John Gardner is one of the leading philosophers of law writing today. This book collects nine papers on the nature of law he published in the last thirteen years, along with two hitherto unpublished papers and a preface. Even as collections go, this is an unusually tricky one to review. As he puts it in the preface, Gardner conceives philosophy as "the art of wearing every thought down to its rightful little size and then keeping it in its rightful little place" (p. v). He rather disarmingly denies having a theory of law or a "bigger picture" even. And in the individual papers, he succeeds, to a surprising degree, in sticking mainly to the announced goal of "unbundling" -- i.e. disputing the connections or implications between various jurisprudential ideas or theses that others assert or argue for. There are many things to admire and learn from in the papers, as well as many points (including the just-quoted meta-philosophical view) that are open to dispute. But given their generally diffuse nature, it is hardly possible or desirable in a short review to canvass them one by one. Instead, I will provide fairly brief descriptions of the individual chapters, and follow those up with some comments on three issues that Gardner's chapters touch on, and that are of general importance for legal philosophy.
The papers can be divided into two sets of roughly equal size. Those in one set (chs. 1-4, 11) seek to delineate and to highlight the particular kind of artificiality or positivity that law involves. In "Legal Positivism: 5½ Myths", a frequently-cited paper, Gardner formulates legal positivism as the view that the legal validity of any norm depends ultimately only on its "sources", or non-evaluative considerations, and methodically outlines and dismisses various further theses that are often associated with legal positivism. "Some Types of Law" provides a taxonomy of laws with the aim of showing that all types of law can be explained as "positive", or man-made. "Can There be a Written Constitution?" investigates the relation between constitutions and what H.L.A. Hart calls "rules of recognition", or the rules that set out ultimate criteria of legal validity, and which supposedly consist of official practices. "Law in General" seeks to preserve a logical space for a general and descriptive philosophical study of the nature of law, and more particularly to vindicate Hart's claim in the preface of The Concept of Law that his book can be conceived as "an essay in descriptive sociology".
I have skipped over the title essay, which is the first chapter, because I am unsure that I have a good handle on it. It strikes me as the most interesting of the first bunch. Unfortunately, it is also the most obscure. It consists of an attempt, inspired by the works of Hans Kelsen, to reconcile two ways in which the ultimate criteria of legal validity could be considered: from the point of view of a participant in a legal system who "presupposes" the validity of the criteria, and from the point of view of a legal theorist or scientist who conceives the validity of the criteria as consisting of participants' presuppositions. The paper appears to me marred by strained attempts to analogize these two points of view to the two horns of the Euthyphro dilemma and also to Kierkegaard's moral and religious points of view, and to draw lessons from the analogies. In the preface (pp. vi-vii), Gardner announces that the title essay is meant to signal his break from Hart's way of conceiving all norms as "social norms", and to pave the way to a better understanding of the places of both social and non-social norms in the workings of legal systems. How the thinking in this first chapter affects or constrains the arguments and positions in the later chapters, I confess, eludes me. And given the centrality that this chapter is supposed to have in the collection, I wish that Gardner had provided more explicit help. In any case, I will return below to the issues that I believe Gardner is dealing with in this essay.
The papers in the second set (chs. 5-10) deal with various noncontingent connections that may or may not exist between law and morality. "How Law Claims, What Law Claims" defends JosephRaz's thesis -- which some have found suspect, obscure, or both -- that "the law" claims moral authority. "Nearly Natural Law" maintains the denial that laws are necessarily reason-giving while adopting a version of the philosophical approach -- most famously associated, among legal philosophers, with the work of John Finnis -- according to which any adequate understanding of a human phenomenon such as law must begin with a study of its central cases or ideal types. In the most constructive stretch of text -- consisting of "The Legality of Law", "The Supposed Formality of the Rule of Law", and "Hart on Legality, Justice, and Morality" -- Gardner argues that laws and legal systems have a conceptually-imposed or constitutive moral ideal of legality or the rule of law, which combines the ideals of generality, openness, prospectivity, consistency, clarity, stability, compliability, etc. In "The Virtue of Justice and the Character of Law", Gardner seeks to cast doubt on the commonly-held view that justice is the first among the virtues of the law or legal systems in general, and to limit the scope of that view to the actions or rulings of adjudicative institutions in particular.
