Robert N. Johnson

Self-Improvement: An Essay in Kantian Ethics

Robert N. Johnson, Self-Improvement: An Essay in Kantian Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2011, 174pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199599349.

Reviewed by Sorin Baiasu, Keele University

The project of Robert Johnson's book is very specific: to defend a non-derivative duty to develop oneself in non-moral respects. More exactly, the project aims to defend the claim that a human being owes it to himself to cultivate his natural powers. Whereas the topic is the moral development of oneself, this does not necessarily mean the development of one's moral self, of one's moral capacities; the project defends a non-derivative duty to develop oneself in non-moral respects.

As Johnson acknowledges, his main claim (that a human being owes it to himself to cultivate his natural powers) was properly defended by Kant. But he takes what Kant says only as a starting point, and he aims to develop certain aspects beyond that. Although there is no claim that Kant would have developed this project in the same way, the 'Kantian ethics' in the subtitle of the book does suggest that the account developed stays close to Kant's approach.

'Kantian' is taken to refer to an opposition to attempts to ground notions of 'right' or 'obligation' or 'virtue' in value. In fact, Johnson maintains that a plausible argument can be formulated in support of a duty of self-development precisely because of this feature of the Kantian approach. Thus, for Johnson, it is this Kantian feature of the account that makes the imperfect duty of self-development action-guiding. An implication of this Kantian account is that several criticisms of Kant's ethics fail, in particular those that regard it as hostile to the importance of self-concern and as reducible to a moralistic message of self-mortification and rational austerity.

Duties to oneself have been discussed either in general or, when in particular, mainly with specific focus on wronging oneself. These discussions have mainly been concerned with a presentation of Kant's position and arguments; Johnson, by contrast, aims to focus on the construction of a defensible position, grounded in a broadly Kantian ethical theory, but not primarily concerned with Kantian scholarship.

In terms of the challenges the book responds to, the project aims to overcome the difficulty of accounting for why we owe it to ourselves, not to others, to develop ourselves, and why we do not have an obligation to perfect others. Moreover, the clarification of this duty to ourselves throws light on how we come to have duties toward anyone at all.

One reason for the Kantian character of the theory is that it puts Johnson's account at an initial advantage over consequentialist, perfectionist and virtue ethicist accounts. Self-development for the consequentialist will only be justified if it leads to the overall good, and this is an empirical issue; moreover, the overall good may require that I contribute to the development of another person's capacities, rather than to my own.

For the perfectionist, self-development is the ground of morality, which means that concern for others becomes secondary and, moreover, any self- and other-regarding obligations will have to be forms of self-perfection, although they usually are not. Finally, the virtue ethicist would be able to defend an obligation to develop our capacities, if a fully virtuous and, hence, a fully developed person would be disposed to do so in virtue of her character; but, obviously, a fully developed person would not be disposed to develop her capacities.

To avoid problematic implications, Johnson makes a few clarifications. First, his argument does not imply that poverty and the resulting failures of self-improvement are due to a moral failing in the poor. Nor does it suggest that failures of self-improvement are more important than injustices that prevent many from enjoying moral improvement or at least those forms that are demanding in terms of time and means. Moreover, the argument does not suggest that poverty is never the result of a moral failing. Finally, there is no suggestion that those who have less are relieved of any obligation to make what they can of themselves.

Having presented the project, its Kantian features, the contribution it aims to make, some of its attractive features, and some of the problematic implications it can avoid, I will now focus on the book's argument. The first chapter aims to explore the nature and extent of the Kantian duty to develop natural capacities. This is offered as a background for the discussions, in the following chapters, of the justification of the duty of self-improvement. Since it is meant to present also the extent of this duty, the first chapter concludes with a description of five ways, in which we can fail ourselves, that is, of five ways in which we can overstep this obligation.

The second chapter makes a first attempt to justify self-improvement. The justificatory ground is given by the first formulation of the Categorical Imperative, the Formula of Universal Law (FUL). As most commentators acknowledge, Kant's Groundwork suggests that this formulation is able to justify the duty of self-improvement by rejecting a maxim of non-self-improvement or of letting your abilities rust; however, Johnson argues, on Rawls's interpretation of how the FUL is supposed to test maxims, the argument for imperfect duties implies a false claim. So, a justification on the basis of the first formulation of the Categorical Imperative fails. I will come back to this shortly.

