2013.05.23

Russell Re Manning (ed.)

The Oxford Handbook of Natural Theology

Russell Re Manning (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Natural Theology, Oxford University Press, 2013, 672pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199556939.

Reviewed by Graham Oppy, University of Monash


The work is divided into five parts, each presenting a type of 'perspective on natural theology'. Under 'history' we have: 'Classical Origins', 'the Christian Bible', 'the Patristic Period', 'the Middle Ages', 'Early Modernity', 'the Nineteenth Century' and 'the Twentieth Century'; under 'theology' we have: 'Jewish', 'Islamic', 'Eastern', 'Catholic', 'Protestant', 'Eastern Orthodox', and 'Critical (from within theology)'; under 'philosophy' we have: 'Analytic', 'Continental', 'Process', 'Design Argument', 'Morality', 'Religious Experience', 'Postmodern', 'Feminist', 'Comparative' and 'Critical (from within philosophy)'; under 'science' we have: 'Biology', 'Physics', 'Chemistry', 'Mathematics', 'Ecology', 'Sciences of Mind', 'Sociology', and 'Critical (from within science)'; and under 'the arts' we have: 'Aesthetics', 'Imagination', 'Literature', 'Music', 'Images' and 'Film'.

Slightly more than half of the contributors are primarily experts on theology and religion; around a third are primarily experts in philosophy; and the remainder are a mix with primary expertise in history of science, physics, classics or history. The work is explicitly conceived as a 'mapping' of a 'cross disciplinary area of study'; the editor insists that 'the various approaches adopted by the contributors reflect the plurality of contexts within which the study of natural theology must be situated' (1). And, despite the perceived 'plurality', there are certain kinds of commonalities among the various chapters. The most frequently referenced figures -- Plato, Aristotle, Augustine, Aquinas, Hume, Kant, Barth, and (a little less frequently) Swinburne -- are considered in many different 'contexts'; the 1934 dispute between Barth and Brunner is the primary focus of one chapter, and receives significant attention in several others.

In his Introduction, Russell Re Manning, the editor, suggests that natural theology is complex and multi-faceted; that the Handbook aims to highlight the rich diversity of approaches to natural theology; and that the complex mixture of approaches sampled in the various chapters allows natural theology to 'emerge' unhindered by 'one-size fits all' definitions and temptations to restrict 'it' to one context or another. (1) A sceptical thought that some readers will surely entertain is that it would do equally well to suggest that 'ideology' is complex and multi-faceted in a way that justifies a Handbook with entries on both Althusser and Quine. In other words: there are several very different projects that get called 'natural theology' in different times and places, but there is no plausible meta-project that unites those diverse projects, even though there is a story to be told about why the different projects end up getting called 'natural theology' (just as Quine himself provides a justification for his co-option of the term 'ideology' for the particular use to which he puts it).

In the Introduction, Manning also suggests that it is time to put the lie to the myth that 'Hume, Darwin, and Barth pulled the rug out from underneath the pretensions of natural theology to any philosophical, scientific or theological legitimacy, such that the enterprise was forced to retreat beyond the pale of intellectual respectability' (2). In particular, he claims that 'the "natural" vs. "revealed" characterisation of natural theology is frequently hard to sustain and serves only to obscure or distort the real concerns and issues at the heart of natural theological thinking' (3); 'the history of natural theology manifestly extends beyond . . . the complexities behind the emergence of a distinctive form of modern scientific natural theology . . . in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries' (3); and 'the vitality of much recent work in philosophy of religion . . . is ample testimony to the ongoing philosophical import of [the arguments of natural theology]' (3).

I think that the prospects for taxonomy and definition are much brighter than Manning supposes, and that the further matters to which he draws attention are also largely capable of straightforward resolution. However, sorting matters out requires consideration of intellectual currents that are not directly addressed anywhere in the work under review. In particular, the place to start is with the contrast between naturalistic and non-naturalistic worldviews. According to naturalism, causal reality is exhausted by natural reality: there are none but natural causes, involving none but natural entities. In particular, according to naturalists, there are no supernatural causes: no gods, no grounds of being, no causes beyond being and non-being, etc. If natural reality contains nothing that is not spatiotemporally connected to us, then all causal beings trace spatiotemporally continuous trajectories through space-time, and are constituted entirely from parts that trace spatiotemporally continuous trajectories through space-time.

Given an acceptable characterisation of naturalism, we can then ask: are there reasons for being dissatisfied with naturalism as a global worldview? Is it the case, for example, that naturalism is self-defeating? Is it the case that naturalism is defeated by 'recalcitrant data': fine-tuning, consciousness, cosmic injustice, global causal topology, 'religious' experience, human reason, scripture, or the like? Is it the case that there are formulations of, say, theism that are more theoretically virtuous than naturalism, i.e. that score better on a properly weighted trade-off between simplicity, fit with data, explanatory scope, predictive accuracy, and the like?

Of course, there are very few theists -- and no Abrahamic theists -- who will accept the naturalist characterisation of natural reality. Abrahamic theists do not accept that there is a domain -- 'natural reality' -- in which there are none but natural causes involving none but natural entities. On the one hand, Abrahamic theists typically suppose that divine causation is ubiquitous: God's causal power sustains the existence of the created order, including the existence of the universe in which we live; and, on the other hand, Abrahamic theists typically suppose that the 'normal powers' of the created order are sometimes directly overwritten by God, in the course of 'miraculous interventions' and the like. Moreover, given that Abrahamic theists typically suppose that there are various ways in which God is causally active in 'the natural world', it is unsurprising that many Abrahamic theists claim to be able to 'perceive' God's causal -- and providential -- activity in 'the natural world'.

