Richard Ekins

The Nature of Legislative Intent

Richard Ekins, The Nature of Legislative Intent, Oxford University Press, 2012, 288pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199646999.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Brand, George Washington University

Before the Supreme Court of the United States upheld the Affordable Care Act ("Obamacare") in 2012, commentators wondered what would happen if the Court invalidated the most controversial provision: the requirement that individuals purchase health insurance or pay a penalty (Keller and Tseytlin 2012). How would the rest of the Act be interpreted if this "individual mandate" were held unconstitutional? Did the Act make any sense without the mandate? Did Congress ever anticipate the law being enforced without it? What sense could be made of congressional intent in that scenario? Lower courts gave divergent answers.

These questions were especially pressing for those who believe that statutes should be interpreted by reference to legislative intent. The background question is what role, if any, legislative intent should play in statutory interpretation. For centuries, jurists claimed that laws should be interpreted in accordance with the intentions of the lawmaker, even as legislative assemblies supplanted individual monarchs as the primary lawmakers in one nation after another. Contemporary treatises continue to assign legislative intent a central role, but scholars and public officials have challenged it with increasing vigor in the past century. Some skeptics deny that legislatures have intentions or that interpreters can identify them. Others merely deny that such intentions (if they exist) are relevant to interpretation.

Richard Ekins defends the philosophical claim that a "well-formed" legislature has intentions. He presents a theory of legislation that assigns legislative intent its traditionally central role. He also contends that actual legislatures usually legislate with a determinate intention, that said intention is usually discernible with sufficient effort and expertise, and that interpreters should follow it.

This is a fine book in many ways. It is clearly written and organized. It is well-grounded in the literatures of jurisprudence and philosophy, with forays into social choice theory. The project has a natural law flavor, but legal positivists will find the taste palatable. The main thesis is avowedly traditional: legislatures act upon unified intentions when they legislate. However, this thesis is so often dismissed today, without much reflection, that Ekins' defense fills an important gap in the literature. He has written the most philosophically sophisticated monograph on the subject that I have seen. The mechanics of the British Parliament get somewhat more attention than do other legislatures, but that focus does not narrow the applicability of the philosophical arguments or reduce their interest for readers outside the U.K.

Early twentieth-century jurists who were skeptical about legislative intent include Gustav Radbruch and Max Radin, whose arguments Ekins reviews and easily rebuts (ch. 1). He concentrates on skeptical arguments by Ronald Dworkin (1986) and Jeremy Waldron (1999), as well as a social choice argument developed by the political scientist, Kenneth Shepsle (1992). Ekins contends that these skeptical arguments succeed only in discrediting legislative intent understood as an aggregation of the intentions of multiple human legislators (ch. 2). Dworkin refutes a "speaker's meaning" conception of legislative intent. Waldron defends a "voting machine" model of legislation, portraying statutes as the output of a process, rather than the choice of an agent. Ekins challenges Waldron's model and contends that Dworkin uses a mistaken conception of legislative intent.

Ekins argues that the legislature itself constitutes a collective agent that forms and acts upon intentions, responding to reasons for action (ch. 3). These shared intentions are not reducible to the intentions of individual legislators. Ekins borrows and modifies Michael Bratman's well-known (1999) theory, which holds that two or more natural persons share an intention if and only if they hold a particular set of interlocking individual intentions (Bratman is more specific). To say that a legislature has a certain intention is therefore not to say that all or even some individual legislators have it. (Other philosophers have put Bratman's ideas to jurisprudential use; see Shapiro 2011, Bratman 2002, Coleman 2001).

Even granting that groups can form collective agents that share intentions, why should we think of legislatures as such agents? Ekins argues, partly from Arrow's Theorem, that legislating makes no sense otherwise. If legislatures were not collective agents, then no one would have a reason to serve as a legislator. In order to maintain this position, Ekins must argue that making law requires intending to change the law for particular reasons. A legislature that merely aggregates constituent preferences or functions as a "voting machine" must fall into collective irrationality (ch. 4).

