Leonard Lawlor

Early Twentieth-Century Continental Philosophy

Leonard Lawlor, Early Twentieth-Century Continental Philosophy, Indiana University Press, 2011, 296pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253357021.

Reviewed by Duane H. Davis, The University of North Carolina, Asheville

Leonard Lawlor has written a legacy book. That is, in this outstanding volume, he deconstructs what has often been taken to be the legacy of continental philosophy and tendentiously reconstructs it in important ways. Or else he is bracketing our usual assumptions and biases about continental philosophy in order to reduce it to its essential structure. Or else he wants us to inquire into the difference between such narratives.

This book remaps the mainstream of continental thought beyond the phenomenological tradition (Husserl, Heidegger, and Merleau-Ponty) to account for other confluences (notably Bergson, Freud, and some early work by Foucault). It is important to note that Lawlor is well aware that this particular expansion obviously still elides many other important figures such as Sartre, de Beauvoir, Levinas, and various critical theorists (p.vii).[1] This leads directly to the second notable aspect of this reframing project. Lawlor explicitly and relentlessly orients this expanded account toward what he calls "the great French philosophy of the Sixties" (Derrida, Deleuze, and Foucault). He has selected the figures for inclusion who support this second aspect better than others. So he is redetermining the legacy of continental thought in two ways: (1) by situating phenomenology within a larger context and (2) by orienting the larger context toward the "great French philosophy of the Sixties." Both of these aspects of his reframing are important and timely contributions. Purely and simply, the benefit in both cases is contemporary relevance for phenomenology in the contemporary philosophical agora. Far from a dilution of phenomenology, Lawlor's reframing occasions a baptism by fire. Thus early twentieth century continental philosophy -- including phenomenology -- can achieve its radical potential to "open up an experience that makes us think, that transforms who we are" (p.x).

It should be noted that this work is intended as a kind of prequel to Lawlor's masterful Thinking through French Philosophy.[2] "While Thinking through French Philosophy attempts to determine a 'diffraction' of philosophical positions," this work "attempts to determine the 'light' that is being diffracted" (pp.x-xi). The reader should note that Lawlor is very consciously retrieving the phenomenological metaphor of light Heidegger claims to be at the root of the term phenomenon -- and hence of phenomenology -- to stipulate what light gets bent in more recent French thought. These two books taken together provide a very interesting and valuable spectrum of thought.

A related text that also seeks to de-center the phenomenological movement within twentieth century French thought is Alan D. Schrift's tour de force, Twentieth-Century French Philosophy: Key Themes and Thinkers (Wiley-Blackwell, 2005). Schrift's book is based upon years of meticulous research and allows for an understanding of academic life in twentieth-century France that, like Lawlor's work, differs greatly from the usual American phenomenologically centered caricature. One might be tempted to attribute such glosses to the leaders of SPEP, The Society for Phenomenological and Existential Philosophy.[3] However, is anyone more established and respected in that venerable and important American institution than Lawlor or Schrift? This is all the more reason to carefully consider these works and to recognize their essential contribution to the future of continental philosophy. Lawlor, while speaking of his own work, states well that his aim is "the renewal of the impulse of twentieth-century continental philosophy for the future" (p.xi).

Lawlor's work is organized around the aforementioned selected figures, whose work he presents forcefully and effectively so as to reframe early twentieth-century continental philosophy. The book includes a brief introduction, where Lawlor candidly explains his agenda. The main part of the book includes seven chapters on key texts written by the six figures Lawlor has selected (Heidegger merits two chapters here). These chapters are arranged chronologically according to the publication date of the selected key text. Following these chapters, Lawlor includes a brief conclusion raising further questions about the tradition he has reframed. Finally, he includes two very important brief appendices on the themes of immanence and trait.

Each of the main chapters provides a very brief introduction to the selected key text to be examined in the chapter, a "summary -- commentary" section, where Lawlor carefully explicates these concepts in the larger context of the philosopher's work, a more speculative "interpretation" section, and a "transition" section, he Lawlor discusses the relations among these figures as he constitutes the reframed tradition of early twentieth-century continental philosophy. The remainder of our discussion here follows his organization of the book, concluding with some critical reflections on Lawlor's approach.

* * * * *

The titles of each chapter are as interesting as the selection of the key texts, and they indicate the role in the narrative Lawlor constructs about early twentieth-century continental philosophy. The chapter on Bergson, focused on his 1903 text, "Introduction to Metaphysics," is titled "Thinking Beyond Platonism." It is a matter of great significance to begin the reframed narrative with Bergson. "Bergson's overcoming of Platonism" is the name Lawlor gives to a radical revision of the task of philosophy that eschews the dominance of analysis and metaphysics. We are led to the emphasis of intuition over understanding and duration over objective time.