Nonetheless, there are now some quite distinct projects that come into view. One project is the 'neutral' assessment of competing worldviews in terms of global theoretical virtues -- simplicity, fit with data, explanatory scope, predictive accuracy, and the like. On this project, 'natural theology' and 'natural atheology' have a common part: namely, the sub-project of assessing 'theism' and 'naturalism' in terms of those global theoretical virtues. While we may have good reasons to be sceptical about the prospects of prosecuting a sub-project of this kind, it is clear that there have been -- and continue to be -- those who think that 'theism' -- or 'naturalism' -- emerges clearly victorious from this kind of theoretical undertaking. I take Richard Swinburne to be a clear example of a theist who supposes that 'theism' trumps 'naturalism' when appropriately formulated versions of these views are compared in terms of global theoretical virtues.

A second project is what we might call 'interested' assessment of competing worldviews. On this project, 'natural theology' and 'natural atheology' have a common feature: namely, that they provide critiques of their competitors' accounts of 'the natural world' in terms that their competitors will simply reject. Consider, for example, naturalistic debunking of theistic belief, in terms of projection, or wish-fulfilment, or mastery of existential anxiety, or higher criticism, or the like: if naturalism is true, then perhaps some debunking accounts of these general kinds will turn out to be correct; but, if naturalism is false, then no such debunking accounts of these general kinds will turn out to be correct. Or consider Plantinga's account of the cognitive consequences of sin in his 'extended Aquinas/Calvin model': if theism is true, then perhaps some debunking account of this kind will turn out to be correctly applicable to naturalists; but, if theism is false, then no such debunking account of this kind will turn out to be applicable to naturalists.

A third project is what we might call 'development' of a given worldview. Within Abrahamic theism, there is a question about how people could come to have the knowledge of God that they do. Should Abrahamic theists suppose that their knowledge of God depends upon particular 'miraculous interventions' in the natural order; or should they rather suppose that they could have come to knowledge of God even if God had made no particular 'miraculous interventions' in the natural order? Does all knowledge of God depend essentially upon scripture and revelation; or could some knowledge of God have been arrived at without the assistance of scripture and revelation (including miracles and religious experience)? Of course, the naturalist way with these questions is short: since there is no God, there is no knowledge of God, and so these questions are uninteresting. Thus, there is a sense in which serious concern about naturalism does not even come into view when these kinds of questions are being raised. (Of course, it is also true that naturalists are substantively concerned to deny the claim that some knowledge of God can be arrived at without the assistance of scripture and revelation, including miracles and religious experience.)

Is it a myth that Hume and Darwin 'pulled the rug out from underneath the pretensions of natural theology to any philosophical or scientific legitimacy'? Not entirely. If we think about our first kind of project, then it seems hard to deny that Hume and Darwin helped to significantly dampen the prospects for the development of a successful case for the global theoretical superiority of theism to naturalism. Moreover, if we think about our second kind of project, then it seems equally hard to deny that Hume and Darwin made some positive contribution towards the prospects for the development of certain kinds of debunking accounts of theistic beliefs. But, of course, Hume and Darwin had nothing directly to say about our third kind of project -- e.g. nothing to say directly to either Barth or Brunner that would have advanced the position of one against the other.

Is 'the "natural" vs. "revealed" characterisation of natural theology hard to sustain'? Not really. If we think about our first kind of project, then -- in the nature of the case -- 'reports of revelation' figure in the data, but revelations themselves do not. While -- as noted above -- naturalists and theists do not agree on the characterisation of natural reality, there is clearly a good sense in which all of the data in the first project is 'natural': for, in the interests of serious dialogue, only 'agreed', or 'common ground', data can be admissible. Of course, when we turn our attention to the second and third kinds of projects, and we think about their prosecution by theists, we expect that many theists will feel free to appeal to 'data of revelation' in carrying out these projects.

Is there more to 'natural theology' than 'modern scientific natural theology'? Not really. If we think about our first kind of project, then -- I think -- it just is the project of "modern scientific natural theology". Naturalism is the principal 'modern' enemy of theism; and if naturalism does trump theism in a 'neutral' assessment in terms of global theoretical virtues, then that is bad news for theism. Again, of course, we can grant that our second and third kinds of projects have nothing to do with 'modern scientific natural theology'; but they have nothing much to do with our first kind of project either.

Does 'the vitality of much recent work in philosophy of religion . . . provide ample testimony to the ongoing philosophical import of [the arguments of natural theology]'? Not obviously. Granted, there are those who insist that we are currently witnessing a marvellous renaissance in philosophy of religion and, in particular, in connection with arguments about the existence of God. However, while not denying that there has been an increase in serious activity in philosophy of religion, I am sceptical that there has been any movement at all in the first kind of project that I have identified. Doubtless there have been significant advances made in connection with the second and third kinds of projects, but there is no automatic spill-over from there to advances in the first kind of project.

Despite my concerns about the conception of the Handbook, I do think that it contains some outstanding chapters. In particular, amongst others, I would single out the contributions by Stephen Clark, Alexander Hall, Matthew Eddy, Jessica Frazier, Keith Parsons, Neil Manson, Mark Wynn, Pamela Anderson, Michael Ruse, David Knight and Philip Clayton. I especially recommend David Knight's chapter on 'Chemical Sciences and Natural Theology', from which I learned many things that I am now pleased to know.