Before trying two other justifications, on the basis of the other two most discussed formulations of the Categorical Imperative, Johnson needs to clarify another issue: how is it possible for the Kantian obligation to improve oneself to be owed to oneself? The main problem is that, on Kant's account, duties and rights are reciprocal; hence, the person to whom I owe a duty usually has a right to my performance and perhaps also a liberty not to exercise that right; if I owe that duty to myself and I do not perform it, then, since I can waive my right to my self-improvement, I can no longer claim I owe anything. This is the problem tackled by chapter 4.

The sense in which we can talk about the Kantian duty of self-improvement as owed to ourselves, according to Johnson, is the following. We can talk about an imperfect duty to others in promoting their happiness without any person in particular acquiring in this way a right to any of my possible particular performances. The right holders can be those who need my help, but this right will not be that of a particular person and to a particular performance I can make; it will be the right of the group to some of my possible actions. The crucial implication, therefore, is that no particular person can waive this right.

Let me now move on to the duty of self-improvement: according to Johnson, as imperfect, this Kantian duty will require that I adopt my improvement as a goal, so no particular action will be owed to me. I owe it to myself to develop at least one or another capacity at least at some or other time and to some extent. Hence, my right is not to a particular action and cannot be waived. One could think that I can perhaps waive the obligation to develop any capacity at any point and to any extent, but this would simply mean to waive the obligation to adopt the development of my capacities as a goal; this, however, I cannot do, since to adopt this goal is a morally required end.

One way to make this clearer is offered by Johnson in terms of competency requirements -- assuming there is a minimum competency requirement on having obligations, there is probably also a minimum competency requirement on having a corresponding liberty right, and waiving a right against someone. If the former is less demanding than the latter, then I may have obligations to myself, but I may not be sufficiently competent to waive them and to release myself from those obligations.

I do not choose to enter into an obligation of self-improvement; since I must use my rational nature, I inevitably come under an obligation not to use it as a mere means, and this includes a duty of self-improvement. Moreover, I use my rational nature when I use also the others' rational natures. Hence, in clarifying this duty I have to myself, Johnson's project also clarifies the duties I have to anyone else.

Chapters 5 and 6 justify the duty of self-improvement on the basis of the second and third formulations of the Categorical Imperative, the Formula of Humanity or of the Ends in Themselves (FH), and the Formula of the Kingdom of Ends (FKE). Chapter 7 explains why, according to Kant, we have a duty of self-improvement, as a duty to improve ourselves, but not one to improve others. Finally, if we have an obligation that we owe to ourselves to develop a range of abilities, then the implication is that abilities are things we can improve and we can monitor their development. The final chapter of the book argues this is the case by focusing on the notion of an ability and providing an account of abilities. The claim is that abilities are essentially improvable into praiseworthy skills to realise some ends. Hence we can improve and monitor the development of our abilities.

Of course, here, I cannot do justice to this fine book, but I can focus on what seems to be a very important argument; thus, as I have said, I would like to return to Johnson's claim that the Kantian duty of self-improvement cannot be justified on the basis of the FUL. This, I think, is a very important claim, since it is one clear instance where Johnson's argument parts ways with Kant's account. That we can offer a justification of the Kantian duty on the basis of the other two, very often discussed, formulations of the Categorical Imperative (FH and FKE) is not surprising. In fact, according to Kant's famous assertion, these three formulations "are at bottom merely so many formulations of precisely the same law "; moreover, the differences between them are "subjectively rather than objectively practical"[1] (GMS 4: 436) This suggests that, as far as guidance concerning the moral validity of particular maxims is concerned, any of the three formulations can be employed. The differences between the three formulations do not affect their objectivity, but the extent to which they are actually accepted by moral agents. Hence, their differences are subjectively practical and lead to different degrees of intuitive plausibility.

A claim which is rarely quoted in discussions of the formulations of the Categorical Imperative and of their ability to offer moral guidance follows shortly after the claim above. After presenting the differences between the three formulations, Kant says:

It is, however, better if in moral judgement we proceed always in accordance with the strict method and take as our basis the universal formula of the categorical imperative: 'Act on the maxim which can at the same time be made a universal law'. (GMS 4: 436-7)

In this sense, it is surprising to read Johnson's claims that the FUL fails to justify the duty of self-improvement, whereas the other two formulations succeed. From a different point of view, however, this is less surprising, given recent developments in Kantian literature. Thus, following multiple attempts to interpret this version of the Categorical Imperative so that it would provide a genuine test for maxims, commentators repeatedly left themselves open to criticism that such interpretations of the FUL either exclude maxims that are intuitively permissible or allow as permissible maxims that are intuitively impermissible.