Bergson critiques analysis, which he characterized as the modern "elevation of the soul over the Idea" (p.28). But this modern reversal of Platonism remains incomplete in analysis, which Bergson defines as a relative thought from outside things, as opposed to intuition which is an entering-into the things that is concrete, immediate, a-perspectival, and absolute (pp.17-18). Bergson's philosophy thus transforms conceptualization: intuition allows the "'reversal' of the habitual work of intelligence" such that we "go . . . from the things to the concepts" -- from thought from the outside to thinking from within (p.17).

Just as importantly, philosophy is transformed when it no longer seeks a fixed, metaphysical reality as foundation and no longer seeks traditional conceptualization by and for the understanding as its goal. The shift from analysis to intuition reveals duration. Intuition is a kind of "dilation of the mind" that moves between durations (p.26). This yields a "qualitative multiplicity" rather than a quantitative multiplicity, which would be nothing short of a new way of seeing the world (p.22). Lawlor describes the emphasis on "real duration" as a focus on variability (p.26). Variability is not variation among existing things as given, but it is a kind of variability "without an original form and without an ultimate purpose" (p.26). It is an attempt to attend to becoming. As such, philosophy must face a crisis of conceptualization: if intuitive knowledge is to be communicated, it requires a new re-conceptualization of the concept. This is what Lawlor identifies as "the central problem in Bergson's thought" (p.30). In order to account for creativity and becoming, this will entail "fluid concepts" and "a continuous heterogeneity" (pp.36-7). All of this bespeaks the great promise of Bergson's thought, which Lawlor portrays as the beginning of the continental philosophical critiques of modern subjectivity and modern metaphysics.

Lawlor's account of Bergson provides a great starting point for beginners who will be motivated to explore Bergson's works. But the value of his account is not restricted to beginners. It nicely integrates some disparate aspects of Bergson's work and provides a provocative case for displacing the phenomenological myth of origin, where continental philosophy seems to have emerged from the head of Husserl. Lawlor's reframing provides early twentieth-century continental philosophy with a new mythos.

The reframing project continues with chapter on Freud's 1915 essay, "The Unconscious," which is titled "Schizophrenic Thought." If the central philosophical problem of Bergsonism is conceptualization, the parallel central problem for psychoanalysis is how the unconscious can become conscious (p.39). Yet Lawlor closes his brief introduction to the chapter by stating that "Freud discovers schizophrenic thought" (p.39). And he ends the chapter by presenting the description of Freudian psychoanalysis as an "anti-phenomenology" (p.62). Lawlor invokes this characterization because psychoanalysis "overcomes a philosophy of consciousness" (p.62). Freud shows, above all, that consciousness is inadequate to the task of accounting for itself, let alone to the task of serving as the foundation of the self. "Freud goes beyond immanent subjective experience . . . to multiplicity. This is a genuine multiplicity (continuous heterogeneity) because it is a repetition not bound to a prior form." (p.62).

To say that the reframing project is less than subtle here is not to contest the value of Lawlor's interpretation. One does not need to be an expert in the thought of Derrida, Foucault, or Deleuze and Guatarri to appreciate that part of Lawlor's project is to establish an alternate mythos that empowers "the great French Philosophers of the sixties."

Lawlor's account of Freud is especially good on the interrelated themes of the topographical aspects of the model, repression, and meta-psychology -- including the recognition of the unconscious by consciousness, and the ability to avoid such recognition. Meta-psychology lies at the heart of Freud's contribution to early twentieth-continental philosophy. Meta-psychology has three aspects: (1) the topographical view of the psyche with its unique spatial regions; (2) the energetic view with its quantities of psychic energy seeking discharge; and (3) the dynamic view, which discloses mobile drives that can charge different ideas (p.57). Meta-psychology is always indirect, since consciousness cannot have direct and immediate access to the unconscious. "Meta-psychology entirely concerns the derivatives, the substitutes, and the representatives" (p.59). Thus the kind of recognition that we can have of the unconscious entails a kind of "agnostic" understanding of some translated original state. Rather, what is implied (not known with certainty) is an original state that is always already lost. What is actually presented is anarchic energy manifest as repetitions without access to some origin.