Now, on to the three issues. The first has to do with the nature of artificiality or positivity that Gardner attributes to all laws. In "Some Types of Law", Gardner canvases three types of law -- legislated law, customary law, and case law -- and argues that all three are positive or man-made. He warns against reaching a different conclusion based on the fact that the latter two types are not always made expressly or intentionally. Ronald Dworkin is a culprit that he singles out:
Dworkin . . . relied on these features of case law in arguing that at least some of it exists without anyone's ever having made it. The implicit law to be found in the cases exists, according toDworkin, in virtue of the fact that it provides a sound moral justification for whatever explicit law there might be in those same (and other?) cases. . . . this is a mistake. It is true that case law is implicit law in the sense that it is not made by being expressed. Nor is it always made intentionally. The rule in the case has to be worked out by examining the judge's argument, to see what rule he implicitly, and maybe accidentally, relied upon. Nevertheless, the judge brings the rule into existence by relying on it. So implicit law, like explicit law, is still brought into existence by someone. It is still positive law. For there is no such thing as non-positive law. There are no legal norms that come into existence without being brought into existence by someone. (pp. 85-86)
It matters here what Gardner means by "rely" when he speaks of judges relying on rules. It seems doubtful that he would require judges' reliance on rules to be actual psychological events. That might be plausible when we are dealing with a rule that explains a single decision. But a significant part of case law is inferring general rules from lines of decisions, and the inferred general rules need not be any that judges were actually guided by, even tacitly. Also important to notice is the fact that for any single judicial decision or line of decisions, there are likely to be multiple rules that fit the decision(s) equally well. If a judge or judges were to infer from a line of cases one such rule, and to identify it as the applicable law in a particular decision, it is not clear in what sense that that law was made, or "brought into existence", before that moment of recognition.
To be clear, I am not here endorsing the view that such a rule is not a law before the moment of identification. I am rather questioning the way that Gardner draws the distinction between artificial or positive laws on the one hand, and non-artificial or non-positive laws on the other. Like Dworkin and Gardner, I believe that the law of any jurisdiction has an "implicit" part. Like both, I believe that the norms that make up the implicit law bear some grounding relation to those that make up the explicit law. And like Gardner and unlike Dworkin, I conjecture that the norms that make up the implicit law are artificial or positive norms, and differ in this respect from fundamental moral and epistemic norms. But explaining what this exactly means, I suspect, is a much more difficult and delicate task than what Gardner seems to think. And we would need a clearer and better way of drawing the crucial distinction to opine on the prospects of legal positivism.
The second issue I want to comment on has to do with the so-called social rules. Gardner says in the preface that he owes much of his thinking on the nature of law to Hart, and the notion of social rules plays a central role in his understanding of Hart's legal theory. I cannot help thinking that this particular notion has acquired associations and connections in the post-1961 legal philosophy that distort people's understanding of Hart's theory and their legal philosophical thinking more generally. Here is one place, I believe, where some Gardner-style unbundling is sorely needed.