As a result, some commentators began to think that there was something fundamentally wrong with the attempt to test maxims with the help of the FUL, rather than with the particular way in which it was developed. One conclusion was that the first formulation had a different function than the second and third. For instance, according to Mark Timmons, the first formulation tests motivation, rather than the moral permissibility of the maxims; the second tests the morality of maxims and can be used as a moral criterion. (Timmons 2006)

Of course, such alternative approaches go against some of Kant's claims, for instance, those I have just quoted above concerning the normative equivalence of the three formulations or the importance of the FUL.[2] Hence, they indicate clearly ways in which accounts of moral validity (Johnson's included) depart from Kant's.[3] What is Johnson's argument against the FUL?

As I have just mentioned, the first formulation sets a condition on the maxims of action. Johnson starts, in the first section of the chapter, with a discussion of maxims. He understands maxims as plans of action. In its general form, a maxim can be expressed as follows: (I will) A in C in order to achieve E, where A is the act description, C is the circumstances description, and E the end description. Maxims should be neither too general nor too specific, since, as plans of action, they need to be able to guide action.

Two aspects are the focus of Johnson's critical attention. First, on some accounts, a plan of action is a maxim only when one makes it one's principle to act on that plan. In contrast to this account, Johnson regards maxims as principles or plans which actually guide action, whether or not the person who so acts has also made it her principle to act on those maxims. I think this is a correct observation: for Kant, maxims are subjective principles of action, and our plans of action are such subjective plans whether or not we have made it our principle to act on them.

Secondly, Johnson is unhappy about Kant's reference to laws of nature -- for him, it is irrational to will for a maxim to become a universal law. Only God can reasonably will something like this. He suggests that, instead of regarding the first formulation as testing whether we can will for our maxim to become a universal law of nature, we can look at it as testing whether we can will that the maxim be universally accepted and acted upon. I find this suggestion much less convincing than the first. It seems there is little difference between willing for a maxim to become a universal law and willing for a maxim to be universally accepted and acted upon. If there are differences (and I think there are), these are not in terms of being more feasible for us (as human beings and not as God) to bring it about that our maxims be universally adopted and acted upon. There is no morally relevant point in willing for the law of driving on the left to become a universal law (although there is no contradiction in so willing), although there is a point for the law of non-mendacity.

In the second section of this chapter, the claim defended is that the irrationality that is presupposed by the attempt to act on a morally impermissible maxim is not simply that of acting ineffectively and inefficiently in achieving one's ends, nor in ignorance of facts about one's circumstances or the likely consequences of one's actions. The inconsistency in the attempt to act on a morally impermissible maxim is displayed by deliberative procedures introduced by the FUL.

The third section spells out these procedures. The account adopted is Rawls's and the claim is that a perfect duty is obtained when the universalisation of the contradictory maxim is not conceivable, since a world in which everybody adopted that plan of action could not exist. An imperfect duty is obtained when a world in which everybody adopted the contradictory maxim could exist, but I could not consistently will that such a world come about. I could not consistently will that such a world come about because I have happiness as a necessary end, and, if I am rational, I must will the necessary means to my happiness, which is contradicted by willing a world in which everybody adopted the contradictory maxim.

The final section applies the test to the duty of self-improvement. The claim is that such a test cannot justify the maxim of self-improvement as an imperfect duty. This is because, even in a world in which nobody develops their abilities on purpose (in contradiction to the maxim of self-improvement), people may still develop their abilities in order to achieve one end or another. It might be necessary that, as a necessary means to my happiness, I will that others develop their abilities, but not that we will others adopt their perfection as an end. Yet, according to Johnson, what we need for the duty of self-improvement is that others adopt their perfection as an end, and this is something that cannot be derived from the FUL. Moreover:

That is what is lacking in those who we find to be selling themselves short, letting themselves go, not making anything of themselves when they should be. It is not that in fact they have no developed capacities; the moral failure is in not taking themselves seriously enough. (64)

I find this argument puzzling mainly for two reasons. First, according to Johnson, Kant needs as part of the duty of self-improvement, that those who act to fulfill it make their perfection an end. If the FUL cannot show that the maxim of self-improvement includes the feature that perfection be adopted as an end, then the FUL fails to justify an important part of the duty of self-improvement. Yet, this form of moral failure is not among the five ways in which a person may fail herself by acting without concern for this duty.

