in the Other, Michael Otsuka (ed.), Princeton University Press, 2012, 240pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780691148816.

Reviewed by Ralf M. Bader, Merton College, University of Oxford

Michael Otsuka has once again put together a wonderful collection of G. A. Cohen's writings. The present volume contains both philosophical and non-philosophical writings, covering a broad array of topics, ranging from short pieces on diverse issues, including anti-Apartheid academic boycotts, the question of what it is to regard people as equals, spirituality, and a lengthy essay that recounts Cohen's experiences and encounters during a two-week trip through India. The essays are a joy to read -- they are fun, engaging and insightful -- and they provide a fascinating perspective on Cohen's philosophical development, on the intellectual context in which he was active, and on the way in which he viewed and experienced the world. Accordingly, they will be of interest not just to those working in moral and political philosophy but to a much broader audience. This review focuses on the more philosophical papers.[1]


Chapter 5 'Complete Bullshit' combines the well-known paper 'Deeper into Bullshit' with the previously unpublished piece 'Why one kind of Bullshit flourishes in France'. In the first part Cohen distinguishes two different kinds of bullshit. On the one hand, there is the kind of bullshit that was the focus of Frankfurt's seminal work and that is concerned with the intentions and mental states of the person making an utterance, consisting in a certain disregard of or indifference to truth. On the other, there is the kind that Cohen is primarily concerned: that which has to do with the meaning (or lack thereof) of what is asserted, and which consists in the unclarity of a statement that cannot be rendered clear. The second part of the paper then explains the prevalence of Cohen-bullshit in France in terms of factors such as the monolithic academic culture centred on Paris, a preoccupation with style, and the presence of a large lay audience interested in philosophy.

While Cohen does not provide an analysis of what it is for a statement to be unclarifiable, he puts forward a sufficient condition (which he attributes to Arthur Brown), namely "that adding or subtracting (if it has one) a negation sign from a text makes no difference to its level of plausibility: no force in a statement has been grasped if its putative grasper would react no differently to its negation from how he reacts to the original statement" (pp. 105-106). This proposal seems problematic insofar as the plausibility of the proposition that Fellows' lawn has an even number of blades of grass at a particular time seems to be equal to the plausibility of the negation of this proposition, yet neither of these propositions is bullshit. While the unfounded assertion of either statement might constitute an act of Frankfurt-bullshitting, in that the assertion would be groundless and as such not display a concern for truth, it would not be a case of Cohen-bullshitting since the statements are both perfectly clear and can be grasped (though not evaluated) straightforwardly. The problem is that there are a number of reasons why one statement might be equally plausible as its negation, including being meaningless, lacking a truth-value, having an indeterminate truth-value, being equiprobable as its negation, and being unverifiable or undecidable. Unclarifiable unclarity is only one of these reasons, which makes it the case that the proposed sufficient condition will conflate these different phenomena.


The philosophically most substantive part of the collection is chapter 8 ('Rescuing Conservatism: A Defense of Existing Value'). In this paper, Cohen identifies three different considerations that underwrite a (non-absolute) bias in favour of preserving and retaining that which is of value, even if it could be replaced by something of greater value, namely (i) the personal value something has in virtue of the relationships in which it stands to various people, (ii) the particular value that an object has in virtue of being the particular valuable thing that it is, and (iii) the idea that we should accept things as given and take them the way they come without viewing them as things that are to be shaped by us. (The paper mostly focuses on (ii).)

According to Cohen's construal, conservatism involves a commitment to valuing something as being a particular valuable thing, rather than merely valuing it for the value that resides in this thing. In this way, the value of an object is not restricted to its intrinsic value. There is, accordingly, reason to regret the destruction of what is intrinsically valuable which is not reducible to its intrinsic value. Prima facie, the conservative bias can be construed in two ways, namely (i) the object has additional value in virtue of existing, above and beyond the value that it derives from its intrinsic properties, leading to a bias in its favour, or (ii) adequately responding to the value of something that exists requires us to be biased in its favour. In other words, this conservative commitment can be construed either axiologically or deontically.