Hart argued that any community with a legal system has a "rule of recognition" which specifies the criteria that rules or norms must meet for them to be laws of the relevant legal system. Such rules of recognition, many think, are "social rules" or "customary rules". What exactly is meant by this classification can be difficult to pin down. Gardner and many others seem to think that a social or customary rule is "constituted" or "made" by some people's thinking and acting as if they (and perhaps others) have reasons or even obligations to follow the rule. Gardner says, for example, that "customary law . . . is constituted as law by the customs of legal officials such as judges, police officers, and bailiffs" (p. 66); that, according to Hart, "The law identifying the ultimate legislature -- the rule of recognition -- is constituted by . . . people's conformity to the legislation" (p. 69); and that, according to Hart, "each legal system has at least one social rule, namely an 'ultimate rule of recognition'", which "is made by the cumulative attempts of officials of the system . . . to follow that same rule" (pp. 280, 283). Similar characterizations abound in the legal philosophical literature.In addition to such a constitution claim, those who employ the language of "social rules" seem to think that in Hart's view legal questions are ultimately to be resolved by settling sociological-cum-psychological questions about what a group of people do and believe. That is implied in what Gardner says at one point:
Especially, but not only where a legal system has no canonical text, it is common to say that ultimate constitutional questions are questions of practice (or realpolitik), not questions of law. Hart exposed this as a false contrast. That a question is one of practice does not mean that it is not one of law. For some law is made by what people do. (pp. 69-70)
Gardner also says that for Hart "the conforming behavior" is made "normative from the legal point of view" (p. 69). Perhaps Gardner and like-minded philosophers see these two points as one. Perhaps it is because the rule of recognition of a community is constituted by a social practice that legal questions are to be answered ultimately by discerning the facts about that practice.
Whether the points in question are two distinct ones or amount to just one, I believe that it is worth our while to reconsider them. First, to be contrasted with Gardner's constitution claim is a more nuanced claim that Hart actually makes. Hart says: "the practice of judges, officials, and others, in which the actual existence of a rule of recognition consists, is a complex matter" (1961/94, p. 109; emphasis added). Hart goes on to observe that "existence"-of-rules statements may be internal statements by which speakers express their acceptances of the relevant rules, or external statements by which speakers describe a community members' acceptances of the rules (pp. 109-112; cf. p. 291). At one point (p. 110), Hart says that an assertion that a rule of recognition exists can only be an external statement. I am not sure how seriously to take this particular claim, as Hart also says some things that are in tension with it. But when he says in the above-quoted sentence that the existence of a rule of recognition consists of complex facts of official practice, he is not saying that the rule itself consists of such facts, but instead that officials' acceptance of a rule as their rule of recognition consists of such facts. That is a far different and less puzzling claim than the one that Gardner makes. After all, how can a rule consist of social practices?
What Gardner and other like-minded legal philosophers seem insufficiently attentive to is the distinction between (i) the fact that some rule sets out the ultimate criteria of legal validity of a community's legal system, and (ii) the fact that some rule is accepted or treated as setting out the ultimate criteria of legal validity of a community's legal system. There is no question that (ii) consists of, or is constituted by, behavioral and psychological facts, or "social facts" as many call them. But that particular feature of some rules does not distinguish them from any other kinds of rules. For the "existence", in that sense, of any rules -- including fundamental moral and epistemic rules -- consists of social facts. Any characterization of rules of recognition as "social rules", which distinguishes them from other kinds of rules, must therefore rely on construing (i) as consisting of, or constituted by, social facts. If this could be made out, then, as suggested by the second of the two above-outlined points associated with the doctrine of social rules, legal questions should be answered ultimately by appeals to social facts. But Hart observes at one point:
There are, indeed, many questions which we can raise about [a rule of recognition]. We can ask whether it is the practice of courts, legislatures, officials, or private citizens in England actually to use this rule as an ultimate rule of recognition. . . . We can ask whether it is a satisfactory form of legal system which has such a rule at its root. Does it produce more good than evil? Are there prudential reasons for supporting it? These are plainly very important questions; but, equally plainly, when we ask them about the rule of recognition, we are no longer attempting to answer [the question of legal validity] . . . which we answered about other rules with its aid. When we move from saying that a particular enactment is valid, because it satisfies the rule that what the Queen in Parliament enacts is law, to saying that in England this last rule is used by courts, officials, and private persons as the ultimate rule of recognition, we have moved from an internal statement of law asserting the validity of a rule of the system to an external statement of fact which an observer of the system might make even if he did not accept it. So too when we move from the statement that a particular enactment is valid, to the statement that the rule of recognition of the system is an excellent one and the system based on it is one worthy of support, we have moved from a statement of legal validity to a statement of value. (pp. 107-108)
Here, Hart in effect eschews the view that legal questions are ultimately answered by appeals to social facts. He is very far from equating "questions of law" to "questions of practice" as Gardner characterizes him. What lawyers and judges appeal to ultimately, to answer legal questions, is a rule of recognition, and not the facts that amount to officials' acceptance of such a rule.