Secondly and crucially, to show we cannot derive the imperfect duty of self-improvement with the help of the FUL, Johnson uses the same argument he formulates against the derivation from the FUL of the imperfect duty to help others promote their permissible ends. Yet, I do not think the argument is in fact working. Thus, what we would need for the derivation of the duty of helpfulness would be to show that, as rational beings, we must will that someone, sometime, assist us in some way, to some extent in our pursuit of happiness. We can will this, since, (1) happiness is a necessary end for us, (2) help from others is a necessary means to this and (3), as rational, we will the "necessary and available" means to our ends. (58)

The problem with this argument, Johnson says, is the following:

First,  . . . it is enough that in the usual course of events, our ends are interlocking, such that even if I do not adopt the wellbeing of others as one of my own ends, in fact I will help them because it is necessary to my own selfish plans. Second, this argument also falls short of establishing an obligatory end of the sort that Kant argues for in the Metaphysics of Morals, namely, "the happiness of other human beings, whose (permitted) end I thus make my own end as well". For what follows, again, from the three propositions in the prior paragraph is not that it is necessary that anyone make my ends their own, but only that they offer help in the pursuit of mine, whether they have made them their own as well or not. (59)

I think this does not work because, although happiness for Kant is indeed a necessary end, it is an end which cannot be determined for us limited rational beings. (GMS 4: 418) I am not going to insist, since Johnson acknowledges this, but I will mention that this is the result of the fact that what makes us happy (in the Kantian sense) is almost entirely an empirical matter. If my happiness and the happiness of the other limited rational beings are indeterminate, then there is no way in which we can know whether our ends are indeed interlocking and, hence, whether I will help anybody by pursuing my own selfish plans. Moreover, if my happiness is indeterminate, then the only way I can rely on the help from others, given that I cannot be sure what will constitute happiness for me, is if they make my ends their own as a matter of principle. Hence, not only should I will that they be willing to offer help to me in pursuit of their own ends, which is a necessary means; I should also will that they offer help by making my ends their own, which makes the necessary means available to me. That the means I will must be necessary and available is explicitly formulated by Johnson himself (58), as I have just made clear above.

It is certainly sufficient for my happiness that someone, sometime, help me in some way and to a certain extent; but, if I do not specify that this is the result of the fact that someone does this by adopting my ends as their own, then the principle we can derive with the help of the FUL will only be: someone, sometime, help me in some way and to a certain extent, if it so happens. This, however, leads at least to this problem: if duties are to be selected from among maxims with the help of the tests offered by the FUL, then they need to be action-guiding in the way in which Johnson says all maxims should be; but, 'help in an indeterminate way, if it so happens' is not action-guiding.

This is, of course, not to suggest that the Rawlsian interpretation of the FUL, which Johnson employs, is more or less accurate than others. I have only attempted to challenge the suggestion that, unlike the FH and FKE, the FUL cannot justify a duty of self-improvement. As this seems to be one clear point where Johnson's account departs from Kant, the departure seems less radical than initially thought.

The book attempts to carry out a valuable project and many of the issues it raises are tackled in a convincing way. The account of the duty of self-improvement that it develops and defends may be closer to Kant's than initially expected, but the book is well-argued and presents an excellent contribution to both ethics and Kantian studies.


Baiasu, S. (2011) "Metaphysics and Moral Judgement", in S. Baiasu, S. Pihlstrom and H. Williams (eds) Politics and Metaphysics in Kant. Cardiff: University of Wales Press.

Herman, H. (1993) The Practice of Moral Judgement. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Kant, I. (1900-) Kants gesammelte Schriften. Ed. by the Königlich Preußischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, subsequently Deutsche, now Berlin-Brandenburg Akademie der Wissenschaften (originally under the editorship of Wilhelm Dilthey). Berlin: Georg Reimer, subsequently Walter de Gruyter.

Kant, I. (1996) Practical Philosophy. Tr. and ed. Mary J. Gregor. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Timmons, M. (2006) "The Categorical Imperative and Universalisability (GMS, 421 -- 424)", in C. Horn and D. Schönecker (eds), Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals. Berlin and New York: de Gruyter.

[1] In referencing Kant, I use the following abbreviation GMSGroundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals (Grundlegung zur Metaphysik der Sitten (1785)), in Kant (1996). Pagination references in the text and footnotes are to the volume and page number in the German edition of Kant's works (1900-). Unaccompanied page references are to the reviewed book.

[2] According to Barbara Herman (1993), the FUL (of what she calls the "CI procedure") should not be expected to apply to maxims and to result in derivation of duties; rather, it applies to "generic maxims" and issues in "deliberative presumptions". (132-58) These are then supplemented by the value of rational agency and result in deliberation.

[3] I do not think that necessarily all such alternative accounts will mark a departure from Kant. In fact, I attempt such an alternative precisely as a better account of Kant. (2011)