Lawlor makes a useful analogy, since Freud invokes the metaphor of translation to describe the task of psychoanalysis: "If the sublation of repression occurs through translation, then the original text to be translated has been lost" (pp.60-61). That is, it discloses a language that is unfettered by that of which it speaks -- a description of schizophrenic speech. So meta-psychology is not the pure presentation of the inner depths of the psyche, but "a critique and correction of inner perception" (p.62). Lawlor says that whereas Bergson's great contribution was to show that there is no access to a whole of meaning, Freud disabuses us of a return to an origin or archē. Both Bergson and Freud have provided fundamental challenges to modern theories of consciousness (cast as philosophies of transcendence) and hence provided a foundation for the development of a philosophy of immanence. Thus, Lawlor has reframed the origins of early twentieth-century continental philosophy to Bergson's and Freud's critical upheaval of modern thought rather than the traditional story of Husserl's transcendental phenomenology, to which he turns in the next chapter.

Lawlor selects the final version[4] of Husserl's classic 1929 Encyclopedia Britannica article on phenomenology as the key text for this chapter, "Consciousness as Distance." He selects this late text not only because it is more nuanced than some of Husserl's earlier work, and because it is a clear, concise statement of Husserlian phenomenology, but primarily because "it is written under the pressure of Heidegger's influence" (p.82 & 64-65). As usual, Lawlor's discussion is clear, informed, edifying, and forceful. He presents the basic features of Husserl's phenomenology (i.e., intentionality, epochē, reduction, etc.), yet this is set out in such a way that it downplays the aspects of Husserl's thought that resemble an idealistic Cartesian purification project. Instead Lawlor stresses a version of Husserl as a philosopher of difference and a philosopher of immanence.[5] Phenomenology becomes a "thought of the outside" achieved as a reduction to immanence. This is accomplished, according to Husserl, as we clearly differentiate the psychological from the transcendental aspects of experience. Lawlor's emphasis resituates Husserl's later thought as a calling-into-question of his earlier idealistic consciousness-based phenomenology. This will lead Husserl to move beyond consciousness as presence to "something like the unconscious" (pp.82-83) -- thus reframing Husserl in terms of the trajectory already established in the previous two chapters on Bergson and Freud. Indeed, Lawlor's commentary section concludes with a hopeful gesture to the value of Husserl's thought even while acknowledging the withering critiques offered by Derrida, Foucault, and Deleuze. Lawlor reframes the triumph of Husserlian phenomenology as perhaps reaching "variation freed from univocity and teleology," -- "something like Bergsonian multiplicity and Freudian schizophrenic thought" (p.87).

Lawlor next turns his attention to the thought of Martin Heidegger, whose work was surely the most important philosophical influence in early twentieth-century continental thought. And since Heidegger made not one single grand contribution, but two, Lawlor devotes two separate chapters to him.

The next chapter, "The Thought of the Nothing," is based upon Heidegger's 1929 key text, What is Metaphysics? Lawlor has characterized early twentieth-century continental philosophy as a transformation from immanence, to difference, to language-questioning, to the overcoming of metaphysics (p.89). If Husserl's phenomenology was hopefully described as tending toward the overcoming of metaphysics, it is fulfilled in Heidegger's early work.

Lawlor nicely explicates Heidegger's reflection on the nothing in the context of the ontological difference -- the difference between being and beings. Heidegger had shown in Being and Time that the major metaphysical error was a misunderstanding of being as if it were a being, or the confusion of being and a being. In this key text, Heidegger explains that the history of metaphysics likewise involves a misunderstanding of "how it is with the nothing" (p.90). This should come as no surprise when we remember what Heidegger said: "The ontological difference is the 'not' between beings and Being" (p.90). [6] So of course the history of metaphysics is at once an obfuscation of being and also of the nothing. And it is this metaphysics that must be overcome. According to Lawlor, Heidegger shows us in his early work that the overcoming of metaphysics is tantamount to the overcoming of our way of thinking and of our way of being. Our existence "is saturated with nihilative behavior" since it is "being held out into the nothing" or "a placeholder of the nothing" (pp.104-5). Our nihilation is not an annihilation of the whole of being, or some calculation of negation on our part. Rather, as Heidegger famously and cryptically says, "The nothing itself nihilates, the nothing itself nothings" (p.100). So even though we do not nihilate, we are of nihilation: because of this saturation of nihilation, all of our being is a pointing-away.