I acknowledge here that there are some passages in Hart's writings that support the common reading that Gardner favors. But I hope I have said enough to give pause to that common reading. The issues implicated are not merely of historical significance. At one point, Gardner elaborates on his conception of legal positivism:
It says . . . that in any legal system, a norm is valid as a norm of that system solely in virtue of the fact that at some relevant time and place some relevant agent or agents announced it, practiced it, invoked it, enforced it, endorsed it, or otherwise engaged with it. (p. 20)
Given that Gardner's conception of legal positivism is avowedly indebted to Hart's work, and given the points we have just discussed, there are reasons to reconsider this conception. If we keep scrupulously to the reading I have suggested, then according to Hart, the legal validity of a rule or norm is ultimately a matter of a rule or norm -- namely, a rule of recognition -- and not of social facts of the sort that Gardner names. The mere fact that any rule of recognition's acceptance by a community's officials consists of social facts does not make it the case that questions of legal validity are questions of social facts.
What puzzles me is that in the title essay, Gardner appears to appreciate and opt for the kind of theorizing about the nature of law that I am here attributing to Hart. He there distinguishes the point of view of a participant in a legal system and the point of view of a theorist of law. According to the Kelsenian take that Gardner seems to endorse, a participant "presupposes" the "merits" of the ultimate criteria of legal validity, whereas a theorist attributes or "hypothesizes" such a presupposition (p. 11). These are dark notions that Gardner does not further explicate. But the trend in thinking that Gardner seems to favor is to distinguish what Hart calls "internal" and "external points of view", and to resist collapsing the issues addressed from the two points of view. As already noted, Gardner suggests in the preface of his book that the thinking in the title essay guided or affected his later discussion of social rules. I also remarked above that I failed to detect this fact in the later chapters. I cannot help wishing that Gardner had further clarified and elaborated on the lessons of the title essay in his later chapters.
In closing, I will touch on an issue of a rather diffuse nature. As noted above, Gardner says that he does not have a theory of law, and that he owes much of his thinking about the nature of law to Hart (pp. v, vi). Both of these statements could be thought slightly misleading. For there is a theory of law that provides a framework for Gardner's thinking, and it is the theory that Joseph Raz has constructed over the years. Moreover, the Hart that guides much of Gardner's thinking is the Hart that has been given a fairly substantial makeover by Raz's modifications. In reading these chapters, I found myself astonished at how often a substantial point made by Gardner, of either philosophical or interpretive nature, is accompanied by references to Raz's works, and at how very seldom Gardner registers any disagreements with Raz. Of course, Gardner, like anyone else, is entitled to presuppose or rely on whichever theory or set of views that he finds compelling. But as someone who himself finds Razian lines of thinking and approaches less than congenial, I wish that Gardner had pressed a little harder in scrutinizing and motivating his Razian commitments.
Let me give just two examples of what I find unsatisfying. First, in "How Law Claims, What Law Claims", Gardner sets out to vindicate Raz's thesis that "the law" claims moral authority. Part of that task is to defend the view that all legal claims are moral claims. Gardner observes that legal claims are invariably formulated in deontic terms (p. 132), and then goes on to assert that all "important" deontic claims are moral ones (p. 135). He explains that "Every legal issue, however superficially technical, is a moral issue, for its resolution inevitably has important consequences for someone",and that this way of characterizing legal claims can be deployed to distinguish them from the ones that attribute deontic statuses in, say, games and recipes (pp. 135-136; cf. pp. 161-162). But first, it is worth noticing that neither the concepts nor extensions of what is important and of what is morally called for coincide. Second, I wonder whether Gardner really wants to go down the path of systematically comparing the consequences of legal decisions (including e.g. those of a small claims court) with those of official decisions in games (including e.g. those in a World Cup final match, a seventh game of the World Series, not to mention the Mayan basketball-like game in which the captain of the winning team was supposedly decapitated). Gardner also appeals to a real-life legal opinion in which an appellate judge states that he is "bound" and "compelled" to apply a precedent despite the morally iniquitous consequences of doing so (pp. 141-142). Gardner infers from this opinion that the judge considers himself "morally bound" by the precedent despite the fact that the result of applying it would be unjust and morally incorrect. That strikes me as a rather forced and question-begging take-away. The judge says that he is "bound" and "compelled" by the law, not that he is "morally bound" or "morally compelled". One would have thought that the judge's position furnishes a more natural support for the view that legal claims are not necessarily moral claims.