In chapter 5, Ekins presents a theory of legislating, beginning with the idea of a solitary individual legislator who enjoys exclusive lawmaking authority (a "prince"). Legislating is a complex form of means-ends reasoning by the prince (princess?). He engages in chains of reasoning that terminate in detailed, coherent plans of action (i.e., statutory schemes). Ekins claims that the nature of legislating is the same whether the lawmaker is a prince or an assembly. In chapter 6, he shifts his attention to the distinctive intricacies of modern assemblies, chiefly the British Parliament and U.S. Congress. His goal here is to establish that assemblies can do what princes do: consider relevant reasons and choose reasonably how to change the law. Assemblies are in this regard genuinely deliberative, but simultaneously representative. Assemblies are superior to princes because they are more open to public participation, less prone to devolve into tyrants, and more apt to enact legislation that serves the common good. Assemblies have internal hierarchies, offices, and political parties that give some legislators more access than others to the legislative agenda. A distinctive contribution of this chapter is Ekins' argument that the internal structure of assemblies actually facilitates the kind of reasoned action that constitutes legislating, rather than detracting from deliberation and representation.

Those who maintain that legislation is intelligible without reference to legislative intent often suggest understanding statutes in terms of the conventional meanings of the words (e.g., Waldron). In chapter 7, Ekins counter-argues that it is impossible to understand language use without reference to the intentions of its users. The literal meaning of a text underdetermines its intended meaning, so understanding language use requires imputing intentions to users. Interpreters infer intended meaning from legislative "utterances" in a rich social context.

Ekins' arguments culminate in chapter 8, which explains how legislatures form and act upon intentions. Previous theories have identified the intention of the legislature as a whole with either 1) the intentions of the legislators who vote in the majority or 2) the intentions of leading legislators. In opposition to both positions, Ekins argues that legislating is a joint act ofall legislators, including those who vote nay and those who are ignorant of the content of the bill. The legislature as a whole acts on an intention that includes many details unknown to most individual legislators. Of course, legislators who vote against a bill usually do not want it to pass, but as legislators they simultaneously hold a conditional intention (what Ekins calls their "standing intention" [p. 219]): that the bill should pass if it receives the requisite number of votes (e.g., simple majority). The legislature thereby intends to act on a certain proposal, which is a meaningful, reasoned choice.

In his ninth and final chapter, Ekins elaborates on the implications of his theory for the methodology of statutory interpretation by courts and others. He argues, naturally, that interpreters should read statutes for their intended meaning, considering legislation as a reasoned plan for the common good. Legislating involves choosing both means and ends, so interpreters should not read statutes as taking whatever means they believe would best serve the legislature's chosen ends. Rather, interpreters should identify the legislature's intended means as well as its ends. Legislation, properly interpreted, may have ramifications that some legislators in the voting majority did not foresee and do not welcome.

After reading this vigorous defense of legislative intent, legal scholars will be surprised when Ekins subsequently argues against the use of legislative history (e.g., transcripts of floor debates) by courts. Legislative history, he contends, does not provide reliable evidence of legislative intent (ch. 9, sec. V). Ekins also favors limited scope for equitable interpretation, in which courts depart from the intended meaning of a statute in favor of the legislature's "reasoned choice" (sec. VI).

In my view, Ekins succeeds in most of the tasks he sets for himself. However, I shall now explore some limitations and weaknesses of his account.

Ekins' entire theory rests on assumptions about the reality and nature of shared intentions. He does not purport to advance the theory of shared intention, but rather takes an existing theory (Bratman's) off the shelf without even mentioning, much less addressing, objections to the whole idea. Although I have long been sympathetic to the idea of shared intentions and their importance to legal philosophy (Brand-Ballard 2010), I have found that many philosophers scoff at the idea. Skeptics insist that a real intention can only exist in a single mind. No group has a single mind, therefore no group can share an intention, they conclude. Skeptics need not deny that Bratman identifies a genuine and important phenomenon, but they can insist that "shared intention" is a mere metaphor.