Lawlor continues his reframing here by at once casting Heidegger within the phenomenological tradition by expanding the scope of the universal epochē (p.113), but with the same stroke recasting Heidegger's philosophy in more contemporary terms. For example, while "Heidegger is defined by transcendence" in his early work, Lawlor reframes this hallmark of the phenomenological tradition completely. "What Heidegger calls transcendence is in fact a movement to immanence" (p.111).

Lawlor links the two chapters on Heidegger's thought through the idea of Ereignis or the event of appropriation -- the eventfulness of being. And language is at the heart of this eventfulness. Lawlor selected Heidegger's 1950 essay, "Language," as representative of his later thought. It is by considering the language question that the task of overcoming metaphysics can be best addressed. This is at once a transformation of humanity, according to Lawlor (p.115). Just as in the previous chapter, Lawlor foregrounds a famous cryptic statement of Heidegger's: we do not use language as an objective tool, "language speaks." This is how we can ask about the eventfulness of being and of language. Language calls forth things, and the world things bear. But likewise, the world is also called forth, granting things.

Lawlor foregrounds the difference between world and things as the event of appropriation. "To think according to language amounts, for Heidegger, to experiencing the speaking of language itself so that this speaking 'happens' (ereignet) as an event, it grants an abode" (p.118). Glossing other post-Kehre works, language is "the house of being" where we dwell poetically. Language calls humans forth in the "fundamental rift or tear (Riss) of Being itself" (p.137). Lawlor stresses the way language is an opening to the outside -- not from an inner subject, but in a profoundly new way -- from silence. "This speaking from the unspoken, a beginning speaking . . . turns the spoken into a 'trait' (Zug) . . . or a 'trace' (Spur) . . . . What we must do is learn to dwell within this 'whole of traits' . . . . Another name for this whole of traits is the outside" (p.139). Thus, as will become apparent in the final chapter, the later works of Heidegger are reframed as being on the way to Foucault. This chapter contains some of Lawlor's best exegetical work. It includes sensitive and careful explanations of some very enigmatic and difficult material. And Lawlor brilliantly manages to do this within his reframing project -- a fine example of language as an event of appropriation.

Lawlor's chapter on Merleau-Ponty's 1961 essay, "Eye and Mind," is titled "Dwelling in the Texture of the Visible." Thus Lawlor correctly situates this important essay alongside Merleau-Ponty's posthumously appearing unfinished ontological work, The Visible and the Invisible, as well as various course notes. This chapter continues Lawlor's long tradition of excellent and influential work on Merleau-Ponty.[7] He selects this key essay because "Merleau-Ponty's final thinking draws together all the conceptual components we have been assembling for the research project called continental philosophy" (p.142). The project's agenda includes: (1) the universal epochē that leads to pre-subjective immanence; (2) the critique of the adequation of experience leading to multiplicity; (3) the liberation of language from representation; and (4) the overcoming of metaphysics (142-3).

The manner in which these themes cohere in Merleau-Ponty's late work, and Eye and Mind in particular, is further expressed in a footnote: "He wants to show that the metaphysics of science is rooted in the body (the elements) and at the same time that the painter (not the poet) is the one who most knows this experience of the body, or more precisely, this experience called vision." Lawlor goes on in this extraordinary note to assign titles to the various sections and sub-sections of Eye and Mind that square Merleau-Ponty's late work with Lawlor's reframing project. These proposed titles then serve as the section titles for his "summary-commentary" section\ (p.240, n.9). Lawlor explains very clearly the way Merleau-Ponty is offering an alternative ontology -- an overcoming of metaphysics (though he acknowledges the controversy of this claim) -- in Eye and Mind. Merleau-Ponty contrasts the "hidden science" disclosed by the painter with the Cartesian ontology of modern science. In his other ontological works, Merleau-Ponty refers to that which is to be revealed in the ontology as "the flesh of the world." The flesh of the world exists within the Cartesian world as a murmur to which the painter rather than the scientist best attends (p.173). And the hallmarks of this hidden science turn out to be those of the great French philosophies of the sixties: "This invisibility, intangibility, difference, and distance, within visibility, tangibility, identity, and proximity, is, as Merleau-Ponty says, 'the metaphysical structure of the flesh'" (p.165).

The chapter on Michel Foucault's 1966 key text, The Thought of the Outside, "Enveloped in a Nameless Voice," is the final stage in Lawlor's reframing project. Foucault had noted that we suffered from a hegemonic "anthropological slumber" which needs to be challenged. The Thought of the Outside approaches the anthropological bias through the topic of language. Lawlor notes how Foucault's early work follows Heidegger: language speaks man and displaces the subject as the subject even further. That is, Lawlor calls attention to the manner in which Foucault's work shares a common trajectory alongside the phenomenological movement, while the challenges Foucault presents are, for some, the death knell for phenomenology. The inclusion of the early Foucault in the tradition is interesting and controversial -- and a crucial part of Lawlor's reframing project.