Second, in "Nearly Natural Law", Gardner begins to motivate his line of reasoning about the nature of laws and their connections to reasons by adopting the view that moral requirements are requirements of rationality, and therefore that morality noncontingently generates reasons. He in fact opts for a particularly strong version of this last thesis that denies even a conceptual space for raising the question "Why be moral?" (p. 150). But this strong version, and even the more general thesis of what could be called "morality-reason existence internalism", are much-debated issues. Gardner seems to draw support from Raz's 1997 paper "The Amoralist". But in that paper, Raz makes use of a very particular conception of morality that seems tailor-made to facilitate the case for the very strong internalist thesis. Gardner's set-up is not as careful, and the objections to his strong stance that he considers (pp. 151-153) do not get at the real difficulties of that stance.
Instances like these two give the impression, fairly or unfairly, that Gardner is willing to go unusual distances to agree with Raz, and that he holds his usual critical acumen in check when it comes to Razian doctrines. In the preface, Gardner bemoans "the package deal approach" adopted by many that organize contemporary legal philosophy on adversarial terms of "Hart v. Dworkin", "Legal Positivism v. Natural Law", etc. (pp. v-vi). The stretches of this book, like the two I have just discussed, invite the impression that Gardner himself may be relying on a "Razians v. others" approach. A way to dispel this impression would be more critical and unsentimental unbundling as a necessary step to shedding unwarranted commitments.
These essays of Gardner are some of the most interesting and challenging contributions to the debate about the nature of law in recent years. The fact that I have dwelt exclusively on the aspects that I found problematic is a function of my thought that the limited space I have available can be more productively spent by exploring disagreements than by registering agreements. As I remarked above, the title essay is particularly intriguing and suggestive. And I for one hope for a more thorough and explicit working-out of the themes contained in that paper.
Darwall, Stephen (1997). "Reasons, Motives, and the Demands of Morality: An Introduction", in Darwall et al., Moral Discourse and Practice (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
Dickson, Julie (2007). "Is the Rule of Recognition Really a Conventional Rule?", Oxford Journal of Legal Studies, vol. 27.
Dworkin, Ronald (1972). "The Model of Rules II", reprinted in Dworkin, Taking Rights Seriously (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1977).
Dworkin, Ronald (2004). "Hart's Postscript and the Character of Political Philosophy", reprinted in Dworkin Justice in Robes (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2006).
Føllesdal, Dagfinn (1979). "Hermeneutics and the Hypothetico-Deductive Method", Dialectica, vol. 33.
Frankfurt, Harry (1982). "The Importance of What We Care About", reprinted in Frankfurt, The Importance of What We Care About (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988).
Green, Leslie (2003). "Legal Positivism", in Edward Zalta (ed.), Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Hart, H.L.A. (1961/94). The Concept of Law, 2nd ed. (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
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Scanlon, T.M. (1982). "Contractualism and Utilitarianism", reprinted in Scanlon, The Difficulty of Toleration (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003).
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Toh, Kevin (2007). "Raz on Detachment, Acceptance and Describability", Oxford Journal of Legal Studies, vol. 27.
Toh, Kevin (2008). "An Argument Against the Social Fact Thesis (and Some Additional Preliminary Steps Towards a New Conception of Legal Positivism)", Law and Philosophy, vol. 27.
Toh, Kevin (2010). "Some Moving Parts of Jurisprudence", Texas Law Review, vol. 88.