Regardless of whether shared intentions constitute genuine intentions, skeptics about legislative intent should confront shared-intention theories. I do not know of any skeptic who does so, which makes Ekins' contribution significant. I wonder, however, if theorists of legislation will find what they seek in Ekins' book. Granting that shared intentions exist, how do they differ from individual intentions? Is an assembly's shared intention sufficiently similar to a prince's intention that the former can do the same work as the latter? Ekins needs it to be so. Therefore, it is important to distinguish questions that Ekins' theory answers from those it leaves unanswered. Take a question that Ekins' theory answers: can an assembly as a whole have an intention? His answer is affirmative. Another question: if an assembly has such an intention, can it be imputed to every individual legislator? Again, Ekins says "yes." The legislature shares a standing intention to legislate. When a bill passes, its open content as publicized before the vote (the "third reading" in the U.K.), is incorporated into an intention shared by all legislators, even those who vote nay. These answers entail that a legislator who fails to read or understand open content cannot deny that "she" and "her legislature" nonetheless enacted the legislation and shared an intention to do so. This is so even if she discovers after passage that the statute says something she detests. All the legislators, even those who vote against the bill, share a conditional intention to enact it if a majority votes for it. That is an important upshot of Ekins' theory.

However, there is another role that commentators want legislative intent to play and that Ekins thinks it can play: guiding statutory interpretation and conferring authority on particular interpretations. What, if anything, makes legislative intent (as Ekins conceives it) different from other interpretive resources? What, if anything, does legislative intent contribute to the task of statutory interpretation, beyond what other resources contribute? Does legislative intent confer authority on particular interpretations?

Commentators especially want legislative intent to provide authoritative guidance for deciding cases when the requirements of the statutory text are unclear given the facts of the case. Ekins suggests that in such cases interpreters should understand statutes by consideration of "legislative context" (p. 256). In chapter 9, section III he explains what this means. In section IV, he illustrates the proper and improper use of context with reference to three real cases and a hypothetical case. I have no space to rehearse the facts, but I would characterize the cases Ekins chooses as falling into two, related categories. Some are cases in which the legally correct result looks indeterminate at first, but a determinate result emerges upon closer examination (such as consideration of broader legal context). Others are cases in which a certain result looks legally correct at first, but a different result looks more correct upon closer examination (again, considering broader legal context). Ekins suggests that proper consideration of legislative context leads one to the correct result in these cases.

Reading as a lawyer, I find that Ekins makes skillful, subtle legal arguments in chapter 9, section IV. But the subtler his arguments, the less they seem to be distinctively arguments from legislative intent. (They are certainly not arguments from legislative history, which he eschews). Ekins' arguments from "legislative context" are variously functional, structural, technical, pragmatic, and public-policy arguments. They are intent arguments only insofar as Ekins might claim that a wise, rational, well-informed legislator would have thought of such arguments and intended for interpreters to consider them in interpreting and applying her statutory text. What Ekins advertises as an appeal to "legislative intent" looks much like an appeal to "good legal reasoning that takes everything relevant into account." An author does not show his own method superior to others unless he asks whether competitor methods could make similarly effective use of the interpretive resources that he uses to reach results. It is easy for an author to find court cases in which commentators have not attended sufficiently to broader legal context. Then the author can attend to that context and arrive at an answer (or a different answer than other interpreters gave). He may tell us that his own interpretive method delivered the goods. In fact, all he shows is that careful legal reasoning beats careless.