Despite frequently using language that naturally fits with a deontic reading, for instance when talking about what exists as being such that it is 'not right to treat it as a mere means' (p. 148), Cohen is clear that he is trying to develop an axiological account. The fact that particular value is to be understood axiologically (as value that is to be promoted or maximised) is highlighted by the discussion of preservation in that the bias can have an effect on what one is to do if one has the choice between preserving different things, since this presupposes that this type of value can be aggregated and weighed-up (cf. p. 156). Moreover, Cohen wants the commitment to particular value to be compatible with consequentialism. If this is to include Pettit's construal of consequentialism as recognisingonly value that is to be promoted, then particular value would end up being incompatible if it were understood along the lines of an attitude/response account. Additionally, drawing on comments byHurka, Cohen argues that the type of bias in favour of what exists and against its replaceability that he is concerned with is different from the standard deontological idea that replacement counts as a violation of deontic strictures. This is because there are cases where conservatism requires preservation, rather than merely not destroying the object (cf. pp. 163-164). Finally, the non-absoluteness of the bias towards conserving what exists implies that particular value can be weighed up against and is commensurable with intrinsic value, i.e., for y to be such that it should replace x, it needs to be the case that y-x > Δ(x), i.e., the difference in intrinsic value has to exceed the particular value of x, which presupposes commensurability of the value of y with Δ(x).

By 'existing' Cohen does not mean 'presently existing' since he is happy to accept that "future existents, and not just present ones, can, on my view, be subject to the same abuse, and the same respect, now, as present ones" (p. 166). Accordingly, it is the modal rather than the temporal status of an object that determines whether the conservative bias applies to it. In particular, what is at issue is whether the object is an independently existing object. That is, what matters is whether or not its existence is contingent relative to the set of alternatives under consideration. This leads to the result that something that will be replaced no matter what we do will not warrant regret since the conservative bias will apply equally to both that which will go out of existence and to that which will replace it. That is, if the existence of both that which presently exists and that which will replace it is independent, then both x and its replacement y exist (atemporally) and we should be biased in favour of both of them, ensuring that they are on a par in this respect and that no regret is warranted on the basis of a loss of particular value (assuming that they are of the same magnitude).[2],[3]

Cases in which x will be replaced no matter what we do, but where it is up to us whether it is y or z that replaces x, put pressure on the idea that the conservative bias is concerned with particular valuable things. In such cases, either y or z will exist, i.e., the disjunction of y and z exists independently. If one is not to regret the inevitable destruction of x, where it is guaranteed to be replaced by y, it would seem that one should likewise not regret the inevitable destruction of x, where it is guaranteed to be replaced by either y or z. This, however, implies that 'particular value' does not have anything to do with the particularity of what is valued. What is at issue then is no longer whether a particular object exists independently, but simply the number of objects that will exist, i.e., whether there is a slot that will be filled (at least in cases in which the different possible replacements would have the same degree of particular value). In the case of future existents, the conservative bias is accordingly not concerned with the fact that a particular thing will exist, but rather merely with the fact that something will exist.

The axiological account that assigns additional value to existing things is problematic insofar as that which replaces an existing object will also have this additional value once it is brought into existence. If x presently exists, then it has Δ(x) particular value. If y replaces x, then y will exist and will have Δ(y) additional value. In determining what to do, for instance whether to replace x by y, one should thus not only consider the intrinsic value that y will have but also the value it will have in virtue of existing once it is brought into existence. That is, the fact that the bias does not make a difference when both x and its replacement are independently existing objects would seem to apply even where y is a dependent existent, which would render the bias in favour of what does exist (or will exist) redundant.

Cohen might respond that the fact that the particular value of something is dependent on our choice to bring it into existence disqualifies it from entering into our evaluation of the possible courses of actions open to the agent. However, even if the additional value of y would not be allowed to feature in any prospective evaluation, which would mean that replacement is prospectively understood as involving the loss of x + Δ(x) and only the gain of y but not of Δ(y), there would not seem to be anything that would preclude it from featuring in a retrospective evaluation, which would mean that replacement is retrospectively understood as involving the loss of x + Δ(x) and the gain of y + Δ(y). From the point of view of a retrospective evaluation, y is in existence and its additional value deriving from its existence should accordingly be taken into consideration. This risks leading to dynamic attitudinal inconsistency in that, even though one should lament the prospect of y replacing x, once y exists one should rejoice in (or at least be neutral about) its having replaced x.

A further problem arises in case x exists and can be replaced by either y or z, both of which are better than x, but where only z is such that the value differential is greater than the additional value of x and where z-y < Δ(y). In such a situation, the non-absolute bias implies that one should replace x by z but not by y. However, if one acts contrary to what one has most reason to do and picks y instead, then one ends up in the strange situation whereby even though one should have chosen z rather than y when x existed, once y exists it should not be replaced by z since y + Δ(y) > z (and Δ(z) would only count if z had been chosen instead). That is, bringing about y is sub-optimal when evaluated from the perspective where neither y nor z exists, yet once y is in existence the situation is no longer sub-optimal and retrospectively it would seem that one has not made any mistake that now needs to be corrected.