Foucault's essay is designed as "a way of undoing interiority" (p.176). Modern literature is not about interiority (i.e., self-reflexive), but "a passage to the outside" (p.178). Instead of a subject folding over onto itself in language, language inserts distance and divergence making it other than itself. "It looks as though thought about thought should lead us to the deepest interiority. But speech about speech leads us to the outside in which the speaking subject disappears" (p.179). Thought and speech turn out to be similar in that regard. Far from providing immediate, certain self-reflexive knowledge of an interior subject, we see that the very existence of the subject is suspect.

Lawlor points out that Foucault repeatedly uses the French "peut-être" [maybe] to literally reinforce the dubious ontological status of the subject: it may-be. It is only by displacing this interior subject that the being of language appears, and only by opposing interiorization that language can say something new (pp.181-182). Lawlor again does an excellent job explaining the nuances of Foucault's use of Blanchot while referring back to the trajectory he has established in the previous chapters to show that "within every person . . . there is something like an 'imperson'. . . . And the bond between the 'I' and this 'it' is not positive enough to make a bond that could be untied" (p.191). This is the nameless voice to which the title of the chapter refers -- standing in stark contrast with the sovereign subject of modern discourse. "Language makes a network that is anonymous and informal" (p.197). This is, in effect, to transform experience from auto-affection to hetero-affection. "When I think, when I engage in interior monologue, when I experience my own body, in short when I have an immanent subjective experience (interiority), I experience something other than myself; I hear voices other than my own" (p.198). Interestingly, Lawlor likens Foucault to Heidegger here, when he depicts this eventfulness without a return to an origin as a "messianism without a messiah" (p.199). And it is in the early thought of Foucault that the aforementioned four features of the agenda of early twentieth-century continental philosophy are each made explicit. Lawlor's transition section at the end of the Foucault chapter also likens this aspect of Foucault's thought to Deleuze and Derrida, which was the point of the reframing project, after all.

In the brief conclusion, "Further Questions," Lawlor nicely reiterates the structure of the reframing project. He "deconstructs"[8] the interior monologue as thought that was to serve as a metaphysical and epistemological standard for modern philosophy with regard to its purported immediacy, presence, and univocity. He also investigates the difference between event and presence. This deconstruction also shows that presence is not simple, is uncertain, is not formally extra-linguistic, and is origin-heterogeneous. All of these untimely results of early twentieth-century philosophy raise a number of important questions. If we can assume that thought is unfamiliar with itself, that it inevitably mediates, that it throws us outside, then what must we do in the predicament of the unjust "necessary violence, irreducible pain, [and] this insane anxiety" that it leaves us with? Do we have access to some other "power behind the absence of power?" Are we obliged to wait for another event -- and is this obedience the path of least violence? Can the "we" who wait ever be identifiable or unified? What would be the nature of a land of people whose friendship includes their enemies in such a quest for the least violence (pp.206-210)? Wherever these questions lead us -- even if it is beyond continental philosophy or "post-continental philosophy", Lawlor indicates that the resources for addressing the questions are the very structures revealed through the deconstruction of early twentieth-century continental philosophy.

* * * * *

It was a fine idea to organize the book around key texts, and the selection of these seven texts as the plot-points to define the narrative is undoubtedly one of the most important tasks Lawlor undertook. No one could deny the importance of every one of these key texts. And there is nothing Pirandelloesque about this project: these are not six philosophers in search of an author. The reframing project that links these key texts is intrinsically valuable as well. However, one might ask whether the chronology of these key texts does a little too much work to establish the trajectory of the reframed tradition. For example, the decision to select one of Husserl's later texts was wise for the many aforementioned reasons Lawlor indicated. However, one could make an equally compelling case for selecting an earlier text and then using the summary-commentary section to situate it in the context of later insights in Husserl's ever-developing career. I do not think this is an error: it allows Lawlor to place Husserl after Bergson and Freud in the reframing project, which is quite important and interesting (nearly relegating Husserl to the status of a promising regression). Lawlor relies upon the quite arbitrary chronology without confessing this conceit. This stands out against the many other candid confessions about the aim and direction of the reframing project.