 In the preface (pp. vi-ix), Gardner himself helpfully outlines the various ways in which the papers can be grouped together.
 There is a question as to whether this last element -- that rules of recognition consist of, or are constituted by, official practices -- really is Hart's view. Gardner and many others routinely attribute it to Hart, but I shall be taking issue with that attribution in the section on "Social Rules" below.
 For some helpful discussion of the points like the two I listed above in interpretations of "meaningful material", see Føllesdal (1979).
 We should bear in mind that non-fundamental moral and epistemic norms may very well be artificial or positive norms. T.M. Scanlon (1982), for example, says at one point: "If it is important for us to have some duty of a given kind (some duty of fidelity to agreements, or some duty of mutual aid) of which there are many morally acceptable forms, then one of these forms needs to be established by convention. In a setting in which one of these forms is conventionally established, acts disallowed by it will be wrong . . . For given the need for such conventions, one thing that could not be generally agreed to would be a set of principles allowing one to disregard conventionally established (and morally acceptable) definitions of important duties" (pp. 133-134). Analogous things could be said about some non-fundamental epistemic norms -- e.g. norms governing testimony.
 For example, Brian Leiter says: "the Rule of Recognition, on Hart's view, is a social rule, meaning its content -- that is, the criteria of legal validity -- is fixed by a complex empirical fact, namely, the actual practice of officials (and the attitude they evince towards the practice)" (2009, p. 1222; cf. pp. 1215, 1221).
 Scott Shapiro, for example, has similarly said: "if Hart is correct, and social practices explain how legal systems are possible, then legal reasoning must always be traceable to a social rule of recognition. Arguments about who has authority to do what, what rights individuals have, which legal texts are authoritative, and the proper way to interpret them must ultimately be resolved by reference to the sociological facts of official practice" (2011, p. 102). Leiter goes so far as to say that any dispute that can arise about the content of a rule of recognition would be "an empirical or 'head count' dispute" (2009, p. 1222).
 Leslie Green also says that, according to Hart, "at [a legal system's] root is a social norm that has the kind of normative force that customs have" (2003, § 2).
 Going with the common reading of Hart as conceiving certain rules -- i.e. social rules -- as consisting of, or constituted by, social practices, Shapiro has accused Hart of making a category mistake (2011, pp. 102-104). The discussion in the text is meant to show that the fault or mistake lies with the common reading, not Hart.
 A more extended discussion of this passage, as well as of some conflicting ones that lend some credibility to the more common reading that Gardner and others favor, is provided in Toh (2008, § 11).
 This is especially the case with the postscript to The Concept of Law. But I am not the only one who considers the postscript problematic and less than reliable as an indicator of Hart's considered positions. See e.g. Dworkin (2004); Dickson (2007). For a fuller discussion of some key passages in the first edition of The Concept of Law, once again, see Toh (2008, § 11).
 As far as I can determine, the conception of Hartian rules of recognition as "social rules" in the sense I have outlined at the beginning of the section on "Social Rules" above, started with Dworkin (1972, § 1). Its durability and unusually strong hold it has had even on severe critics of Dworkin stems from the fact that Dworkin's reading was repeated and thereby reinforced by Raz (1975/90, § 2.1; cf. 1977, pp. 150-151). Raz seems to take a different, and in my opinion more accurate, tack in Raz (1998, p. 381).
 For the reasons that I lay out in Toh (2007 and 2010).
 Raz himself offers a slightly different and more nuanced reasoning, which I still find unpersuasive. See Raz (1981, pp. 454-455); Toh (2007, § 8; 2010, § 4). Gardner is not the only one who adopts the Razian position on this issue. See Shapiro (2011, p. 114).
 A careful and sensitive treatment of this distinction can be found in Frankfurt (1982).
 I borrow the term from Darwall (1997).
 I do not say this as a criticism of Raz's fascinating argument in that paper. Raz's argument, I take it, is meant to be exploratory, and there may be ways to generalize from his conclusion.
 For very helpful comments on a prior draft, I thank Mitch Berman, Luís d'Almeida, and Brian Leiter.