An important question that Cohen fails to address is what happens in the case of a particular that has disvalue. Is there also a bias with respect to existing disvaluable things, this time a bias against preserving and instead in favour of destroying? If not, where does the asymmetry come from, i.e., what makes it the case that the bias only applies to positively valuable objects? If we are to conserve and cherish that which is good and has positive intrinsic value, should we not equally destroy and be repulsed by that which is bad and has negative intrinsic value? If we should "love the lovable" (p. 148), should we also despise the despicable? By symmetry reasoning, retaining what has value even if something of greater value would replace it would commit one to rejecting what has disvalue even if something of greater disvalue will take its place. The conservative bias can then become very expensive. This is because there can be cases that are such that one starts out with a mildly bad situation and then through a sequence of actions, each of which is seen as an improvement, one ends up in a situation that is utterly miserable. For instance, a particular x that exists and has disvalue should be replaced by y, even though y is worse than x, due to the fact that the bias applies to x but not to y, i.e., the value differential in terms of intrinsic value is smaller than the effect of the bias. This ensures that, even though x > y, once the conservative bias is taken into consideration x + Δ(x) < y, thereby making it the case that a replacement will constitute an improvement. However, once y has come into existence, it should in turn be replaced by a slightly worse z, where again y + Δ(y) < z even though y > z, and so on.

A further question to be addressed is how the bias in favour of existing valuable particulars is determined. Is it a function of the intrinsic value of the object? If so, what kind of function? In case the function should turn out to be non-linear, conservatism will be an 'expensive taste' in multiple ways. Cohen is aware that "conservatism is an expensive taste, because conservatives sacrifice value in order not to sacrifice things that have value" (p. 155). That is, the bias is expensive in the sense that one will retain x even if it could be replaced by something of greater intrinsic value, which amounts to a willingness to sacrifice up to Δ(x) units of intrinsic value. A non-linear function, in addition, makes the bias expensive in the sense that one will protect x1 . . . xm rather than y1 . . . yn (all of which exist) since it is then possible that [xi + Δ(xi)] > [yi + Δ(yi)] even though xi < yi. A strictly convex function makes it better to preserve a smaller number of objects that are highly intrinsically valuable, rather than a large number of objects that have a greater total of intrinsic value but all of which are of small intrinsic value, whereas a strictly concave function (as well as a function that assigns a fixed amount of particular value to all intrinsically valuable objects) will have the converse implication.

Most fundamentally, Cohen's goal is to avoid views according to which "the bearers of value, as opposed to the value they bear, do not count as such, but matter only because of the value that they bear, and are therefore, in a deep sense, dispensable" (p. 155). Avoiding a commitment to this type of dispensability and replaceability is a laudable goal. However, the considerations adduced in this review suggest that the project of explaining non-replaceability axiologically in terms of a bias in favour of existing value is not likely to be successful. Saying that the bearers of value themselves matter, rather than only the value that inheres in them, is not addressed by simply giving them more value, by adding extra value to their intrinsic value. Instead, it would seem that understanding non-dispensability deontically in terms of existing things having a certain status that is to be respected is a more promising approach. Alternatively, or additionally, one can develop a view whereby value cannot be separated from its bearers in a way that would make the bearer a dispensable container or vehicle.[4]


Thanks to Mike Otsuka for helpful comments.

[1] Chapters 6 ('Casting the First Stone: Who Can, and Who Can't, Condemn the Terrorists?') and 7 ('Ways of Silencing Critics') are also quite philosophical, containing some fascinating reflections on the question of who can make condemnations, on the way in which the effect of a moral admonition is a function of who is making the admonition and to whom it is addressed, as well as on how tuquoque can compromise the illocutionary force of a condemnation. (Unfortunately, I am not competent to adequately comment upon these issues.)

[2] If the particular value of what inevitably replaces x is greater than that of x, we should actually be grateful for the replacement of x.

[3] It is not clear what Cohen would say about cases in which it is inevitable that y will replace x, but where it is up to us at which time the replacement occurs. In particular, it is not clear whether adequately cherishing x would commit us to delaying its inevitable destruction, or whether doing so would amount to not adequately respecting the future existent y, in which case we would be required to be indifferent as to the timing of the replacement.

[4] For such an axiological account of non-replaceability that is based on a rejection of impersonal value and that ties value directly to its bearer, cf. 'Neutrality and conditional goodness' (Bader: manuscript).