The terms Lawlor uses to construct the reframed tradition are, as we have seen, none too subtle appropriations of terms used by "the great French philosophers of the sixties" whose status in the philosophical pantheon Lawlor wants to support. This is in no way sneaky or duplicitous: Lawlor provides strong textual evidence to support the claim that these terms in fact were used by the great early thinkers. One of the great strengths of this text is that it will encourage scholars to re-read the canonical figures of the phenomenological tradition in new and fruitful ways that heretofore might not have been possible.

Lawlor is candid that while his project includes Bergson, Freud and the early Foucault as the context within which phenomenology is reframed, it also elides other valuable philosophical contributions to early twentieth-century continental philosophy. But Lawlor also ought to have addressed the fact that the trajectory he creates here would exclude the work of Alain Badiou from later twentieth-century continental thought. If continental philosophy is the name of a research agenda that is grounded in an anti-Platonism as Lawlor claims through his choice of Bergson as its patriarch, then surely one who prides himself as a "Platonist of the multiple" must not be included in that agenda. There are good reasons for doing this. Badiou himself locates his work outside of the continental tradition. One need only glance at Badiou's impatient dismissal of Heidegger throughout his work to see that Badiou will lose no sleep over this exclusion.[9] Nonetheless, in practice, Badiou's philosophy trades well in the various journals and conferences that constitute the marketplace of continental philosophy. So it seems odd to define the tradition in such a way that it excludes one of its most popular philosophers, and perhaps the most important living philosopher. It seems especially odd since Lawlor devotes so much time to the discussion of the event in his text.

Overall, this is an outstanding book that will serve as a fine supplement (and guide) to important primary texts in early twentieth-century continental philosophy. However, it will also be of great interest to scholars in this area due to the tendentious reframing agenda and the copious scholarly notes that append each chapter. This book would serve as an interesting supplemental text for a course on continental thought and is a valuable resource for any university library.

[1] Even more provocatively and more importantly, the trajectory of Lawlor's reframing of continental philosophy seems to exclude the work of Alain Badiou, as we shall discuss below.

[2] Leonard Lawlor, Thinking through French Philosophy: The Being of the Question, Indiana University Press, Bloomington, 2003.

[3] The phenomenological bias might appear to be greater than it really is with regard to this important organization. Actually, "traditional" phenomenology has long been marginalized at SPEP in favor of more recent trends in continental thought. Many members have lobbied to change the name of the group to more accurately reflect these more contemporary interests and issues, which dominate the discussion. My joke is that one such possible new name might be the Society for the Prevention of (Phenomenological and) Existential Philosophy. The obvious advantage would be that the group could continue with the old acronym.

[4] Lawlor acknowledges that there is some controversy over this text in his excellent clarifying notes relying on previous important works by Thomas Sheehan and Richard Palmer, and Joseph J. Kockelmans. The article that first appeared in the 1929 edition was a poor paraphrase rather than the "final version" upon which Lawlor relies. Cf. his discussion on p.230, n.4.

[5] Cf. p.64: "We see here with phenomenology that difference is the central issue: a difference within experience, a difference that produces a paradoxical ambiguity that allows us to understand phenomenology as the 'destruction' of the 'immediate givenness of consciousness.'" (my emphasis)

[6] I wish that Anglophones would stop reinforcing the theologically-motivated convention of capitalizing the "B" of being. The distinction between being and beings is no less unintelligible by flouting the convention, and we avoid mystification. Unfortunately, Lawlor does not break new ground here.

[7] His stature in Merleau-Ponty scholarship cannot be overestimated. Lawlor (along with Mauro Carbone and Renaud Barbaras) is a founding co-editor of the important journal on Merleau-Ponty's work, Chiasmi International.

[8] [Author's emphasis.] Lawlor might have chosen to refer to this in phenomenological terms of epochē and reduction, but he did not. He does point out, however, that the aim of this deconstruction is to "expose the essential structure or process" of what is commonly believed to be the case about the "auto-affection" of the interior monologue of thought [p.204].

[9] Also, cf. John Mullarkey's interesting work, Post-Continental Philosophy [Continuum Press, London, 2007] where he in effect offers an autopsy of continental philosophy by noting four contemporary critical alternatives to Heideggerian-dominant continental thought, each (he argues) related to Bergsonism. In this sense, Mullarkey's book is another reframing project complementing Lawlor's. Mullarkey includes Badiou's work as one of these four "post-continental" alternatives. Though I have strong reservations about Mullarkey's reading of Badiou, this book is an important provocation.