This is not to say that it is incoherent to engage in good legal reasoning about statutes and then impute that reasoning to the legislature as a whole, even if (as is almost certainly true) no individual legislator ever engaged in such reasoning and many were incapable of it. Nevertheless, the final imputation to the legislature itself does no interpretive work. Legislative intent adds nothing to interpretive methodology unless it stands in contrast to other interpretive legal resources. Actual legislative intent is informative for interpreters only to the extent that it diverges from idealized (hypothetical, constructive) legislative intent. The more the interpreter idealizes legislative intent, the less work it does for her. Intent becomes a mere pass-through, a conduit for what the ideal legislator supposedly would have intended. Again, it is not incoherent to impute such idealized intentions to the legislature as a whole, but interpreters who invoke legislative intent want something more concrete than "what an ideal legislator would think the statute means, given the entire legal context."

One would never know from Ekins' book that the main competitor to methods of statutory interpretation based on legislative intent are textualist methods propounded by such authors as Antonin Scalia (1997), Adrian Vermeule (2006), and John F. Manning (2006). He mentions these authors briefly but does not engage their arguments. His index contains no entry for "textualism" or "formalism." He never considers the putative advantages of textualism or compares it to his own method. I think his chapter 7 sets up a challenge to textualism (see his discussion of Schauer 1991), but the connection is never quite made. Nor does Ekins engage the (1994) work of William N. Eskridge, Jr., the leading American theorist of statutes and champion of "dynamic statutory interpretation," which has a complicated relation to legislative intent.

How might a theory of statutory interpretation build upon Ekins' insights but provide more guidance in hard cases than Ekins provides? Here is a rudimentary suggestion. Begin with the group of legislators who vote for a bill that passes. Narrow that down to the subgroup of legislators who actually contemplated cases with fact pattern P ("P cases") prior to voting. Narrow it further to the largest plurality of the subgroup of those who formed the same intention with respect to P cases. Treat this intention as incorporated into the shared intention of the entire assembly. Notice, however, that there may not actually exist a plurality of legislators who voted for the bill and formed an overlapping intention about P cases. If no such plurality exists, then legislative intent is uninformative with respect to P cases.

Ekins is correct that it does not follow logically that legislative intent is less determinate for assemblies than for princes. Writers who discourage the use of legislative intent should not defend their position by arguing that assemblies cannot share intentions. Legislative intent is indeterminate in certain cases because the legislature did not foresee them and form coherent intentions with respect to them. This is so whether the legislature is a natural person or an assembly. The real contrast between princes and assemblies is that in unforeseen cases there is more likely to be a fact of the matter regarding the content of a prince's intention than an assembly's intention in a parallel case. That is because intrapersonal inconsistency in one's beliefs or intentions, although prevalent, is much less prevalent than interpersonal disagreement. That, I suggest, is why appealing to the intentions of a legislative assembly is especially unlikely to be helpful in hard cases, pace Ekins.

Ekins may not have shown that legislative intent is more useful for statutory interpretation than previous proponents have established. Nevertheless, his book contains a wealth of sound, innovative arguments. It is required reading for anyone who cares about legislative intent.


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Bratman, Michael. 1999. Faces of Intention. Cambridge University Press.

______. 2002. Shapiro on Legal Positivism and Jointly Intentional Activity. Legal Theory 8: 511-17.

Coleman, Jules. 2001. The Practice of Principle. Clarendon Press.

Dworkin, Ronald. 1986. Law's Empire. Belknap Press.

Eskridge, Jr., William N. 1994. Dynamic Statutory Interpretation. Harvard University Press.

Keller, Scott A. and Misha Tseytlin. 2012. Applying Constitutional Decision Rules Versus Invalidating Statutes In Toto. Virginia Law Review 98: 301-66.

Manning, John F. 2006. What Divides Textualists from Purposivists. Columbia Law Review 106: 70-111.

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Shepsle, Kenneth. 1992. Congress is a "They," Not an "It": Legislative Intent as Oxymoron. International Review of Law and Economics 12: 239-56.

Vermeule, Adrian. 2006. Judging Under Uncertainty. Harvard University Press.

Waldron, Jeremy. 1999. Law and Disagreement. Oxford University Press.